Ethical Expressivism

Ethical Expressivism

Broadly speaking, the term “expressivism” refers to a family of views in the philosophy of language according to which the meanings of claims in a particular area of discourse are to be understood in terms of whatever non-cognitive mental states those claims are supposed to express. More specifically, an expressivist theory of claims in some area of discourse, D, will typically affirm both of the following theses. The first thesis—psychological non-cognitivism—states that claims in D express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive. Non-cognitive states are often distinguished by their world-to-mind direction of fit, which contrasts with the mind-to-world direction of fit exhibited by cognitive states like beliefs. Some common examples of non-cognitive states are desires, emotions, pro- and con-attitudes, commitments, and so forth. According to the second thesis—semantic ideationalism—the meanings or semantic contents of claims in D are in some sense given by the mental states that those claims express. This is in contrast with more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to meaning, according to which the meanings of claims are to be understood in terms of either their truth-conditions or the propositions that they express.

An expressivist theory of truth claims—that is, claims of the form “p is true”—might hold that (i) “p is true” expresses a certain measure of confidence in, or agreement with, p, and that (ii) whatever the relevant mental state, for example, agreement with p, that state just is the meaning of “p is true”. In other words, when we claim that p is true, we neither describe p as true nor report the fact that p is true; rather, we express some non-cognitive attitude toward p (see Strawson 1949). Similar expressivist treatments have been given to knowledge claims (Austin 1970; Chrisman 2012), probability claims (Barker 2006; Price 2011; Yalcin 2012), claims about causation (Coventry 2006; Price 2011), and even claims about what is funny (Gert 2002; Dreier 2009).

“Ethical expressivism”, then, is the name for any view according to which (i) ethical claims—that is, claims like “x is wrong”, “y is a good person”, and “z is a virtue”—express non-cognitive mental states, and (ii) these states make up the meanings of ethical claims. (I shall henceforth use the term “expressivism” to refer only to ethical expressivism, unless otherwise noted.) This article begins with a brief account of the history of expressivism, and an explanation of its main motivations. This is followed by a description of the famous Frege-Geach Problem, and of the role that it played in shaping contemporary versions of the view. While these contemporary expressivisms may avoid the problem as it was originally posed, recent work in metaethics suggests that Geach’s worries were really just symptoms of a much deeper problem, which can actually take many forms. After characterizing this deeper problem—the Continuity Problem—and some of its more noteworthy manifestations, the article explores a few recent trends in the literature on expressivism, including the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist views. See also "Non-Cognitivism in Ethics."

Table of Contents

  1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations
  2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out
  3. The Expressivist Turn
  4. The Continuity Problem
    1. A Puzzle about Negation
    2. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions
    3. Saving the Differences
  5. Recent Trends
    1. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem
    2. Hybrid Theories
    3. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations

The first and primary purpose of this section is to lay out a brief history of ethical expressivism, paying particular attention to its main motivations. In addition to this, the section will also answer a question that many have had about expressivism, namely: what is the difference between expressivism and “non-cognitivism”?

The difference is partly an historical one, such that a history of expressivism must begin with its non-cognitivist ancestry. Discussions of early non-cognitivism typically involve three figures in particular—A. J. Ayer, C. L. Stevenson, and R. M. Hare—and in that respect, this one will be no different. But rather than focusing upon the substance of their views, in this section, we will be more interested in the main considerations that motivated them to take up non-cognitivism in the first place. As we shall see, early non-cognitivist views were motivated mostly by two concerns: first, a desire to avoid unwanted ontological commitments, especially to a realm of “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties; and second, a desire to capture an apparently very close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.

In the case of Ayer, his motivation for defending a version of non-cognitivism was relatively clear, since he explains in the Introduction of the second edition of Language, Truth, and Logic (1946), “[I]n putting forward the theory I was concerned with maintaining the general consistency of my position [logical positivism].” As is well known, logical positivists were rather austere in their ontological accommodations, and happy to let the natural sciences decide (for the most part) what gets accommodated. In fact, a common way to interpret their verificationism is as a kind of method for avoiding unwanted ontological commitments—“unwanted” because they do not conform to what Ayer himself described as his and other positivists’ “radical empiricism.” Claims in some area of discourse are meaningful, in the ordinary sense of that term—which, for Ayer, is just to say that they express propositions—only if they are either analytic or empirically verifiable. Claims that are neither analytic nor empirically verifiable—like most religious claims, for instance—are meaningless; they might express something, but not propositions.

Ayer’s positivism could perhaps make room for moral properties as long as those properties were understood as literally nothing but the natural properties into which philosophers sometimes analyze them—for example, maximizing pleasure, since this is in principle verifiable—but it left no room at all for the irreducibly normative properties that some at the time took to be the very subject-matter of ethics (see Moore 1903). So in order to “maintain the general consistency of his position,” and to avoid any commitment to empirically unverifiable, irreducibly normative properties, Ayer’s positivism meant that he had to construe ordinary ethical claims as expressing something other than propositions. Moreover, for reasons unimportant to my purposes here, he argued that these claims express non-cognitive, motivational states of mind—in particular, emotions. It is for this reason that Ayer’s brand of non-cognitivism is often referred to as “emotivism”.

Stevenson likely shared some of Ayer’s ontological suspicions, but this pretty clearly is not what led him to non-cognitivism. Rather than being concerned to maintain the consistency of any pre-conceived philosophical principles, Stevenson begins by simply observing our ordinary practices of making ethical claims, and then he asks what kind of analysis of “good” is able to make the best sense out of these practices. For instance, in practice, he thinks ethical claims are made more to influence others than to inform them. In fact, in general, Stevenson seems especially impressed with what he called the “magnetism” of ethical claims—that is, their apparently close connection to people’s motivational states. But he thinks that other attempts to analyze “good” in terms of these motivational states have failed on two counts: (a) they make genuine ethical disagreement impossible, and (b) they compromise the autonomy of ethics, assigning ethical facts to the province of psychology, or sociology, or one of the natural sciences.

According to Stevenson, these other theories err in conceiving the connection between ethical claims and motivational states in terms of the former describing, or reporting, the latter—so that, for instance, the meaning of “Torture is wrong” consists in something like the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of torture. This is what led to problems (a) and (b) from above: two people who are merely describing or reporting their own attitudes toward torture cannot be genuinely disagreeing about its wrongness; and if the wrongness of torture were really just a matter of people’s attitudes toward it, then ethical inquiries could apparently be settled entirely by such means as introspection, psychoanalysis, or even just popular vote. Stevenson’s non-cognitivism, then, can be understood as an attempt to capture the relation between ethical claims and motivational states in a way that avoids these problems.

The solution, he thinks, is to allow that ethical claims have a different sort of meaning from ordinary descriptive claims. If ordinary descriptive claims have propositional meaning—that is, meaning that is a matter of the propositions they express—then ethical claims have what Stevenson called emotive meaning. “The emotive meaning of a word is a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses in people.  It is the immediate aura of feeling which hovers about a word” (Stevenson 1937, p.23; see also Ogden and Richards 1923, 125ff). A claim like “Torture is the subject of today’s debate” may get its meaning from a proposition, but the claim “Torture is wrong” has emotive meaning, in that its meaning is somehow to be understood in terms of the motivational states that it is typically used either to express or to arouse.

If Ayer and Stevenson apparently disagreed over the meaningfulness of ethical claims, with Ayer at times insisting that such claims are meaningless, and Stevenson allowing that they have a special kind of non-propositional meaning, they were nonetheless united in affirming a negative semantic thesis, sometimes called semantic non-factualism, according to which claims in some area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—do not express propositions, and, consequently, do not have truth-conditions. Regardless of whether or not ethical claims are meaningful in some special sense, they are not meaningful in the same way that ordinary descriptive claims are meaningful, that is, in the sense of expressing propositions. Ayer and Stevenson were also apparently united in affirming what we earlier called psychological non-cognitivism. So as the term shall be used here, ‘ethical non-cognitivism’ names any view that combines semantic non-factualism and psychological non-cognitivism, with respect to ethical claims.

According to Hare, ethical claims actually have two kinds of meaning: descriptive and prescriptive. To call a thing “good” is both (a) to say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) to commend the thing in virtue of these properties (this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning). But importantly, the prescriptive meaning of ethical claims is primary: the set of properties that I ascribe to a thing when calling it “good” varies from context to context, but in all contexts, I use “good” for the purpose of commendation. For Hare, then, ethical claims are used not to express emotions, or to excite the emotions of others, but rather to guide actions. They do this by taking the imperative mood. That is, they are first-and-foremost prescriptions. For this reason, Hare’s view is often called “prescriptivism”.

It may be less clear than it was in the case of Ayer and Stevenson whether Hare’s prescriptivism ought to count as a version of non-cognitivism. After all, it is not uncommon to suppose that sentences in the imperative mood still have propositional content. Since he rarely goes in for talk of “expression”, it is unclear whether Hare is a psychological non-cognitivist. However, it would nonetheless be fair to say that, since prescriptions do not have truth-conditions, Hare is committed to saying that the relationship between prescriptive ethical claims and propositions is fundamentally different from that between ordinary descriptive claims and propositions; and in this sense, it does seem as if he is committed to a form of semantic non-factualism. It also seems right to think that if we do not express any sort of non-cognitive, approving attitude toward a thing when we call it “good,” then we do not really commend it. So even if he is not explicit in his adherence to it, Hare does seem to accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism as well.

Also unclear are Hare’s motivations for being an ethical non-cognitivist. By the time Hare published The Language of Morals (1952), non-cognitivism was already the dominant view in moral philosophy. So there was much less of a need for Hare to motivate the view than there was for Ayer and Stevenson a couple decades earlier. Instead, Hare’s concern was mostly to give a more thorough articulation of the view than the other non-cognitivists had, and one sophisticated enough to avoid some of the problems that had already arisen for earlier versions of the view.

One thing that does appear to have motivated Hare’s non-cognitivism, however, is its ability to explain intuitions about moral supervenience. Most philosophers agree that there is some kind of relationship between a thing’s moral status and its non-moral features, such that two things cannot have different moral statuses without also having different non-moral features. This is roughly what it means to say that a thing’s moral features supervene upon its non-moral features. For example, if it is morally wrong for Stan to lie to his teacher, but not morally wrong for Stan to lie to his mother, then there must be some non-moral difference between the two actions that underlies and explains their moral difference, for example, something to do with Stan’s reasons for lying in each case. While non-philosophers may not be familiar with the term “supervenience”, the fact that we so often hold people accountable for judging like cases suggests that we do intuitively take the moral to supervene upon the non-moral.

Those philosophers, like Moore, who believe in irreducibly normative properties must explain how it is that, despite apparently not being reducible to non-moral properties, these properties are nonetheless able to supervene upon non-moral properties, which has proven to be an especially difficult task (see Blackburn 1988b). But non-cognitivists like Hare do not shoulder this difficult metaphysical burden. Instead, they explain intuitions about moral supervenience in terms of rational consistency. If Joan commends something in virtue of its non-moral properties, but then fails to commend something else with an identical set of properties, then she is inconsistent in her commendations, and thereby betrays a certain sort of irrationality. It is this simple expectation of rational consistency, and not some complicated thesis about the ontological relations that obtain between moral and non-moral properties, that explains our intuitions about moral supervenience.

Not long after Hare’s prescriptivism hit the scene, ethical non-cognitivism would be the target of an attack from Peter Geach. Given that the attack was premised upon a point made earlier by German philosopher Gottlob Frege, it has come to be known as the Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism. In the next section, we will see what the Frege-Geach Problem is. Before doing so, however, let us briefly return to the question raised at the beginning of this section: what is the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism?

In the introduction, we saw that ethical expressivism is essentially the combination of two theses concerning ethical claims: psychological non-cognitivism and semantic ideationalism. As we will see in Sections 2 and 3, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures the non-cognitivist to say more about the meanings of ethical claims than just the non-factualist thesis that they are not comprised of truth-evaluable propositions. It is partly in response to this pressure that contemporary non-cognitivists have been moved to accept semantic ideationalism. So the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism is historical, but it is not merely historical.  Rather, the difference is substantive as well: both expressivists and non-cognitivists accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism; but whereas the earlier non-cognitivists accepted a negative thesis about the contents of ethical claims—essentially, a thesis about how ethical claims do not get their meanings—contemporary expressivists accept a positive thesis about how ethical claims do get their meanings: ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive mental states they express. It should be noted, however, that there are still many philosophers who use the terms “non-cognitivism” and “expressivism” interchangeably.

2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out

Non-cognitivist theories have met with a number of objections throughout the years, but none as famous as the so-called Frege-Geach Problem. As a point of entry into the problem, observe that there are ordinary linguistic contexts in which it seems correct to say that a proposition is being asserted, and contexts in which it seems incorrect to say that a proposition is being asserted.  Consider the following two sentences:

(1)        It is snowing.

(2)        If it is snowing, then the kids will want to play outside.

In ordinary contexts, to make claim (1) is to assert that it is snowing. That is, when a speaker utters (1), she puts forward a certain proposition—in this case, the proposition that it is snowing—as true. Accordingly, if we happen to know that it is not snowing, it could be appropriate to say that the speaker is wrong.  But when a speaker utters (2), she does not thereby assert that it is snowing. Someone can coherently utter (2) without having any idea whether it is snowing, or even knowing that it is not snowing. In the event that it is not snowing, we should not then say that the speaker of (2) is wrong. However, whether “It is snowing” is being asserted or not, it surely means the same thing in the antecedent of (2) as it does in (1). Equally, while we should not say that the speaker of (2) is wrong if it happens not to be snowing, it would nonetheless be correct, in that event, to say that both (1) and the antecedent of (2) are false.

This is what Geach calls “the Frege point,” a reference to German philosopher Gottlob Frege: “A thought may have just the same content whether you assent to its truth or not; a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition” (Geach 1965, p.449). The best way to account for the facts that (a) claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) have the same semantic contents, and that (b) they are both apparently capable of truth and falsity, is to suppose that claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) both express the proposition that it is snowing. So apparently, a claim’s expressing a proposition is something wholly independent of what a speaker happens to be doing with the claim, e.g., whether asserting it or not.

Now, we should note two things about the theories of early non-cognitivists like Ayer, Stevenson, and Hare. First, they are meant only to apply to claims in the relevant area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—and are not supposed to generalize to other sorts of claims. In other words, theirs are apparently specialized, or “local,” semantic theories. So, for instance, most ethical non-cognitivists would agree that claim (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that this accounts for the meaning of (1). Second, perhaps understandably, ethical non-cognitivists focus their theories almost entirely upon ethical claims when they are asserted. The basic question is always something like this: what really is going on when a speaker makes an assertion of the form ‘x is wrong’? Does the speaker thereby describe x as wrong? Or might it be a kind of fallacy to assume that the speaker is engaged in an act of description, based only upon the surface grammar of the sentence? Might she instead be doing something expressive or evocative? Geach observes, “Theory after theory has been put forward to the effect that predicating some term ‘P’—which is always taken to mean: predicating ‘P’ assertorically—is not describing an object as being P but some other ‘performance’; and the contrary view is labeled ‘the Descriptive Fallacy’” (Geach 1965, p.461). Little attention is paid to ethical claims in contexts where they are not being asserted.

The Frege-Geach Problem can be understood as a consequence of these two features of non-cognitivist theories. As we saw earlier with claims (1) and (2), when we embed a claim into an unasserted context, like the antecedent of a conditional, we effectively strip the claim of its assertoric force. Claim (1) is assertoric, but the antecedent of (2) is not, despite having the same semantic content. But as Geach points out, exactly the same phenomenon occurs when we take a claim at the heart of some non-cognitivist theory and embed it into an unasserted context. This is why the Frege-Geach Problem is sometimes called the Embedding Problem. For example, consider the following two claims, similar in form to claims (1) and (2):

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

As with claims (1) and (2) above, the relationship between a speaker and claim (3) is importantly different from the relationship between a speaker and the antecedent of claim (4). At least in ordinary contexts, a speaker of (3) asserts that lying is wrong, whereas a speaker of (4) does no such thing. But, assuming “the Frege point” applies here as well, the semantic contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) do not depend upon whether they are being asserted or not. In both cases, their contents ought to be the same; and therein lies the rub for ethical non-cognitivists.

Given that their theories are meant to apply only to ethical claims, and not to claims in other areas of discourse, non-cognitivists are apparently committed to telling a radically different story about the semantic content of (3), as compared to the propositional story they would presumably join everyone else in telling about the contents of claims like (1) and (2). But whatever story they tell about the content of (3), it is unclear how it could apply coherently to the antecedent of (4) as well. Take Ayer, for instance. According to Ayer, claim (3) is semantically no different from

(3’)      Lying!!

“where the shape and thickness of the exclamation marks show, by a suitable convention, that a special sort of moral disapproval is the feeling which is being expressed” (Ayer (1946)1952, p.107). Ayer believed that speakers of claims like (3) are not engaged in acts of description, but rather acts of expressing their non-cognitive attitudes toward various things. This is how Ayer’s theory treats the contents of ethical claims when they are asserted. Now, absent some independently compelling reason for thinking that “the Frege point” should not apply here, the same analysis ought to be given to the antecedent of (4). But the same analysis cannot be given to the antecedent of (4). For, just as a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (2) without believing that it is snowing, a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (4) without disapproving of lying. So whatever Ayer has to say about the content of the antecedent of (4), it cannot be that it consists in the expression of “a special sort of moral disapproval,” since a speaker of (4) does not express disapproval of lying. Apparently, then, he is committed to saying, counter-intuitively, that the contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) are different.

As Geach poses it, the problem for the ethical non-cognitivist at this point is actually two-fold (see especially Geach 1965: 462-465). First, the non-cognitivist must explain how ethical claims are able to function as premises in logical inferences in the first place, if they do not express propositions. Traditionally, inference in logic is thought to be a matter of the truth-conditional relations that hold between propositions, and logical connectives like “and”, “or”, and “if-then” are thought to be truth-preserving functions from propositions to propositions. But as we have already seen, ethical non-cognitivists deny that ethical claims are even in the business of expressing propositions. So how, Geach wonders, are we apparently able to infer

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong

from (3) and (4), if the content of (3) is nothing more than an attitude of disapproval toward lying?  Or consider:

(6)        Lying is wrong or it isn’t.

Claim (6) can be inferred from (3) by a familiar logical principle, and in non-ethical contexts, we account for this by explaining how disjunction relates two or more propositions. But how can someone who denies that (3) expresses a proposition explain the relationship between (3) and (6)? The second part of the problem, related to the first, is that the non-cognitivist must explain why the inference from (3) and (4) to (5), for instance, is a valid one. As any introductory logic student knows well, the validity of modus ponens depends upon the minor premise and the antecedent of the major premise having the same content. Otherwise, the argument equivocates, and the inference is invalid. But as we just saw, on the theories of non-cognitivists like Ayer, claim (3) and the antecedent of (4) apparently do not have the same content. So Ayer seems committed to saying that what appears to be a straightforward instance of modus ponens is in fact an invalid argument. This is the so-called Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism as Geach originally put it.

In response to an argument very much like Geach’s (see Searle 1962), Hare appears to give non-cognitivists a “way out” of the Frege-Geach Problem (Hare 1970). As Hare sees it, the matter ultimately comes down to whether or not the non-cognitivist can adequately account for the compositionality of language, that is, the way the meanings of complex sentences are composed of the meanings of their simpler parts. As has already been noted, linguists and philosophers of language have traditionally done this by telling a story about propositions and the various relations that may hold between them—the meaning of (2), for instance, is composed of (a) the proposition that it is snowing, (b) the proposition that the kids will want to play outside, and (c) the conditional function “if-then”. The challenge for the non-cognitivist is simply to find another way to account for compositionality—though, it turns out, this is no simple matter.

Hare’s own proposal was to think of the meanings of ethical claims in terms of the sorts of acts for which they are suited and not in terms of propositions or mental states. The claim “Lying is wrong,” for instance, is especially suited for a particular sort of act, namely, the act of condemning lying. Thinking of the meanings of ethical claims in this way allows Hare and other non-cognitivists to effectively concede “the Frege point,” since suitability for an act is something wholly independent of whether a claim is being asserted or not. It allows them, for instance, to say that the content of (3) is the same as the content of the antecedent of (4), which, we saw, was a problem for theories like Ayer’s. From here, accounting for the meanings of complex ethical claims, like (4) and (6), is a matter of conceiving logical connectives not as functions from propositions to propositions, but rather as functions from speech acts to speech acts. If non-cognitivists could do something like this, that is, draw up a kind of “logic of speech acts”, then they would apparently have the resources for meeting both of Geach’s challenges. They could explain how ethical claims can function as premises in logical inferences, and they could explain why some of those inferences, and not others, are valid. Unfortunately, Hare himself stopped short of working out such a logic, but his 1970 paper would nonetheless pave the way for future expressivist theories and their own responses to the Frege-Geach Problem.

3. The Expressivist Turn

Earlier, it was noted that the difference between non-cognitivism and expressivism is both historical and substantive. To repeat, ethical non-cognitivists were united in affirming the negative semantic thesis that ethical claims do not get their meanings from truth-evaluable propositions, as in semantic non-factualism. But as we have already seen with Hare, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures non-cognitivists to say something more than this, in order to account for the meanings of both simple and complex ethical claims, and to explain how some ethical claims can be inferred from others.

Contemporary ethical expressivists respond to this pressure by doing just that: while still affirming the semantic non-factualism of their non-cognitivist ancestors, expressivists nowadays add to this the thesis that was earlier called semantic ideationalism. That is, they think that the meanings of ethical claims are constituted not by propositions, but by the very non-cognitive mental states that they have long been thought to express. In other words, if non-cognitivists “removed” propositions from the contents of ethical claims, then expressivists “replace” those propositions with mental states, or “ideas”—hence, ideationalism. It is this move, made primarily in response to the Frege-Geach Problem, and by following Hare’s lead, that constitutes the historical turn from ethical non-cognitivism to ethical expressivism. Both non-cognitivists and expressivists believe that ethical claims express non-cognitive attitudes, but expressivists are distinguished in thinking of the expression relation itself as a semantic one.

Ethical expressivism is often contrasted with another theory of the meanings of ethical claims according to which those meanings are closely related with speaker’s non-cognitive states of mind, namely, ethical subjectivism. Ethical subjectivism can be understood as the view that the meanings of ethical claims are propositions, but propositions about speakers’ attitudes. So whatever the relationship between claim (1) above and the proposition that it is snowing, the same relationship holds between claim (3) and the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of lying. So ethical subjectivists can also, with expressivists, say that ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive states that they express. But whereas the expressivist accounts for this in terms of the way the claim itself directly expresses the relevant state, the subjectivist accounts for it in terms of the speaker indirectly expressing the relevant state by expressing a proposition that refers to it.

The contrast between expressivism and subjectivism is important not only for the purpose of understanding what expressivism is, but also for seeing a significant advantage that it is supposed to have over subjectivism. Suppose Jones and Smith are engaged in a debate about the wrongness of lying, with Jones claiming that it is wrong, and Smith claiming that it is not wrong.  Presumably, for this to count as a genuine disagreement, it must be the case that their claims have incompatible contents. But according to subjectivism, the contents of their claims, respectively, are the propositions that I (Jones) disapprove of lying and that I (Smith) do not disapprove of lying. Clearly, though, these two propositions are perfectly compatible with each other. Where, then, where is the disagreement? This is often thought to be a particularly devastating problem for ethical subjectivism, that is, it cannot adequately account for genuine moral disagreement, but it is apparently not a problem for expressivists. According to expressivism, the disagreement is simply a matter of Jones and Smith directly expressing incompatible states of mind.  This is one of the advantages of supposing that the semantic contents of ethical claims just are mental states, and not propositions about mental states.

Now, recall the two motivations that first led people to accept ethical non-cognitivism. The first was a desire to avoid any ontological commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties. Moral realists, roughly speaking, are those who believe that properties like goodness and wrongness have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity, that is, moral properties are no less “real” than non-moral properties. But especially for those philosophers committed to a thoroughgoing metaphysical naturalism, it is hard to see how things like goodness and wrongness could have such a status. Especially when it is noted, as Mackie famously does, that moral properties as realists typically conceive them are somehow supposed to have a kind of built-in capacity to motivate those who apprehend them, to say nothing of how they are supposed to be apprehended, a capacity apparently not had by any other property (see Mackie 1977, p.38-42). Ethical expressivists avoid this problem by denying that people who make ethical claims are even engaged in the task of ascribing moral properties to things in the first place. Ontologically speaking, expressivism demands little more of the world than people’s attitudes and the speakers who express them, and so, it nicely satisfies the first of the two non-cognitivist desiderata.

The second desideratum was a desire to accommodate an apparently very close connection between ethical claims and motivation. In simple terms, motivational internalism is the view that a necessary condition for moral judgment is that the speaker be motivated to act accordingly. In other words, if Jones judges that lying is wrong, but has no motivation whatsoever to refrain from lying, or to condemn those who lie, or whatever, then internalists will typically say that Jones must not really judge lying to be wrong. Even if motivational internalism is false, though, it is surely right that we expect people’s ethical claims to be accompanied by motivations to act in certain ways; and when people who make ethical claims seem not to be motivated to act in these ways, we often assume either that they are being insincere or that something else has gone wrong. Sincere ethical claims just seem to “come with” corresponding motivations. Here, too, expressivism seems well suited to account for this feature of ethical claims, since they take ethical claims to directly express non-cognitive states of mind, for example, desires, emotions, attitudes, commitments, and these states are either capable of motivating by themselves, or at least closely tied to motivation. So while ethical expressivists distinguish themselves from earlier non-cognitivists by accepting the thesis of semantic ideationalism, they are no less capable of accommodating the very same considerations that motivated non-cognitivism in the first place.

Finally, return to the Frege-Geach Problem. As we saw in the previous section, Geach originally posed it as a kind of logical problem for non-cognitivists: by denying that claims in the relevant area of discourse express propositions, non-cognitivists take on the burden of explaining how such claims can be involved in logical inference, and why some such inferences are valid and others invalid. Hare took a first step toward meeting this challenge by proposing that we understand the contents of ethical claims in terms of speech acts, and then work out a kind of “logic” of speech acts. Contemporary expressivists, since they understand the contents of ethical claims not in terms of speech acts but in terms of mental states, are committed to doing something similar with whatever non-cognitive states they think are expressed by these claims. In other words, as it is sometimes put, expressivists owe us a kind of “logic of attitudes.”

Here, again, is our test case:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

If the meanings of (3), (4), and (5) are to be understood solely in terms of mental states, and not in terms of propositions, how is it that we can infer (5) from (3) and (4)? And why is the inference valid?

In some of his earlier work on this, Blackburn (1984) answers these questions by suggesting that complex ethical claims like (4) express higher-order non-cognitive states, in this case, something like a commitment to disapproving of getting one’s little brother to lie upon disapproving of lying. If someone sincerely disapproves of lying, and is also committed to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie as long as she disapproves of lying—the two states expressed by (3) and (4), respectively—then she thereby commits herself to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie. This is one sense in which (5) might “follow from” (3) and (4), even if it is not exactly the entailment relation with which we are all familiar from introductory logic.

Furthermore, a familiar way to account for the validity of inferences like (3)-(5) is by saying that it is impossible for the premises to be true and for the conclusion to be false. But if the expressivist takes something like the approach under consideration here, he will presumably have to say something different, since it is certainly possible for someone to hold both of the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5). So for instance, the expressivist might say something like this: while a person certainly can hold the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5), such a person would nonetheless exhibit a kind of inconsistency in her attitudes—she would have what Blackburn calls a “fractured sensibility” (1984: 195). It is this inconsistency that might explain why the move from (3) and (4) to (5) is “valid,” provided that we allow for this alternative sense of validity. Recall, that this is essentially the same sort of inconsistency of attitudes that Hare thought underlies our intuitions about moral supervenience.

This is just one way in which expressivists might attempt to solve the Frege-Geach Problem.  Others have attempted different sorts of “logics of attitudes,” with mixed results. In early twenty-first century discourse, the debate about whether such a thing as a “logic of attitudes” is even possible—and if so, what it should look like—is ongoing.

4. The Continuity Problem

Even if expressivists can solve, or at least avoid, the Frege-Geach Problem as Geach originally posed it, there is a deeper problem that they face, a kind of “problem behind the problem”, and that will be the subject of this section. To get a sense of the problem, consider that expressivists have taken a position that effectively pulls them in two opposing directions. On the one hand, since the earliest days of non-cognitivism, philosophers in the expressivist tradition have wanted to draw some sort of sharp contrast between claims in the relevant area of discourse and claims outside of that area of discourse, that is, between ethical and non-ethical claims. But on the other hand, and this is the deeper issue that one might think lies behind the Frege-Geach Problem, ethical claims seem to behave in all sorts of logical and semantic contexts just like their non-ethical counterparts. Ethical claims are apparently no different from non-ethical claims in being (a) embeddable into unasserted contexts, like disjunctions and the antecedents of conditionals, (b) involved in logical inferences, (c) posed as questions, (d) translated across different languages, (e) negated, (f) supported with reasons, and (g) used to articulate the objects of various states of mind, for example, we can say that Jones believes that lying is wrong, Anderson regrets that lying is wrong, and Black wonders whether lying is wrong, to name just a few. It is in accounting for the many apparent continuities between ethical and non-ethical claims that expressivists run into serious problems. So call the general problem here the Continuity Problem for expressivism.

One very significant step that expressivists have taken in order to solve the Continuity Problem is to expand their semantic ideationalism to apply to claims of all sorts, and not just to claims in the relevant area of discourse. So, in the same way that ethical claims get their meanings from non-cognitive mental states, non-ethical claims get their meanings from whatever states of mind they express. In other words, expressivists attempt to solve the Continuity Problem by swapping their “local” semantic ideationalism, that is, ideationalism specifically with respect to claims in the discourse of concern, for a more “global” ideationalist semantics intended to apply to claims in all areas of discourse. This is remarkable, as it represents a wholesale departure from the more traditional propositionalist semantics according to which sentences mean what they do in virtue of the propositions they express. Recall the earlier claims:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

According to most contemporary expressivists, the meanings of both (1) and (3) are to be understood in terms of the mental states they express.  Claim (3) expresses something like disapproval of lying, and claim (1) expresses the belief that it is snowing, as opposed to the proposition that it is snowing. So even if ethical and non-ethical claims express different kinds of states, their meanings are nonetheless accounted for in the same way, that is, in terms of whatever mental states the relevant claims are supposed to express.

If nothing else, this promises to be an important first step toward solving the Continuity Problem. But taking this step, from local to global semantic ideationalism, may prove to be more trouble than it is worth, as it appears to raise all sorts of other problems a few of which we shall consider here under the general banner of the Continuity Problem.

a. A Puzzle about Negation

Keeping in mind that expressivism now appears to hinge upon it being the case that an ideationalist approach to semantics can account for all of the same logical and linguistic phenomena that the more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to semantics can account for, consider a simple case of negation:

(1)        It is snowing.

(7)        It is not snowing.

On an ideationalist approach to meaning, (1) gets its meaning from the belief that it is snowing, and (7) gets its meaning from either the belief that it is not snowing, or perhaps a state of disbelief that it is snowing, assuming, for now, that a state of disbelief is something different from a mere lack of belief. A claim and its negation ought to have incompatible contents, and this is apparently how an ideationalist would account for the incompatibility of (1) and (7). But now consider a case of an ethical claim and its negation:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(8)        Lying is not wrong.

We saw these claims earlier, in Section 3, when discussing how expressivists are supposed to be able to account for genuine moral disagreement in a way better than ethical subjectivists.  Basically, expressivists account for such disagreement by supposing that a speaker of (3) and a speaker of (8) express incompatible mental states, as is the case with (1) and (7).  But if the incompatible states in the case of (1) and (7) are states of belief that p and belief that not-p (or belief and disbelief), what are the incompatible states in this case?

The non-cognitive mental state expressed by (3) is presumably something like disapproval of lying. So what is the non-cognitive state that is expressed by (8)? On the face of it, this seems like it should be an easy question to answer, but upon reflection, it turns out to be really quite puzzling. Whatever is expressed by (8), it should be something that is independently plausible as the content of such a claim, and it should be something that is somehow incompatible with the state expressed by (3). But what is it?

To see why this is puzzling, consider the following three sentences (adapted from Unwin 1999 and 2001):

(9)        Jones does not think that lying is wrong.

(10)      Jones thinks that not lying is wrong.

(11)      Jones thinks that lying is not wrong.

These three sentences say three importantly different things about Jones. Furthermore, it seems as if the state attributed to Jones in (11) should be the very same state as the one expressed by (8) above. But again, what is that state?  Let us proceed by process of elimination. It cannot be that (11) attributes to Jones a state of approval, that is, approving of lying. Presumably, for Jones to approve of lying would be for Jones to think that lying is right, or good. But that is not what (11) says; it says only that he thinks lying is not wrong. Nor can (11) attribute to Jones a lack of disapproval of lying, since that is what is attributed in (9), and as we’ve already agreed, (9) and (11) tell us different things about Jones. Moreover, (11) also cannot attribute to Jones the state of disapproval of not lying, since that is the state being attributed in (10). But at this point, it is hard to see what mental state is left to be attributed to Jones in (11), and to be the content of (8).

The expressivist does not want to say that (3) and (8) express incompatible beliefs, or states of belief and disbelief, as with (1) and (7), since beliefs are cognitive states, and we know that expressivists are psychological non-cognitivists. If (3) and (8) express beliefs, and we share with Hume the idea that beliefs by themselves are incapable of motivating, then we will apparently not have the resources for explaining the close connection between people sincerely making one of these claims and their being motivated to act accordingly. Nor does the expressivist want to say that (3) and (8) express inconsistent propositions, since that would be to abandon her semantic non-factualism. Propositions are often thought to determine truth conditions, and truth conditions are often thought to be ways the world might be. So to allow that (3) and (8) express propositions would presumably be to allow that there is a way the world might be that would make it true that lying is wrong. Furthermore, accounting for this would involve the expressivist in precisely the sort of moral metaphysical inquiries she seeks to avoid. For these reasons, it is crucial for the expressivist to find a non-cognitive mental state to be the content of (8). It must be something incompatible with the state expressed by (3), and it must be a plausible candidate for the state attributed to Jones in (11). But as we have seen, it is very difficult to articulate just what state it is.

Expressivists must show us that, even after accepting global semantic ideationalism, we are still able to account for all of the same phenomena as those accounted for by traditional propositional approaches to meaning. But here it seems they struggle even with something as simple as negation. Further, until they provide a satisfactory explanation of the contents of negated ethical claims, it will remain unclear whether they really do have a better account of moral disagreement than ethical subjectivists, as has long been claimed.

b. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions

Earlier, it was noted that ethical claims are no different from non-ethical claims in being able to articulate the objects of various states of mind. Let us now look closer at why expressivists may have a problem accounting for this particular point of continuity between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

(12)      Frank fears that it is snowing.

(13)      Wanda wonders whether it is snowing.

(14)      Haddie hates that it is snowing.

Claims (12)-(14) ascribe three different attitudes to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie. Clearly, however, these three attitudes have something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(1)        It is snowing.

Traditionally, the way that philosophers of mind and language have accounted for this is by saying that (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that what all three of the attitudes ascribed to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie have in common is that they are all directed at one and the same proposition, that is, they all have the same proposition as their object.

By abandoning traditional propositional semantics, though, expressivists take on the burden of finding some other way of explaining how the contents of expressions like “fears that”, “wonders whether”, and “hates that” are supposed to relate to the content of whatever follows them. If the content of (1) is supposed to be something like the belief that it is snowing, as ideationalists suppose, and (1) is also supposed to be able to articulate the object of Frank’s fear, then the expressivist is apparently committed to thinking that Frank’s fear is actually directed at the belief that it is snowing. But, of course, Frank is not afraid of the belief that it is snowing—he is not afraid to believe that it is snowing—rather, he is afraid that it is snowing.

Things are no less problematic in the ethical case. For consider:

(15)      Frank fears that lying is wrong.

(16)      Wanda wonders whether lying is wrong.

(17)      Haddie hates that lying is wrong.

Here again, it seems right to say that the attitudes ascribed in (15)-(17) all share something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(3)        Lying is wrong.

But if it is denied that (3) expresses a proposition, as ethical expressivists and non-cognitivists always have, it becomes unclear how (3) could be used to articulate the object of those attitudes.  Focus upon (15) for a moment. Now, what are the contents of ‘fears that’ and ‘lying is wrong’, such that the latter is the object of the former? We presumably have one answer already, from the expressivist: the content of ‘lying is wrong’ in (15), like the content of (3), is an attitude of disapproval toward lying. However, on the plausible assumption that the content of “fears that” is an attitude of fear toward the content of whatever follows, we apparently get the expressivist saying that (15) ascribes to Frank a fear of disapproval of lying, or a fear of disapproving of lying. But surely that is not what (15) ascribes to Frank. He may fear these other things as well, but (15) says only that he fears that lying is wrong.

The expressivist may try to avoid this puzzle by insisting that “lying is wrong” as it appears in (15) has a content that is different from the content of (3), but this still leaves us wondering what the meanings of claims like (15)-(17) are supposed to be, according to the expressivist’s ideationalist semantics. As Schroeder explains, expressivists “owe an account of the meaning of each and every attitude verb, for example, fears that, wonders whether, and so on; just as much as they owe an account of “not”, “and”, and “if … then”. Very little progress has yet been made on how non-cognitivists [or expressivists] can treat attitude verbs, and the prospects for further progress look dim” (Schroeder 2008d, p.716).

c. Saving the Differences

One might think that a simple way to defeat any non-factualist account of ethical claims is simply to point out that we can coherently embed ethical claims into truth claims. It makes perfect sense, for instance, for someone to say, “It is true that lying is wrong.” Presumably, however, this could only make sense if whatever follows “It is true that” is the sort of thing that can be true. Of course, propositions are among the sorts of things that can be true, in fact, this is often thought to be their distinguishing characteristic. But non-factualists deny that ethical claims express propositions. So how do they account for the fact that the truth-predicate seems to apply just as well to ethical claims as it does to non-ethical claims?

If this were a devastating problem for non-cognitivists, then the non-cognitivist tradition in ethics would not have lasted for very long, since philosophers were well aware of the matter soon after Ayer first published Language, Truth, and Logic in 1936. The thought then—essentially just an application of Ramsey’s (1927) famous redundancy theory of truth—was that, in at least some cases, the truth-predicate does not actually ascribe some metaphysically robust property being true to whatever it is being predicated of. Rather, to add the truth-predicate to a claim is to do nothing more than to simply assert the claim by itself. In claiming that “It is true that lying is wrong,” on this view, a speaker expresses the very same state that is expressed by claiming only that “Lying is wrong,” and nothing more; hence, the “redundancy” of the truth predicate.

In early twenty-first century discourse, theories like Ramsey’s are referred to as deflationary or minimalist theories of truth, since they effectively “deflate” or “minimize” the ontological significance of the truth-predicate. Some ethical expressivists, in part as a way of solving the Continuity Problem, have taken to supplementing their expressivism with deflationism. The basic idea goes something like this: if we accept a deflationary theory of truth across the board, we can apparently say that ethical claims are truth-apt, in fact, every bit as truth-apt as any other sort of claim. This allows the expressivist to avoid simple versions of the objection noted at the beginning of this section.  Interestingly, the deflationism need not stop with the truth-predicate. We might also deflate the notion of a proposition by insisting that a proposition is just whatever is expressed by a truth-apt claim. As long as we allow that ethical claims are truth-apt, in some deflationary sense, we may now be able to say, for instance, that

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses the proposition that lying is wrong, after all. If this is allowed, then the expressivist may now have the resources for accounting for the compositionality of ethical discourse in basically the same way in which traditional propositional semanticists would do so. The meanings of complex ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the propositions expressed by their parts. Once the notion of a proposition is deflated, we might just as well deflate the notion of belief by saying something to the effect that all it is for one to believe that p is for one to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. In these ways, perhaps an expressivist can “earn the right” to talk of truth, propositions, and beliefs, and perhaps also knowledge, in the ethical domain, just as they do in non-ethical domains.

This is the essence of Blackburn’s brand of expressivism, known commonly nowadays as ‘quasi-realism’. As we saw earlier, moral realists are those who believe that moral properties have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity. This allows realists to account for things like truth, propositions, beliefs, and knowledge in the ethical domain in precisely the same way that we ordinarily do in other domains, such as those that include facts about roundness and solidity. By deflating the relevant notions, however, Blackburn and other moral non-realists are nonetheless supposed to be able to say all the things that realists say about moral truth, and the like; hence, “quasi”-realism.

There are at least two problems for ethical expressivists who take this approach to solving the Continuity Problem. The first is simply that deflationism is independently a very controversial view. In his own defense of a deflationary theory of truth, Paul Horwich addresses no fewer than thirty-nine “alleged difficulties” faced by such a theory (Horwich 1998). Granted, he apparently believes that all of these difficulties can be addressed with some degree of satisfaction, but few will deny that deflationary theories of truth represent a departure from the common assumption that truth is a real property of things, and that this property consists in something like a thing’s corresponding with reality. Deflationism may help expressivists avoid the Continuity Problem, but at the cost of then burdening them to defend deflationism against its many problems.

A second and more interesting problem, though, is that taking this deflationary route may, in the end, ruin what was supposed to be so unique about expressivism all along. In other words, there is a sense in which deflationism may too good a response to the Continuity Problem. After all, at the core of ethical expressivism is the belief that there is some significant difference between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Recall again our two basic instances of each:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

As we just saw, once deflationism is allowed to run its course, we end up saying remarkably similar things about (1) and (3). Both are truth-apt; both express propositions; both can be the objects of belief; both can be known; and so forth. But now you may be wondering: what, then, is supposed to be the significant difference that sets (3) apart from (1)? Or, another way of putting it: what would be the point of contention between an expressivist and her opponents if both parties agreed to deflate such notions as truth, proposition, and belief? This has sometimes been called the problem of “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

One response to this problem might be to say that the relevant differences between ethical and non-ethical discourse actually occur at a level below the surface of the two linguistic domains. Recall that we deflated the notion of belief by saying that to believe that p is just to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. Using these terms, the expressivist might say that the main difference between (1) and (3) is a matter of what is involved in “accepting” the two claims. Accepting an ethical claim like (3) is something importantly different from accepting a non-ethical claim like (1), and presumably the difference has something to do with the types of mental states involved in doing so.  Whether or not this sort of response will work is the subject of an ongoing debate in early twenty-first century philosophical literature.

5. Recent Trends

While the Continuity Problem remains a lively point, or collection of points, of debate between expressivists and their critics, it is certainly not the only topic with which those involved in the literature are currently occupied. Here we review a few other recent trends in expressivist thought, perhaps the most notable among them being the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories.

a. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem

There are some who would say that the Continuity Problem just is the Frege-Geach Problem, that is, that the Frege-Geach Problem ought to be understood very broadly, so as to include all of the many issues associated with the apparent logical and semantic continuities between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Even so, ethical expressivism faces other problems as well. Let us now look briefly at an issue that is receiving more and more attention these days—the so-called Moral Attitude Problem for ethical expressivism.

Recall again that expressivists often claim to have a better way of accounting for the nature of moral disagreement than the account on offer from ethical subjectivists. The idea, according to the expressivist, is supposed to be that a moral disagreement is ultimately just a disagreement in non-cognitive attitudes. Rather than expressing propositions about their opposing attitudes—which, we saw earlier, would be perfectly compatible with each other—the two disagreeing parties directly express those opposing non-cognitive attitudes. But then, in our discussion of the puzzle about negation, we saw that the expressivist may actually owe us more than this. Specifically, she owes us an explanation of what, exactly, those opposing attitudes are supposed to be. If Jones claims that lying is wrong, and Smith claims that it is not wrong, then Jones and Smith are engaged in a moral disagreement about lying. The expressivist, presumably, will say that Jones expresses something like disapproval of lying. But then what is the state that is directly expressed by Smith’s claim, such that it is disagrees, or is incompatible, with Jones’ disapproval?

According to the Moral Attitude Problem, the issue actually runs deeper than this, for there are more constraints on the expressivist’s answer than just that the state expressed by Smith be something incompatible with Jones’ disapproval of lying. In fact, Jones’ disapproval of lying may turn out to be no less mysterious than whatever sort of state is supposed to be expressed by Smith. After all, we disapprove of all sorts of things. Suppose that Jones also disapproves of Quentin Tarantino movies, but Smith does not. Presumably, this would not count as a moral disagreement, despite the fact that Jones and Smith are expressing mental states similar to those expressed in their disagreement about lying. So what is it, according to ethical expressivism, that makes the one disagreement, and not the other, a moral disagreement? This is especially puzzling given that expressivists often clarify their view by saying that moral disagreements are more like aesthetic disagreements, like a disagreement over Tarantino films; than they are like disagreements over facts, such as whether or not it is snowing.

So the Moral Attitude Problem, basically, is the problem of specifying the exact type, or types, of attitude expressed by ethical claims, such that someone expressing the relevant state counts as making an ethical claim—as opposed to an aesthetic claim, or something else entirely. Judith Thomson raises something like the Moral Attitude Problem when she writes,

The [ethical expressivist] needs to avail himself of a special kind of approval and disapproval: these have to be moral approval and moral disapproval.  For presumably he does not wish to say that believing Alice ought to do a thing is having toward her doing it the same attitude of approval that I have toward the sound of her splendid new violin. (Thomson 1996, p.110)

And several years later, in a paper entitled “Some Not-Much-Discussed Problems for Non-Cognitivism in Ethics,” Michael Smith raises the same problem:

[Ethical expressivists] insist that it is analytic that when people sincerely make normative claims they thereby express desires or aversions.  But which desires and aversions … , and what special feature do they possess that makes them especially suitable for expression in a normative claim? (Smith 2001, p.107)

But it is only very recently that expressivists and their opponents have begun to give the Moral Attitude Problem the attention that it deserves (see Merli 2008; Kauppinen 2010; Köhler 2013; Miller 2013, pp.39-47, pp.81-87; and Björnsson and McPherson 2014)

What can the expressivist say in response? For starters, expressivists can, and should, point out that the Moral Attitude Problem is not unique to their view. Indeed, those who think that ethical claims express cognitive states, like beliefs—namely, ethical cognitivists—face a very similar challenge: Jones believes both that lying is wrong and that Quentin Tarantino movies are bad, but only one of these counts as a moral belief; what is it, exactly, that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral belief? Cognitivists will say that the one belief has a moral proposition as its content, whereas the other belief does not. But that just pushes the question back a step: what, now, is it that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral proposition? Whether it be a matter of spelling out the difference between moral and non-moral beliefs, or that between moral and non-moral propositions, cognitivists are no less burdened to give an account of the nature of moral thinking than are ethical expressivists.

In fact, Köhler argues that expressivists can actually take what are essentially the same routes in response to the Moral Attitude Problem as those taken by cognitivists. Cognitivists, he thinks, have just two options: they can either (a) characterize the nature of moral thinking by reference to some realm of sui generis moral facts which, when they are the objects of beliefs, make those beliefs moral beliefs, or else (b) do the same, but without positing a realm of sui generis moral facts, and instead identifying moral facts with some set of non-moral facts. Similarly, it seems expressivists have two options: they can either (a) say that “the moral attitude” is some sui generis state of mind, or else (b) insist that “the moral attitude” can be analyzed in terms of non-cognitive mental states with which we are already familiar, like desires and aversions, approval and disapproval, and so forth.

The second of these options for expressivists is certainly the more popular of the two. But according to Köhler, if expressivists are to be successful in taking this approach, they ought to conceive of the identity between “the moral attitude” and other, more familiar non-cognitive states in much the same way that naturalistic moral realists conceive of the identity between moral and non-moral facts—that is, either by insisting that the identity is synthetic a posteriori, as the so-called “Cornell realists” do with moral and non-moral facts, or by insisting that the identity is conceptual, but non-obvious, an approach to conceptual analysis proposed by David Lewis, and recently taken up by a few philosophers from Canberra. Otherwise, if an expressivist is comfortable allowing for a sui generis non-cognitive mental state to hold the place of “the moral attitude,” she should get to work explaining what this state is like. Indeed, Köhler argues that this can be done without violating expressivism’s long-standing commitment to metaphysical naturalism (see Köhler 2013, pp.495-507).

b. Hybrid Theories

Perhaps the most exciting of recent trends in the expressivism literature is the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories. The idea behind hybrid theories, very basically, is that we might be able to secure all of the advantages of both expressivism and cognitivism by allowing that ethical claims express both non-cognitive and cognitive mental states. Why call them hybrid expressivist views, then, and not hybrid cognitivist views? Recall that the two central theses of ethical expressivism are psychological non-cognitivism—the thesis that ethical claims express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive—and semantic ideationalism—the thesis that the meanings of ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the mental states that they express. Since neither of these theses state that ethical claims express only non-cognitive states, the hybrid theorist can affirm both of them whole-heartedly. For that reason, hybrid theories are generally considered to be forms of expressivism.

The idea that a single claim might express two distinct mental states is not a new one. Philosophers of language have long thought, for instance, that slurs and pejoratives are capable of doing this. Consider the term “yankee” as used by people living in the American South. In most cases, among Southerners, to call someone a “yankee” is to express a certain sort of negative attitude toward the person. But importantly, the term “yankee” cannot apply to just anyone, rather, it applies only to people who are from the North. Acordingly, when native Southerner Roy says, “Did you hear?  Molly’s dating a yankee!” he expresses both (a) a belief that Molly’s partner is from the North, and (b) a negative attitude toward Molly’s partner. It seems we need to suppose that Roy has and expresses both of these states—one cognitive, the other non-cognitive—in order to make adequate sense of the meaning of his claim. In much the same way, hybrid theorists in metaethics suggest that ethical claims can express both beliefs and attitudes. Indeed, these philosophers often model their theories on an analogy to the nature of slurs and pejoratives (see Hay 2013).

Even within the expressivist tradition, the language of hybridity may be new, but the basic idea is not. Recall from earlier that Hare believed ethical claims have two sorts of meaning: descriptive meaning and prescriptive meaning. To claim that something is “good,” he thinks, is to both (a) say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) commend the thing in virtue of these properties; this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning. This is not far off from a hybrid view according to which “good”-claims express both (a) a belief that something has some property or properties, and (b) a positive non-cognitive attitude toward the thing. Hare was apparently ahead of his time in this respect. The hybrid movement as it is now known is less than a decade old.

One of the earliest notable hybrid views is Ridge’s “ecumenical expressivism” (see Ridge 2006 and 2007). In its initial form, ecumenical expressivism is the view that ethical claims express two closely related mental states—one a belief, and the other a non-cognitive state like approval or disapproval. Furthermore, as an instance of semantic ideationalism, ecumenical expressivism adds that the literal meanings, or semantic contents, of ethical claims are to be understood solely in terms of these mental states. So, for example, the claim

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses something like these two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) a belief that lying has property F. Notably, the view allows for a kind of subjectivity to moral judgment, since the nature of property F will differ from person to person. A utilitarian, for instance, might disapprove of behavior that fails to maximize utility; a Kantian might instead disapprove of behavior that disrespects people’s autonomy; and so on and so forth. Furthermore, Ridge’s view is supposed to be able to solve the Frege-Geach Problem by conceiving of logical inference and validity in terms of the relationships that obtain among beliefs.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

According to ecumenical expressivism, complex ethical claims like (4) also express two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) the complex belief that if lying has property F, then getting one’s little brother to lie has property F as well. Coupled with an account of logical validity understood in terms of consistency of beliefs, this looks like a promising way to satisfy Geach’s two challenges. (Ridge has since updated his view so that it is no longer a semantic theory, but rather a meta-semantic theory. Thus, rather than attempting to assign literal meanings to ethical claims, Ridge means only to explain that in virtue of which ethical claims have the meanings that they do. See Ridge 2014.)

The implicature-style views defended by Copp and Finlay also fall within the hybrid camp (Copp 2001, 2009; Finlay 2004, 2005). Coined by philosopher H. Paul Grice, the term “implicature” refers to a semantic phenomenon in which a speaker means or implies one thing, while saying something else. A popular example is that of the professor who writes, “Alex has good handwriting,” in a letter of recommendation. What the professor says is that Alex has good handwriting, but what the professor means or implies is that Alex is not an especially good student. So the claim “Alex has good handwriting” has both a literal content, that Alex has good handwriting, and an implicated content, that Alex is not an especially good student.

In the same way, Copp and Finlay suggest that ethical claims have both literal and implicated contents. Once again:

(3)        Lying is wrong

According to these implicature-style views, someone who sincerely utters (3) thereby communicates two things. First, she either expresses a belief, or asserts a proposition, to the effect that lying is wrong—this is the claim’s literal content. Second, she implies that she has some sort of non-cognitive attitude toward lying—this is the claim’s implicated content. It is in this way that implicature-style views are supposed to capture the virtues of both cognitivism and expressivism. Where Copp and Finlay disagree is over the matter of what it is in virtue of which the non-cognitive attitude is implicated. According to Copp, it is a matter of linguistic conventions that govern ethical discourse; whereas Finlay thinks it is a matter of the dynamics of ethical conversation. So Copp’s view is an instance of conventional implicature, while Finlay’s is an instance of conversational implicature.

There may be yet another way to “go hybrid” with one’s expressivism. Rather than hybridizing the mental state(s) expressed by ethical claims, one might instead hybridize the very notion of expression itself. This is the route taken by defenders of a view known as ‘ethical neo-expressivism’ (Bar-On and Chrisman 2009; Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias 2014). Ethical neo-expressivism rests upon two very important distinctions. The first is a distinction between two different kinds of expression. When we say that agents express their mental states and that sentences express propositions, we refer not just to two different instances of expression, but more importantly, to two different kinds expression, which are often conflated by expressivists.  To see how the two kinds of expression come apart, consider:

(18)      It is so great to see you!

(19)      I am so glad to see you!

Intuitively, these two sentences have different semantic contents. Setting aside complicated issues related to indexicality, sentence (18) expresses the proposition that it is so great to see you (the addressee), and sentence (19) expresses the proposition that I (the speaker) am so glad to see you (the addressee). However, these two different sentences might nonetheless function as vehicles for expressing the same mental state, that is, I might express my gladness or joy at seeing a friend by uttering either of them. Indeed, I might also do so by hugging my friend, or even just by smiling. Importantly, the neo-expressivist urges, it is not the speaker who expresses this or that proposition, but the sentences. People cannot express propositions, but sentences can, in virtue of being conventional representations of them. However, it is not the sentences that express gladness or joy, but the speaker. Sentences cannot express mental states; they are just strings of words. But people can certainly express their mental states by performing various acts, some of which involve the utterance of sentences. Call the relation between sentences and propositions semantic-expression, or s-expression; and call the relation between agents and their mental states action-expression, or a-expression.

According to neo-expressivists, most ethical expressivists, including most hybrid theorists, conflate these two senses of expression because they fail to adequately recognize a second distinction. Notice that terms like “claim”, “judgment”, and “statement” are ambiguous: they might refer either to an act or to the product of that act. So the term “ethical claim” might refer either to the act of making an ethical claim, or to the product of this act—which, presumably, is a sentence tokened either in thought or in speech. This distinction between ethical claims understood as acts and ethical claims understood as products maps nicely onto the earlier distinction between a- and s-expression. Understood as acts, ethical claims are different from non-ethical claims in that, when making an ethical claim, a speaker a-expresses some non-cognitive attitude. In this way, neo-expressivists can apparently affirm psychological non-cognitivism, and may also have the resources for “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse. On the other hand, understood as products—that is, sentences containing ethical terms—ethical claims are just like non-ethical claims in s-expressing propositions, and not necessarily in the deflationary sense of proposition noted above. By allowing that ethical claims express propositions, the neo-expressivist may have all she needs in order to avoid the Continuity Problem.

Now, according to some, semantic ideationalism is essential to expressivism. Gibbard, for instance, writes, “The term ‘expressivism’ I mean to cover any account of meanings that follow this indirect path: to explain the meaning of a term, explain what states of mind the term can be used to express” (2003, p.7). However, ethical neo-expressivism, as we have just seen, rejects semantic ideationalism in favor of the more traditional propositional approach to meaning. In light of this, one might legitimately wonder whether neo-expressivism ought to count as an expressivist view. But as Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias (2014) argue, neo-expressivism is perfectly capable of accommodating both of the main motivations of non-cognitivism and expressivism described in Sections 1 and 3—that is, avoiding a commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties, and accounting for the close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.  Besides, as we saw earlier, it looks like the expressivist’s commitment to semantic ideationalism is what got her into trouble with the Continuity Problem in the first place. So even if neo-expressivism represents something of a departure from mainstream expressivist thought, it may nonetheless be a departure worth considering.

c. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology

Expressivists have long recognized that it is possible to make an ethical claim without being in whatever is supposed to be the corresponding non-cognitive mental state. It is possible, for instance, to utter

(3)        Lying is wrong

without, at the same time, disapproving of lying. Maybe the speaker is just reciting a line from a play; or maybe the speaker suffers from a psychological disorder that renders him incapable of ever being in the relevant non-cognitive state, and he is just repeating something that he has heard others say. These are surely possibilities, and expressivists have at times had different things to say about them, and other cases like them. Either way, though, expressivists generally assume that ethical claims are nonetheless tied to non-cognitive states in a way that justifies us in thinking that a speaker of an ethical claim, if she is being sincere, ought to be motivated to act accordingly. This is one of the two main motivations that attract people to theories in the expressivist tradition.

The assumption that sincere ethical claims in ordinary cases are accompanied by non-cognitive states is presumably one that has empirical implications.  If true, for instance, one might expect to find activity in regions of the brain associated with such states as people make ethical claims sincerely. Indeed, this is precisely what researchers in empirical moral psychology have found throughout various studies conducted over the past few decades. From brain scans to behavioral experiments, tests of skin conductance to moral judgment surveys given in disgusting environments, study after study seems to confirm a view that is sometimes called “psychological sentimentalism”—that is, the view that people are prompted to make the ethical claims that they make primarily by their emotional responses to things.

Now, to be sure, the link posited by psychological sentimentalism is a causal one—our emotions cause us to make certain ethical claims—and that is importantly different from the conceptual link that expressivists generally assume exists between non-cognitive states and ethical claims. But expressivists may nonetheless benefit from exploring how recent work in empirical moral psychology can be used to support parts of their view—for example, how it is that the conceptual link is supposed to have come about. If nothing else, expressivists may find significant empirical support for the view, shared by everyone in the tradition since Ayer, that ethical claims are expressions of characteristically non-cognitive states of mind.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Austin, J. L. (1970). “Other Minds.” In J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers. Second Edition. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Ayer, A. J. (1946/1952). Language, Truth, and Logic. New York: Dover.
  • Barker, S. (2006). “Truth and the Expressing in Expressivism.” In Horgan, T. and Timmons, M. (eds.). Metaethics after Moore. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bar-On, D. and M. Chrisman (2009). “Ethical Neo-Expressivism.” In R. Shafer-Landau (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 4. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bar-On, D., M. Chrisman, and J. Sias (2014). “(How) Is Ethical Neo-Expressivism a Hybrid View.” In M. Ridge and G. Fletcher (eds.), Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Björnsson, G. and T. McPherson (2014). “Moral Attitudes for Non-Cognitivists: Solving the Specification Problem,” Mind,
  • Blackburn, S. (1984). Spreading the Word. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Blackburn, S. (1988a). “Attitudes and Contents.” Ethics 98: 501-17.
  • Blackburn, S. (1988b). “Supervenience Revisited.” In G. Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Blackburn, S. (1998). Ruling Passions. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Boisvert, D. (2008). “Expressive-Assertivism.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 89(2): 169-203.
  • Boyd, R. (1988). “How to Be a Moral Realist.” In G. Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Brink, D. (1989). Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chrisman, M. (2008). “Expressivism, Inferentialism, and Saving the Debate.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 77: 334-358.
  • Chrisman, M. (2012). “Epistemic Expressivism.” Philosophy Compass 7(2): 118-126.
  • Copp, D. (2001). “Realist-Expressivism: A Neglected Option for Moral Realism.” Social Philosophy and Policy 18(2): 1-43.
  • Copp, D. (2009). “Realist-Expressivism and Conventional Implicature.” In Shafer-Landau, R. (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 4. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Coventry, A. (2006). Hume’s Theory of Causation: A Quasi-Realist Interpretation. London: Continuum.
  • Divers, J. and A. Miller (1994). “Why Expressivists About Value Should Not Love Minimalism About Truth.” Analysis 54: 12-19.
  • Dreier, J. (2004). “Meta-Ethics and the Problem of Creeping Minimalism.” Philosophical Perspectives 18: 23-44.
  • Dreier, J. (2009). “Relativism (and Expressivism) and the Problem of Disagreement.” Philosophical Perspectives 23: 79-110.
  • Finlay, S. (2004). “The Conversational Practicality of Value Judgment.” The Journal of Ethics 8: 205-223.
  • Finlay, S. (2005). “Value and Implicature.” Philosophers’ Imprint 5: 1-20.
  • Geach, P. (1965). “Assertion.” Philosophical Review 74: 449-465.
  • Gert, J. (2002). “Expressivism and Language Learning.” Ethics 112: 292-314.
  • Gibbard, A. (1990). Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Gibbard, A. (2003). Thinking How to Live. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Greene, J. D. (2008). “The Secret Joke of Kant’s Soul.” In Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Vol. 3: The Neuroscience of Morality: Emotion, Brain Disorders, and Development. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 35-79.
  • Greene, J. D. and J. Haidt (2002). “How (and Where) Does Moral Judgment Work?” Trends in Cognitive Sciences 6: 517-523.
  • Haidt, J. (2001). “The Emotional Dog and Its Rational Tail: A Social Intuitionist Approach to Moral Judgment.” Psychological Review 108(4): 814-834.
  • Hare, R. M. (1952). The Language of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hare, R. M. (1970). “Meaning and Speech Acts.” The Philosophical Review 79: 3-24.
  • Hay, Ryan. (2013). “Hybrid Expressivism and the Analogy between Pejoratives and Moral Language.” European Journal of Philosophy 21(3): 450-474.
  • Horwich, P. (1998). Truth. Second Edition. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Jackson, F. (1998). From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Jackson, F. and P. Pettit (1995). “Moral Functionalism and Moral Motivation.” Philosophical Quarterly 45: 20-40.
  • Kauppinen, A. (2010). “What Makes a Sentiment Moral?” In R. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 5. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Köhler, S. (2013). “Do Expressivists Have an Attitude

Author Information

James Sias
Email: siasj@dickinson.edu
Dickinson College
U. S. A.