Ethics and Phenomenology
Phenomenology is, generally speaking, a discipline that examines questions of metaphysics and epistemology. Insofar as ethics is usually seen as a topic apart from metaphysics and epistemology, it is thus not typically addressed by philosophers in the phenomenological tradition. However, there are important areas of overlap between ethics, metaphysics and epistemology, which may be fruitful points of departure for exploring a phenomenologically-oriented notion of ethics. In particular, metaphysics and epistemology seek to consider the validity of, among other ideas, analysis and wonder. An exploration of analysis and wonder can reveal the importance of ethics in this context. Once we have seen what follows from this standpoint, further consideration of ethics in terms of engineering will show how this standpoint can inform upon the world of praxis.
Table of Contents
- Theoretical Concerns
- Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World
- References and Further Reading
Ethics can be seen as the foundation of wonder and analytic thought. First, existentialists accept wonder and deemphasize analysis, though phenomenologists tend to be more open to wonder and analytic thinking. Logical positivists and linguistic analysts see wonder as reducible to logic. Existentialists and phenomenologists are comfortable with ethics associated with wonder and analysis. Positivists and analysts deny ethics as an irreducible field of study. Ethicists would look at wonder to see if people need drugs in order to achieve states of euphoria or peace. Additionally, ethicists would take the same view about computers and analytic method.
In both instances, the question of ethics enters concerning more than the validity of wonder and analysis in the traditional philosophical sense (Kazanjian, 80; Buber, p. 11). Traditionally, existentialists and phenomenologists see wonder as revealing what “is.” Analysis has almost no place in much of existentialism, and varying degrees of validity in phenomenology. Traditionally, linguistic analysts and logical positivists see nothing to be gained with wonder. Reality is language, and is to be analyzed, never something about which to wonder.
Ethics brings in a deeper issue in both instances. Even if wonder alone is valid, ought people use drugs to feel a sense of awe? Even if analysis alone can give access to reality, ought people simply resot to computers, the higher the speed the better, to understand what is?
Existential and phenomenological thinkers tell us that awe or wonder is the basis of analysis, or as pure wonder, may stand alone without cognition. Ethicists may argue that awe or wonder is a human trait and ought not require or involve drugs and surgical stimulation of the brain to induce a sense of wonder (Campbell, p. 163). Awe is basically the social, intersubjective reality of living in the world. Phenomenology calls the world the lived world instead of just the material, quantifiable world. This wonder is consciousness in the unaltered state. In this unaltered state, wonder is part of normal, lived, reality or existence.
Ethicists would say that linguistic analysis or logical positivism changes or distorts reality. Drugs and brain stimulation are not lived reality. They develop a state of artificial awe or wonder. If the unaltered mind uses logic alone to access reality, it may mean altering reality from what ought be to what artificially exists. If the person uses mind altering drugs to achieve awe or wonder, then the awe or wonder itself is altered, artificial, and unlived. We then see not the lived world, but the artificial world.
Phenomenology says we should not excarnate or take analysis out of the lived world. Phenomenological ethicists would say we should not excarnate wonder itself from the lived world. Thus, phenomenologists and existentialists would be medically, pharmaceutically, or biologically excarnating wonder or awe from the lived world, even if they refute positivism and analytics’ portrayal of awe or wonder as wrong and insist on wonder or awe as revealing reality. The ethical position becomes a sociological view (Bryant, p. 1).
Paul Ricoeur (p. 217) looks at Cartesian dualism and says that we must overcome its excarnating of objectivity from the body. Non-biochemically, Ricoeur is criticizing Cartesian dualism for ignoring the embodiment of the objective. He is insisting that objectification must be done within the context of the lived world. We analyze the lived world or reduce it to quantities within the general framework of awe or wonder. Ricoeur’s approach suggests that even logical positivism and linguistic analysis needs to look at the problem of excarnation. These movements are in the same category as Cartesian dualism when they consider analysis or reduction as without wonder, or devoid of the lived world.
The difference between logical positivism and analytic philosophy on the one hand, and Cartesian dualism on the other, rests with their views of reality. Dualism sees mind and body, or objectivity and subjectivity, as both real and valid. The problem is how to relate them. Positivism and analytic thinking argue that the lived world, subjectivity, wonder, awe, and so on do not exist as irreducible reality. They are totally reducible to the simples of fact.
Ricoeurian thinking contrasts with Cartesian dualism and with positivism and analytic philosophy by saying all three movements should see themselves as having wrongly excarnated object from the lived world. An ethics approach to wonder, however, goes deeper than Ricoeur. The ethicist would insist that we cannot justify wonder for the sake of wonder. We need to look at how we approach wonder or awe. Saying that the lived world and wonder are important is not sufficient. Arguing against positivist and analytic reductionism of wonder to facts is only partly correct. How we define the biochemical context of wonder is critical.
In ethics, we may wonder by being conscious and not taking drugs to alter the brain. People look around them, or they inquire, or meditate, and feel it crucial to feel a sense of wonder that beings “are.” We wonder by ourselves, without bio-physiological intervention. Indeed, we do not need to take an aspirin or other legal medication to feel as sense of relaxation, calm, or rest. Beyond this, ethics says we ought not feel it important or in any way justified to take any illegal drugs that might induce a “high.” The biochemical high or awe is indeed a biochemical reduction or analytic approach to wonder. This approach would assume that the state of wonder is primarily, perhaps exclusively, a chemical reaction within the brain, and has little to do with normal, non-biochemical experiences of the lived world. In other words, the biochemical approach to wonder suggests that we wonder not through existing, but primarily through changing the chemistry of the brain.
Ethics might call the biochemical approach to wonder as biochemical, pharmaceutical, or otherwise physiological positivism or analysis. Ironically and unfortunately, this becomes serious to the point where no real inquiry, not even traditional logical positivism and analytic thinking is possible. An ethicist might ask us to look at a piece of analytic literature or philosophy. We see symbols, diagrams, and virtually mathematical methods for attempting to determine resolutions to questions and problems. The analytic thinker, the positivist, would argue that they are coming near to solving issues, and that these solutions or clarifications reveal a reality devoid of wonder.
The ethics approach notes that these analytic and positivist thinkers are consciously engaging in intellectually work. They converse with each other, perhaps argumentatively with existentialists and phenomenologists, but always are participating in some kind of control over what they are doing. Their brains are functioning without medication or alteration. Now, the ethicists will point out, consider the biochemically activated phenomenologist or existentialist. In other words, we no longer just speaking of the positivist and analytic thinker inquiring without drugs. We are no longer speaking of positivists and analytic thinkers trying to totally reduce wonder to facts in terms of normal, not medicated activity. What the ethicist criticizes is the phenomenologist or existentialist who is defending wonder through druges. This person is criticizing positivism and analysis for trying to totally non-biochemically reduce wonder or awe to atomism. Yet, the phenomenologist and existentialist is defending irreducibility by feeling wonder, perhaps even attempting writing if that is possible, by consuming biochemicals which will induce the sense of oneness or awe (Eliade, p. 31).
In effect, the phenomenologist or existentialist has become a de facto positivist or analytic thinker. The phenomenologist or existentialist becomes a biochemical phenomenologist or existentialist, totally reducing the chemistry of the brain, body, and lived world to atoms and chemical reactions. If it is possible, the ethicist calls this positivistic or analytic phenomenology or existentialism. On the other hand, for clarification, the ethicist might use another term: biochemical phenomenology or existentialism.
What of the analytic thinker or positivist using computers for their approaches? Ethics would point to the efforts by analytic thinkers during World War II to crack Hitler’s Enigma Machine code. The machine worked strictly through symbols. Codes are symbols. During WWII the codes were relatively complex, but speed was crucial in breaking them. Today, and in the future, with cryptology becoming increasingly sophisticated, codes become more complex, and the speed required to break them more crucial.
Positivists and analysts would insist that their philosophy requires respect, and faster computers. Ethicists would argue that we need a better world where criminals and dictators are minimized, and their powers decapitated. Having the computer capabilities of speedier problem-solving does not “solve” the problem in its widest sense. The problem in its widest sense is that people, usually the leaders, go bad and make evil things happen in the world. When governments ignore the rise of evil, they usually invite international catastrophes such as the Second World War. As the war occurs, and as the innocent attempt to now fight and defeat the enemy, many on the side of the innocent take pride in their technical efforts.
Technical abilities helped our side win against Hitler in his efforts to communicate through codes. None of this would have had to occur if we had kept him from rising to power in the first place. His rise to power, and the unethical ways we ignored his ascension were key to the disaster of the Second World War. We ignored his actions against Jews and non-Jews. This ignorance was unethical. We sat back and did nothing.
Toward the end, we began panicking and wondered how to solve problems to end the war. One major answer was to break his coding abilities. Fortunately, we broke his code, and this helped us win the war.
Today, intelligence agencies are increasingly positivistic in their coding/decoding efforts. Computers are the foundations of coding/decoding. Speed is paramount. We spend money, lots of it, in developing ways of surreptitiously monitoring telecommunications to determine what potential terrorists are saying. Technology is advancing rapidly in our endeavors to translate foreign and English conversations to determine whether speakers are planning attacks.
Forgotten in all this rush to technologize existence, society ignores the ethical grounds of analysis and computers (Stine, 141). We forget that analysis is embodied in wonder, and that thinking and wonder involve the ethical orientation. Are we ignoring the poor, the economically and socially deprived, the underprivileged? We no doubt are ignoring the impoverished. Then, in the event that the impoverished seek ways of retaliating, we suddenly seeks technical ways of speedier discovery of the terrorists’ plots.
Even when terrorists are wealthy, we seek to look the other way instead of considering their moral deviancy and their ongoing hatred of humanity, especially of the West. We let this hatred grow, assuming that we do not initially deny it. As their hatred grows, it can mushroom into attacks against the West or even people in other cultures. Only then, in post 9/11 fashion, do we react and seek the speediest computers to analyze terrorist activities and conversations.
Ethics is derived from ethos or people. Any human activity must be seen within the social context. Thinking and wonder are among the fundamental human activities. Relegating cognition to the sum total of data becomes anti-human; similarly, relegating wonder to the realm of intravenous or other methods of drug intake is no longer a human activity. The ethos orientation of cognition means that thought, contrary to what Descartes said, is embodied and of social perspective. Cognition is never disembodied. To disembody cognition is to commit two wrongs.
One wrong is to seek cognition as devoid of awe. This makes thought sterile and dehumanizing. The second wrong is to see disembodied cognition as part of a technology where speed is the only way to resolve problems and answer questions.
Awe or wonder is the pre-cognitive requisite of the cognitive. Yet, ethics notes that we cannot stop there. Wonder cannot be an end in itself. If wonder is derived from a natural, non-drug induced sequence whereby we simply wonder that things “are,” then we are practicing true awe. Once we take drugs or otherwise stimulate the brain to induce wonder, than the wonder is unethical. It is mechanical rather than emerging from ethos.
Take the example of a hospital’s intensive care unit. Patients are put on a respirator to help them breathe. They may also be put on intravenous feeding so that the body can be “fed” nutrients mechanically instead of taking in food through the mouth. In time, however, society believes that such patients may be retained on such mechanical devices only if their physical conditions warrant such technologization. The purpose of life is for the patient to be helped toward normalcy. In this case, the patient must be helped to leave the hospital and eat and breathe, and so on, on their own.
The objective of life, of the hospital, is never to merely have the patients remain in intensive care, or even in the hospital. People need to be active in daily life, eating, breathing, and so on on their own. To eat and breathe on their own means dining and respiring as part of society, with one’s own bodily abilities. Food is irreducible to nutrients. Breathing is irreducible to oxygen intake. Food and respiration emerge from the ethos, from the ethical. As biological as eating and breathing, they are not merely physical processes.
For example, the nervous person, the seriously emotionally troubled individual, will have difficulty eating and breathing. Human activity such as eating and breathing are as much part of the ethos or ethical, as they are physical, neurochemical, and so on. Indeed, eating disorders such as those resulting in being overweight, imply reducing food to merely physical entities being “put into the mouth.” Eating does not mean simply stuffing the mouth, eating quickly, or any other physical process. Dining is a cultural, ethical process.
Similarly, we do not just respire by hyperventilating. We breathe by inhaling and exhaling normally, often unconsciously. Perons inhaling too fast may be suffering from an emotional problem, or perhaps physical difficulty. Persons inhaling and exhaling too fast are behaving unethically, anti-ethos or different from normal human activity.
We can say the same about wonder and analysis. Wonder is something we sense under normal human conditions without mechanical assistance. Drugs ought not play part of wonder.
Analysis is an activity in which we participate without the aid of computers, and hopefully within the context of wonder. To think analytically is to take apart. But to spend our time only taking apart means that we are simply assuming that words, pictures, behavior, and so on are only to be taken apart and never appreciated as products of the ethos or community. Taking apart ought mean that something was initially a whole. That wholeness cannot be violated. If we emphasize the taking apart aspect of existence, and reject or ignore the synthetic and the wonderful, we have relegated existence to a form of hospitalization, to a form of the intensive care unit.
Existence is not meant to be only analyzed, and it is not meant to be only wondered. Ethos means that analysis and wonder go hand in hand. Analysis and wonder are not mutually exclusive. We never merely analyze without some wonder, and never wonder by merely mechanical means. Both analysis and wonder reflect an ethical, social, cultural dimension.
Feminism can be helpful here. Feminists argue that nothing written is ever totally objective, and devoid of the cultural. Look at books. Their authors are not just “authorities,” but traditionally have been white males. Their subject matter, too, have typically ignored injustices toward women. Sexism means that we have looked at women simply as reducible to anatomy, and never as human beings. Ethics means that women are human beings, irreducible to physical characteristics.
Racial theory can also help. Racism has meant that authorities writing books have been white males. But the ethical thrust of the women’s’ movement and racial justice has attempted to bring about a better, ethos oriented vision. We now have books and articles written by women, and by nonwhite males. Authors are not just authors. They are a racial-gender-human continuum. No author is the sum total of racial, religious, biological, and other parts. Every author is first of all a human being.
Wonder and analysis, then, are irreducible to mechanical identification. Persons need to be able to wonder with only their mind and body, in awe of the universe or of any particular event. They need only to analyze within the context of this natural wonder, and with computers only on a limited scale.
Ethics does not demand the exclusion of computers from society. The ethos orientation requires only that computing, speed, technology, and other quantification occur within the context of a healthy environment. The idea of proactivity or prevention is important here.
Proactivity means we need to prevent rather than react to bad events. Before illness strikes, we need to monitor physical and other conditions resulting in disease. Ethics means we ought not ignore health dangers, and then react medically, physically, surgically, to “solve” unhealthy situations. Drugs, whether over the counter or prescription, do not need to take the place of a healthy lifestyle and diet. People might need to depend on drugs as they age and their body deteriorates. Even then, they must take drugs only by doctor’s orders, and never simply because the drugs are there.
The preventative, proactive approach to health includes habits of proper diet, exercise, monitoring stress, wearing clothes appropriate to the season, air conditioning during the summer and heat during the winter. These measures and lifestyles help insure that people will not get ill to the extent that they can have some reasonable control over life. Illness can and will come under many circumstances. Viruses, bacteria, many forms of sickness will emerge regardless of what we do to prevent illness.
When illness does come, we need to take a look at the best ways of curing what we have, and returning to a relative healthy state. Physicians may often examine patients and tell them than rest, proper diet, the drinking of fluids, and so on, will probably help bring the patients back to health. Not all diseases require medication. Additionally not all diseases require surgery. Even broken bones may not require cutting the patient. In time, many bones will heal correctly if their break is not in a physical position to cause deformity when healed.
Medicine, then, often seeks to prevent illness through a healthy lifestyle. When medical treatment is needed, pills are often preferable to surgery. Similar approaches are sought by ethicists for awe and analysis.
Wonder and analytic thinking are never mutually exclusive. Existence does not consist of wonder devoid of analysis, or analysis and rational-sensory approaches lacking awe. Most importantly, phenomenological ethics means that wonder and analysis are not to be merely the ends in themselves. We cannot say that because we are analyzing within the context of wonder, we are therefore being ethical, appropriately intellectual and properly in awe.
The states of awe and analysis are human states. They are irreducible to mechanical, physical, neurophysiological methods. Before we consider being in awe as a context for being analytical, we need to realize the need for being ethical, social, humane. Ethics is more than doing right and avoiding wrong in daily activity, business ventures, and the professions. Ethical behavior is basic to cognitive efforts to understand reality. The drug culture of the 1960s assumed that achieving a “high” was very important, but could not be reached until persons smoked pot or did hard drugs to alter the mind.
Similarly, people who believe in the rational approach to existence frequently misinterpret rationalism, logic, calculation, and speed. They too often assume that the logical or rational sequences are only sequences depending on speed. Their view is that speed is fundamental, and therefore the faster a sequence the better. From that view, the quicker we gather and understand greater numbers of variables or parts of the problem, the better our solution.
An unethical view of problem solving involves quick technical solutions to a given problem. A problem can be small or large. Instead of asking ourselves whether the problem is real or not, we frequently tell ourselves that speedy solutions are the answer. For example, take urban crime. We see robbers, burglars, car thieves. We hear of homicides and arsonists. Our typical approach is to assume that crime is crime, and its solution is a nonsocial, purely professional response from the police. The more police the better. The faster our calls are answered, and the quicker the police arrive at the scene, the better we feel that the problem of criminality is being solved.
This unethical view says that more crime we have, the more and faster police response we need. That view also suggests that the faster we get fingerprints and identify the wrongdoer, the more our society is progressing. Our emphasis is on speed, imprisonment or worse, technology, and other mechanical forms of reaction.
The ethical approach is fundamentally different. We would give opportunities to young people in order to attract them to productive lives outside crime. Families need strengthening, discipline must be practiced and taught, neighborhoods aware of wrongdoing, parental responsibility required. Our social institutions must be upheld. Churches, social groups, schools, governmental organizations, hospitals, and all businesses will need to work together. The police are there, but cannot be the only people combating crime. Technology ought be there, but only within the context of the social structures.
Society ought not ignore the social conditions and then go after the criminals arising as a result of deteriorating cultural situations. Culture is the not only contributor to crime. Some people simply may be born trouble makers. A weak social structure lets them do as they please until it is too late. Simply waiting for people to become criminals, then going after them, arresting, taking them to trail, and locking them up are the mechanical ways of recidivism.
The ethical approach attempt to return the criminal to society through rehabilitation when initial parenting or habilitation has failed. We cannot just let young people grow up doing as they please, and then throw the book at them when they go wrong. Society seems to like the mechanical approach to most things. In medicine and health, we increase emergency rooms. In law enforcement, we want more and faster police. Education becomes a mechanical method of learning from computers. Transportation develops into a way of speedier, aircraft, and automobiles even if we need to build bigger airports, and destroy ecology with more highways. Information becomes merely a commodity where we transmit data and receive it with greater efficiency. In more and areas, technology and rapidity of getting something or someone from here to there becomes paramount. Ethically, medicine must involve better health habits, law enforcement better homes, love, and discipline, learning a matter of student teacher interaction, travel a matter of bicycles and trains, and information an issue of understanding and social empathy.
Wonder and analysis are good when they are integrated. We cannot have just wonder, or only analysis. Yet, integrated or not, wonder must come from within and never as a result of drugs and electrical stimulation of the brain. Analysis must be within the social context and never merely a computerized battle toward solutions. Phenomenological ethics shows awe to be the view that things are fundamentally one, and culturally uplifting. Basic to all is our wonder that reality is a beautiful, awesome, non-problematic existence.
Existence is more than just a problem to be solved, a difficulty to be overcome. Existing ought mean appreciating life, people, God, culture, and all plants and animals. We cannot just look at the world as an ongoing defect to be repaired. Life may have evil in it, but is not essentially evil. It is a wondrous reality. This view is available to us not just through drugs, but our very natural feeling of awe. Again, good parenting and better social structure can contribute to or take away from this feeling.
Albert Einstein displayed ethics when he told his fellow scholars at Princeton to stop by an say hello from time to time. Most scholars were shocked. They felt that Princeton was a place for intellectual discourse instead of chit chat and normal conversation. They felt even more strongly that Einstein’s work was so critical that they did not wish to interfere in his studies with what they consider small talk or any conversation irrelevant to scientific work.
We think of Einstein as a scientist. He was clearly displaying what phenomenology calls intersubjectivity and wonder as the basis of any scientific work. Einstein believed that normal human beings, even those in intensive scholarly research, needed and should engage in the wonder of interpersonal, face to face community that this the social foundations of any verbal communications. Community is the basis of communications. We cannot communicate or convey information from person to person unless we first establish of acknowledge what phenomenology calls the “given” community or lived world.
In phenomenological ethics, we are first, last, and always in the community of people, in intersubjectivity, wonder, awe, or the non-cognitive. We are one with vegetation, with nature, with spiritual powers or religious dimensions. The term “people like us” is not to be taken as meaning individuals of our race, creed, color, or gender. It is to be interpreted as meaning that all human beings in the world are like each other. People are the same, regardless of race, creed, and so on.
Wonder means that all things are essentially related with each other. We do not first sense races, creeds, religions, and genders, and then arrive, step by step, to our humanity. The first thing we sense is that all individuals are alike. Races, religions, and so on are differentiations that we tend to make in distinguishing each other. Wonder makes it clear that whatever else we have as differences, human beings are, at bottom, the same.
Only within the context of fundamental awe of the unity of all things, do we then take apart or analyze people from each other, animals, nature, and so on. Analysis, done within awe, is benign. Analysis done outside the framework of wonder becomes mere taking apart of the essentially unified. In this sense, analysis becomes mere destruction.
Wonder and analysis in the ethical perspective comprise our intersubjective, sensory, rational unity. This occurs only when awe and analytic thinking occur within the context of the ethic or ethos: culture. Human beings are meant to awe that they are in the unified world of people, animals, vegetation and nature. Nothing is or ought be totally objectified. We are meant also to differentiate or analyze carefully in order to understand and intellectually cope with the existing world. Within awe, we objectify in order to develop an intellectual stance about why things are as they are.
Intersubjectivity and objectivity go hand in hand. Intersubjectivity or wonder devoid of objectivity becomes dangerously anti-technology. Objectivity alone becomes anti-human. Ethics tells us that this integration is complete when we appreciate intersubjectivity through normal human activity and not through drugs. We need also appreciate objectivity through normal intellectual activity and never through seeing speed, technology, or quantification as an end in itself.
The awe of our being together as a basis for any technique in analyzing that intersubjectivity can be seen MIT’s OpenCourseWare. Classroom learning with face to face interaction is fundamental to any distance learning. Wonder occurs not through mechanical activity but the social interaction found in the classroom; analysis is then found not through sophisticated telecourses, but computers existing and operating in the service and context of face-to-face interaction.
Alfred North Whitehead (p. 232) says that philosophy begins in wonder, and that wonder continues after philosophers have analyzed reality. Judith Boss says ethics begins in wonder. Philosophy can say that wonder and analysis begin with ethics, and that ethics continues as the context or orientation for analysis and wonder, and all activity.
A key model that represents the way to tie phenomenological ethics to the world is by examining ethics, philosophy, and engineering. Scholars in the field of ethics would say that their field provides basic ideas unifying engineering and philosophy. Those thinkers who are ethicists would indicate that engineering and philosophy share a common ground in ethics. Engineering and philosophy are specific manifestation of ethics. The ethicist’s position sees engineering and philosophy as fields where human beings and values orient technology, objectivity, reason, and logic.
Ethicists (Kazanjian, 1998, Chapter 2) would view ethics as unifying engineering and philosophy. Scholars in ethics would view their field as underlying the humanistic thinking in philosophy, and the scientific views of engineering. Those who study ethics would see ethical ideas as necessary in courses in virtually all disciplines and professions. These scholars see ethics as an interdisciplinary foundation to the arts and sciences. For ethicists, business ethics, legal ethics, medical and biomedical ethics, engineering ethics, are all integral parts of business, law, medicine, and the other disciplines. Those who are ethics scholars would say business ought engage in ethical instead of unethical practices. These ethicists would also see lawyers, physicians, biomedical researchers, engineers, and others as competent when their curriculum teaches them values and morals as well as technical expertise. Ethicists would say that values and morals orient technique. The ethical perspective sees the mechanics of a given field as ethically oriented. Ethics scholars would view any disciplinarian as a professional concerned with human beings instead of merely a cognitive or technical, non-ethical expert. Scholars from the field of ethics see their work as interdisciplinarity, among their tasks being the disclosure of the ethical basis of engineering and philosophy. As such, ethicists see their discipline as basic to liberal arts and sciences, and interdisciplinarity at any level.
Human factors engineering, also known as ergonomics or ergonomic engineering, is that kind of engineering which designs physical environments including machines and processes to match human limits and abilities, and train people to use those environments (Chapanis, p.534; Kantowicz and Sorkin, p. 20). These engineers work with mathematics, physics, chemistry, and often computers. Beyond these scientific and technical fields, ergonomics engineers deal with human beings. These engineers are concerned not only with how to design an environment, but how to design it to be safe for the user.
The ergonomics position sees safety as meaning that engineers ought design the environments to be user friendly and ought avoid both user unfriendly and user too friendly designs (Adams, p. 256). A design that is user unfriendly ignores the user. To be user unfriendly means is a design whereby the machine or process is dangerous or offensive for the user. The other design is user too friendly, whereby the machine or process is so safe as to be rendered unfunctional. Designing something as user friendly means that users are able to work with an environment which takes into account the users’ limits and abilities. Such limits and abilities mean people have arms, legs, eyes, ears, and torsos with certain anatomic and sensory measurements. Arms bend in certain ways and are of certain lengths. The same with legs. Ears hear best at certain sound levels. We see best at certain distances.
Ergonomics is saying that human beings see, hear, and move within certain physical parameters. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on. Any machine or process ought be designed such that it allows the user to use it comfortably, without undue stress or tension. Designing user friendly machines or processes is right. Designing an environment that forces people to merely sense or move is wrong. At the other extreme, designing an environment so safe that users need not make any effort to learn or use it is also wrong. The system could become nonfunctional.
The typical human factors engineering text looks like a combination engineering, psychology, and biology book. Ergonomics engineers say that any physical environment is as much social and psychological as it is mathematical, physical, or chemical. No user friendly design is totally reducible to the sum of nuts and bolts. Human factors argues that objects and people comprise an interface: both are interrelated to each other. Machines/processes and human beings ought not be seen as mutually exclusive, but inherently human-oriented. Al Gini (p. 3) argues that work is vital to our identity, but it must be a humanizing career and never just meaningless, dehumanizing sum of tasks.
Human factors also rejects overemphasizing the user. If machines/processes are to take into account the user’s abilities and limits, they are not to simply make things so safe and user-friendly that the machine/procedure becomes unfunctional or unable to perform its technical task.
Phenomenology is the philosophical movement somewhere between existentialism and logical positivism. Existentialists would see human beings or any aspect of reality almost totally irreducible to numbers or rational explanation, while the logical positivist position would view people and any reality as totally reducible to number and reason. The existential position views our social and cultural embodiment or existence is almost completely irreducible to number and reason, whereas logical positivism and linguistic analysis see our existence as basically, perhaps totally, rational and numeric. Brentano is considered the founder of phenomenology. He (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8) initiated the idea of intentionality. Intentionality means that consciousness or embodiment inherently relates to objects. Consciousness is consciousness of objects. Brentano attempted to overcome the logical positivist notion that objects and sensation are real, and consciousness is totally reducible to objectivity.
Brentano would see the thinking mind and the body mutually interrelated . He believed Cartesian dualism is wrong in stating that thinking and the body are two different entities. In speaking about the mind-body unity, Brentano set the stage for Husserl to develop phenomenology. Brentano spoke of the mind-body continuum and rejected total objectivity. Thinking is continuous or interrelated with the body. But Husserl more fully developed the continuum and rejecting two extremes: thinking alone or objectivism, and mere embodiment or subjectivism.
Edmund Husserl moved beyond Brentano (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8). Husserl sees a development of the mind-body continuum. Objectivity or mind is never value-free or disembodied, according to Husserl. All objectivity is value-laden or occurs as worldly, social, cultural. This view contrasts with the logical positivist notion that objectivity is the sole reality, and value-free.
Husserl’s position would say objectivity ought be seen as reflecting or matching subjectivity or values. From the perspective of phenomenology, we must consider all phenomena as real that appear to consciousness or our thoughts. Where logical positivists and linguistic analysts, and all emotional terms such as God as poetry and not cognitively meaningful, phenomenologists believe all objectivity reflects subjectivity, culture, values, and ethics.
The phenomenological position sees the mind-body issue in the manner that people ought look at physical environments as continuous with subjectivity, and emotions and noncognitive ideas as the social milieu generating the meaning of physical environments. Phenomenologically, objects, cognition, and cultural artifacts are real: products of human or subjective intentions. Mathematics, physics, chemistry, computers, and all the arts and sciences must be seen as part of life. But these cognitive realities emerge from a social, subjective realm and are not to be divorced from human experience. Cognition is never reducible to numbers, symbols, sense perception, and other non-emotive reality. Words reflect human experiences as a whole.
The position of phenomenology is that objectivity to be value-laden and ought avoid two extremes. One extreme is value-free cognition. This is cognition whereby cognition or any object is seen as free of any emotive or cultural values or spirituality. The other extreme means extreme existentialism that rejects any reducibility. Here, science, technology and any cognitive effort is considered almost anti-human. Phenomenology sees cognition and physical environments as things that take into account our values and any other noncognitive being. People have cognitive and analytical abilities and ought use them in certain ways. Knowing is not a simple matter of sense perception and analysis. The blanket denial of the reality of noncognitive ideas such as God and values suggests too simplistic a means of getting at reality.
Husserl also rejects subjectivism or solipsism. In saying that everything appearing to consciousness is real, critics argues that he was dangerous near, if not in fact, advocating solipsism. However, Husserl reject both logical positivism’s cold objectivism, which says people are objects and values unreal, and extreme existentialism and subjectivism’s solipsism, which maintains that the self is the only reality.
Phenomenology: Alfred Schutz (p. 140) comes from the perspective of applied phenomenology. Specifically, his viewpoint is sociology. He considers sociology as the study of “lived history,” or human institutions within which we find chronological or day to day history. He points out that human beings see, hear, and move within value parameters. Social structures comprise “lived history,” and are the context within which “chronological history” makes sense. Schutz ideas are similar to those of Kenneth Boulding. Boulding, while not technically a phenomenologist, notes that perception and action occur within our images of wholes, and never as the sensing of raw data or merely mechanical anatomic movement. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on.
In phenomenology, consciousness intends or is consciousness of objects, thus revealing a subject-object continuum. Objectivity, perception and movement, in turn, are colored by our values and lived world. Objectivity is continuous with subjectivity. Subjectivity is never the reality of just one person, but intersubjective or social. Thus, phenomenology rejects the existential notion of extreme individuality or the virtually solipsistic ego.
Reality, in phenomenology, is the subject-object continuum or duality. Phenomenologists say we ought avoid Cartesian dualism of the mutually exclusive mind and body. Consciousness is always of the object, and the object is always embodied. Ricoeur (p. 217) argues that phenomenology overcomes Cartesian dualism by reintroducing the excarnate mind into the carnate or body. His efforts enable phenomenology to resolve dualism, as well as the objectivism of positivism, and subjectivism of existentialism.
The mind-body continuum means that subjectivity and objectivity are both real, but comprise a systematic reality instead of parts being real in themselves. Human beings exist in a world of physical reality. We sense this as we consider the lived world of culture giving meaning to material objects and generating ideas. Subjectivity does not exist alone; it requires a object. Likewise, objectivity is not merely “out there;” it is always perceived within cultural, lived orientations.
The phenomenological view is that subjectivity is never devoid of objectivity, while the solipsistic position entails subjectivity as devoid of objectivity. We need the world, for people are part of physical reality. Interpreting objectivity as devoid of subjectivity is similarly wrong. It becomes a dehumanized objectivity disregarding human beings and consciousness. Along these lines and seemingly less serious a problem, dualism is just as wrong, according to phenomenology. Objects and subjects are irreducible to mutual distinct, inherently unrelated entities. We do not just take discreet objectivity and subjectivity and externally juxtapose them. We would be unable to bridge the subject-object gap if it were intrinsically discontinuous or unbridged.
Human factors engineering and phenomenology appear to be mutually distinct fields. One is engineering and quantitative, the other a philosophical movement rejecting total quantification. As such, engineering and phenomenology would seem to be irreconcilable disciplines: engineering being strictly hard culture, phenomenology fundamentally soft culture. But our brief statements above show something else.
A glance at human factors engineering and phenomenology reveals parallels. Human factors believes that all physical environment interface with people. Objects ought be designed as continuous with human operators. The entire system is a machine-person interface or continuum, instead of the machine being something totally objective and non-personal. Phenomenology says that mind or objectification is continuous with the social dimension. Phenomenologists speak of the mind-body continuum. Human factors could speak of the machine-user continuum, phenomenology of the mind-body interface. Human factors would be saying machines are continuous with the user, phenomenology would be indicating that the mind interrelates with the body. In ergonomics, seeing designs or actual machines means seeing the operator or subjectivity. In phenomenology, seeing words on paper must mean seeing human values and other intangibles. For human factors engineers, machines/processes ought be acknowledged as intrinsically continuous or interfacing with people’s physical, social, and psychological limits. In phenomenology, the written word ought be recognized as inherently continuous with values and other cultural themes underlying the empirical.
Human factors says machines/processes ought be user-friendly, and ought not be user-unfriendly. Phenomenology maintains that objectivity ought be seen as value-laden, and never value-free. By user friendly, human factors means buttons, numbers, levers, lights, and other physical apparatus the operations and reasons of which the user can learn relatively easily, and the use of which will not harm the person. The human being need not be the proverbial rocket scientist to understand these operations; training would not require the typical user to earn a Ph.D., or even take one course from MIT. The user also need not be made of steel or physically qualify for Navy SEAL commando work to use the environment. The user friendly environment is designed for the typical person’s intellectual and physical abilities. By value-laden, phenomenology means any word ultimately reflects human values. No word is or can be value-free, as the philosophical movements logical positivism and .linguistic analysis tend to maintain. Positivists and analytic thinkers argue that words such as God, love, and religion do not belong in intellectual discourse because they reflect values and emotion. Words such as chair, table, atom and other words are value-free and non-emotive. However, chair reflects the English language, can imply the electric chair, can mean a department head at a college or university, and appears to be nonsexist relative to the apparently sexist term chairman. Phenomenologists would maintain that no word is value-free, that every term is a sociology of that term. Every word emerges from and reflects the social and cultural framework that produces it.
A user unfriendly environment is totally objective, ignoring human limits and abilities and forcing people to mere push, pull, and perceive. Al Gini (p. 120) notes that work offering no hope and becoming unethical is wrong, and means roughly what ergonomics means by user unfriendly work. Value-free language would mean a totally objective set of words over which there is no debate. However, every math, computer, physics and other science book or piece of literature reflects a human author and the author’s perspective, slant, or view. Feminism and civil rights thinkers have shown that such books (any book) are value-laden whether we like it or not. Each is written by a white male, black male, Latino woman, or person of a particular religious, ethnic, or sexual orientation. An author lacking ethnic, gender, and similar human qualities is impossible.
Human factors could say machines ought be user-laden, while phenomenologists might indicate that objectivity ought be seen as subject-friendly. The human factors term “user” is synonymous with phenomenology’s term “subject.” User and subject mean the human being and the cultural context from which the human being emerges.
Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at human-made environments as reflecting culture and not as just cognitive, scientific, or merely objective fields of study and work. Moreover, both ergonomics and phenomenology consider the human as part of the object. Thus, ergonomics notes that we ought avoid simply catering to the person’s every desire and want, and phenomenology rejects solipsism’s view that the individual is the sole reality.
The previous section notes the technical parallels between ergonomics and phenomenology. Readers will see the term “ought” throughout the paragraphs.
Phenomenology and human factors have fundamental parallels, as indicated in the previous section. These are intellectual or technical similarities. They indicate that both see a unity of objects and people.
In doing so, they are ethical in the general sense. Both machines and rational thought emerge from the social context. Ergonomics argues that machines reflect the social and cultural milieu, and are not totally reducible to nuts and bolts. Phenomenologists (Stewart and Mikunas, p. 10) note that God, love, anger, desire, and other intangibles are real because they appear to consciousness. Secular phenomenologists consider nonreligious themes as real. Religious phenomenologists believe that theological and spiritual notions such as God are real.
Both human factors experts and phenomenologists deny that sensation is our only way of knowing and experiencing. Ergonomics engineers would say it is wrong or unethical to design a machine or process that has operators simply “look,” “hear,” or otherwise sense a control panel or other part of a machine. Phenomenologists argue that we would be outside the ethos or culture if we considers human behavior or reality as strictly sensory phenomena.
Engineers abide by and study professional ethics, and the Occupational Safety and Health Administration monitors dangerous in the workplace according to federal law. Phenomenology, however, does not become part of a professional ethics issue except in the case of the ethics of teaching. It may seem that in phenomenology, the subject-object discontinuity or dichotomy is only an academic rather than a technically ethical matter as in engineering. To say that objects are disconnected from and do not reflect subjectivity is not an ethical matter.
Phenomenology is concerned with ethics in the broad sense of ethos or culture. Totally reducing knowledge or reality to the empirical means excarnating or taking sensation out of the social realm comprising ethos. In applied phenomenology, reducing people to computerized forms, numbers, and related paper work may be seen an unethical or socially undesirable.
In acknowledging the social and psychological as well as physical side of people, both human factors engineering and phenomenology are rooted in the sociology of human-made products. A sociology of work suggests that people do not just “do.” They do and know within social, ethos, and thereby ethical constraints.
Both human factors engineering and phenomenology share the view that the person or subject is not alone. In ergonomics, machines ought take the user into account, but this does not mean that the design reflect everything about the user. Physical environments should not be so designed as to satisfy every want, desire, and whim of the operator. Operators need to be trained, and put forth effort to realize that the environment requires change on the users’ part. Additionally, operators are continuous with their surroundings. They are not Luddites, working or existing alone, without the use of physical environments. Phenomenology says that subjectivity is not the same as subjectivism. In subjectivism, the self is considered to be alone, devoid of objectivity.
Phenomenology seems not to fall into the same ethics category of including punishments for unethical behavior as does human factors engineering. However, the culture that supports a totally dehumanized attitude toward people, such as allowing computerization to go wild and reduce everyone to numbers in every instance, is manifesting an anti phenomenological view. The positivism attitude is that we merely know and are excarnated from feelings and emotions. No ethical ruling can be made against positivism as an intellectual movement Yet positivism reflects the culture view that we can and ought ignore feeling and other intangibles.
The lived world is phenomenology’s notion that people live, work, and play in a social context where not everything is totally reducible to numbers or is effable. Paul Ricouer tells us that Cartesian dualism is the effort to see the world and the mind as two different substances. The Cartesian world-view means that cognition is excarnate, discontinuous with the body. Positivism argues that the cognitive is all there exists. Ricoeur would want us to reintroduce the cognitive into the lived world, and to see cognition as incarnate or embodied.
Broadly speaking, the embodied viewpoint is the ethos-oriented viewpoint whereby cognitive activity emerges from the parameters of culture. People ought not just think. Basically, they never just think. Thus, no individual ought take the stand that we are simply thinking substances, whether this substance is somehow related to the body in dualistic terms, or stands by itself in positivistic notions. On the other hand, the cognitive is part of life. We ought not consider the reductive or cognitive as unwarranted, as in much existentialism. We certainly ought not take the view that the cognitive does not have a reality, that the self is alone, that each of us is isolated.
The ethical view posits a holistic perspective. Objectification ought be seen as interfacing or being continuous with the subject or intersubjectivity. Neither objectification devoid of subjectivity, nor subjectivity without objectivity, is the ought.
Human factors speaks of groups of users, not just a user, as reference for designing machines. Phenomenology speaks of intersubjectivity, not just of one subject, a reference for seeing the cognitive. Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at individuals as social, and their limits and abilities are pertaining to groups rather than to one or two people.
Phenomenological thinkers take the position that could be interpreted as the philosophical version of ergonomics. In ergonomics, we do not hear of linguistic analysis, logical positivism , or existentialism. Yet, Ergonomics reveals or deals with language in the broadest sense. When ergonomics speaks of people seeing, hearing, touching, pulling, they are using language. In saying that a person is something that simply sees, hears, etc., we are being positivistic and reducing the individual to an object. If we agree that users are human beings who see, hear, and otherwise sense and move within emotive, cultural, and physical contexts, we are then thinking or using language from a phenomenological viewpoint.
Traditional linguistic analysis tends to imply that philosophers in that vein are only thinkers and not fundamentally akin the engineering. An interdisciplinary attitude with a broad vision of language sees things differently. Language analysts in philosophy work with symbolic logic and not technical mathematics. Human factors engineers work with mathematics, but are suggesting that people are indeed at least partly physical, sensory, and material. Ergonomics may be called human factors, but it can also be called subjectivity factors: we need to take the subjective and cultural into account for engineering processes.
As a corollary, the phenomenological position would be that human factors considers users as not mere objects, but that any characteristic of the person that appears to consciousness is a valid reality. Thus, engineers who are only nuts and bolts people traditionally say we are only skin, neurons, senses, and bones. This is very positivistic language. Phenomenologically, users are also values, emotions, spirituality, and ethos as a whole. Human factors and phenomenology are looking at operators as fundamentally human beings with dignity and essentially irreducible qualities.
Logical positivists might argue that their members helped win World War II by cracking Hitler’s Enigma Machine code. This is true. On the more fundamental side, Hitler would not have risen to the powerful level that we allowed to him to do so had we been phenomenological and cultural. As he was rising and accumulating power, a cultural view would have told us to stop him in his tracks. Had we done so, war would have been unnecessary, the Normandy invasion would not have had to occur, and Hitlers codes would not have had time to develop to be used against us.
Ethics tells us that human factors and phenomenology speak the same language, though ergonomics is the trained engineer designing machines, and phenomenologists are philosophers trained in inquiry and argument instead of the design of physical environments. Physical environments are but a form of language. Ergonomics and phenomenology speak the same language in terms of acknowledging that objectivity is subject- or value-oriented. Al Gini speaks of work in terms of business ethics: work must be ethical and never unethical.
They speak the same language in saying that human beings are essential social instead of standing alone. The physical, written, and motor environments are never totally reducible to objects “out there.” But as reflections of human beings, these environments mirror “our” and not “my” world. Any human value represents the share world-view of numerous individuals comprising a group. Language ought never be either completely symbolic as in the totally logical methods of linguistic analysis, nor ought it be simply one person’s language which no other person can understand.
Two people, one a human factors engineer, the other a phenomenologist, can look at a machine or consider a procedure. These two individuals can communicate with each other if they understand their shared viewpoint. Both are coming from the ethical perspective. The engineer is saying that the numbers, words, and motions, which is to say, the language, of a system, ought reflect human beings in light of culture. A phenomenologist is saying that the writings in a human factors text ought reflect the social, psychological and related value-oriented words and meanings we see in culture.
Both the ergonomics and phenomenological philosopher would agree that the human values comprise a share enterprised that reflects the objective world continuous with the cultural milieu. No person is an island, no person is reducible to flesh and bones. Somewhere between extreme individualism and mere objectivism, the subject-object continuum or machine-person interface comprises a reality including the validity of external and internal worlds.
Ethics means objects are the externalizing of human ideas and the validity of the outside world. As ethos, we are neither extra-ethos nor merely ethos. The extra-ethos or extra-ethical suggests that people are sensations and motions; the merely ethos or ethical can mean we are only a commune, only a community doing little or nothing. Pushed to the extreme, the commune leads to the individual member as possibly believing that he or she stands alone.
In both human factors and phenomenology, language as our fundamental nature is seen as an object-subjective reality. Positivism sees language as symbols and sensory activity; traditional engineering involving merely nuts and bolts sees machines, and therefore language, as the sum total of physical parts. Human factors and phenomenology, rooted in ethos, consider language as a holistic reality whereby being serves to objectify itself through beings.
We typically think of ethics as a course of study, as in professional or philosophical ethics. In that way, ethics is no more fundamental than any other discipline. The above pages show that ethics is isomorphic or homological. Isomorphic is derived from iso meaning the same, and morphic meaning shape. Ethics is the same shape or principle that underlies ergonomics and phenomenology. Homological is derived from homo means same, and logic meaning word or structure. Ethics is the same structure from which ergonomics and phenomenology are derived. Learning ethics is basic to human factors engineering and phenomenology. As we consider ethics, we find it necessary to objectify within the parameters of culture, values, and perhaps spirituality. From the engineering perspective, ethics becomes a method of developing physical structures for human use. From the philosophical view, ethics can be interpreted as the intellectual inquiry into knowledge and reality.
As an isomorphic or homological root to human factors and phenomenology, ethics becomes the foundations for a liberal arts. Whatever we know and do, we are inherently facing the opportunity to know and do what is humane, and what is not. This opportunity means intellectual and engineering approaches are basically ethical. They emerge from culture or ethos. To deny values would be to reject our cultural foundations; to seek only values would be unrealistic.
Interdisciplinary research has gone in two directions. One is interdisciplinarity in the sense of team teaching and putting together courses and topics in some sort of seamless or minimally seamed fabric. Ethics plays an equity role here. It is one of the disciplines or ideas relevant to knowledge. The other direction (Kazanjian, 2002, p. 30) is more fundamental. This is the isomorphic direction. Isomorphic or homological ethics means that we must study ethics as a cultural, ethos framework within which we find the roots for all other professions.
Ethics as the homological root of numerous disciplines can thereby show us how to understand human factors engineering and phenomenology. Take ethics away from ergonomics and we essentially eliminate human factors engineering. The very term “human factor” implies that ethos is basic to engineering. Take ethics away from phenomenology and we basically have logical positivism. The subjective orientations of objectivity refer to the ethos from which emerges the objective.
Contemporary interest in professional ethics implies that ethical and non-ethical thinking and doing is something new. Indeed, our admission is new. The existence of the ethical perspective is as old as humanity. Mircea Eliade (p. 31) has taken pains to elucidate the validity of ethics in primitive cultures. In every society we have dos and don’ts. Without that view, any person in any culture will simply do or know, and the result could hurt that person or others.
Eliade’s point concerns comparative religion. Ancient societies did everything by repeating the anatomic gestures as performed in Primordial Time by the gods. Primordial Time is the time before the gods created the world and our idea of calendar time. No member of any society simply “did” something. Today, we imply that we merely do or know. Even Eliade suggests that contemporary society is totally secularized. Yet, Clifton Bryant’s research in the sociology of work (p. 1) catalogues the social and thus ethical directions of knowledge and technique.
Ethics, then, is not just another topic (Kazanjian, p. 3). It is the ongoing insight that ethos or culture provides us with the framework for survival and etiquette. Human factors and phenomenology are two specific manifestation of that insight.
- Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Social Dimensions of Work Englewood Cliffs, NJ.: Prentice-Hall; 1972
- Martin Buber I and Thou New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons; 1970.
- Jeremy Campbell The Improbable Machine New York: Simon and Schuster; 1989,
- Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion Cleveland: The World Publishing Company; 1958.
- Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
- Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary Evanston, IL: NorthwesternUniversity Press; 1968.
- David Stewart and Algis Mackunas Exploring Phenomenology Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
- G. Harry Stine The Hopeful Future New York: Macmillan;1983.
- Alfred North Whitehead Modes of Thought New York: The Macmillan Company; 1958.
- Jack A. Adams Human Factors Engineering. New York: Macmillan; 1989.
- Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion. Cleveland, OH: World Publishing; 1963.
- Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Sociology of Work. Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice Hall; 1972.
- Alphonse Chapanis, “Human Engineering,” in Operations Research and Systems Engineering ed. Charles D. Flagle, William H. Huggins, and Robert R. Roy, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press; 1960.
- Al Gini My Job, My Self. New York: Routledge; 2001.
- Edmund Husserl Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to PhenomenologicalPhilosophy The Netherlands: Kluwer; 1967..
- Barry H. Kantowicz and Robert D. Sorkin. Human Factors. New York: John Wiley; 1983.
- Michael M. Kazanjian Phenomenology and Education The Netherlands: Rodopi: 1998.
- Especially chapters one and two comparing ethics, human factors, and phenomenology.
- Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
- Algis Mikunas and David Stewart Exploring Phenomenology. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
- Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary. Evanston: Northwestern University Press; 1966.
- Alfred Schutz The Phenomenology of the Social World. Evanston: Northwestern University Press;1967.
Michael M. Kazanjian