Ethics and Self-Deception
Self-deception has captured the interest of philosophers, psychologists, and other students of human nature. Philosophers of mind and action have worked towards developing an account of self-deception and, in so doing, an explanation of its possibility. They have asked questions concerning the origin and structure of self-deception: How is self-deception possible? Do self-deceivers hold contradictory beliefs? And do they intentionally bring about their self-deception? While these questions have received a great deal of attention from philosophers, they certainly do not exhaust the topic of its conceptual intrigue. Self-deception gives rise to numerous important ethical questions as well—questions concerning the moral status, autonomy, and well-being of the self-deceiver.
Many worries concerning self-deception stem from the self-deceiver’s distorted view of the world and of himself or herself. Some philosophers believe that the self-deceiver’s warped perception of things may enable or encourage him or her to act in immoral ways. Other philosophers, such as Immanuel Kant, fear that the “ill of untruthfulness” involved in cases of self-deception may spread throughout the self-deceiver’s life and interpersonal relationships. These concerns about truth and perception point to further questions regarding the autonomy of the self-deceiver. Can a self-deceiver be fully autonomous while lacking important information about the world? Is the possession of true beliefs a necessary condition for autonomous decisions and action? This article will consider these and other issues concerning the ethics of self-deception.
Table of Contents
- What Is Self-Deception?
- Conscience and Moral Reflection
- Truth and Credulity
- Autonomous Belief and Action
- References and Further Reading
There is a vast literature on the nature and possibility of self-deception. And given the state of the debate, it seems unlikely that philosophers will soon agree upon one account of self-deception. This may be due, in part, to the fact that we ordinarily use the term, “self-deception”, in a broad and flexible way. But it is also the case that our various experiences with self-deception shape our thoughts about the paradigmatic self-deceiver. We can view much of the work on the nature of self-deception as a response to its apparently paradoxical nature. If self-deception is structurally similar to interpersonal deception, then it would seem that the self-deceiver must A) intentionally bring about the self-deception, and B) hold a pair of contradictory beliefs. Theorists who accept this model claim that deception is, by definition, an intentional phenomenon; that is, one person cannot deceive another without intending to do so. They also maintain that deception always involves contradictory beliefs; that is, a deceiver believes that p and brings it about that the deceived believes that not-p. And since the self-deceiver plays the role of the deceiver, and the deceived, he must believe both that p and that not-p. Suppose, for example, that William is self-deceived about his talent as a writer and believes that he will be the world’s next Marcel Proust. If this is true, then William must hold contradictory beliefs regarding his talent; that is, he must believe both that he will be the world’s next Proust, and that he will not be the world’s next Proust. Moreover, as per condition A, it must be the case that he intentionally brings it about that he holds the former (desirable) belief. But it not obvious that a single person can satisfy both of these conditions. Each of these conditions generates a “puzzle” or “paradox” when applied to cases of self-deception. Condition A, which gives rise to the “dynamic” puzzle, is problematic because it seems unlikely that a person could deceive himself while being fully aware of his intention to do so; for awareness of the self-deceptive intention would interfere with the success of his project (Mele 2001, p. 8). And condition B, which gives rise to the “static” puzzle (pp. 6-7), would be difficult to satisfy because it is often thought that believing that p rules out believing that not-p as well (see Goldstick 1989). Even if one thinks that it is possible for a person to hold contradictory beliefs, one might still be reluctant to accept that this can happen when the beliefs in question are obvious contradictories, as they are thought to be in cases of self-deception. Indeed, theorists who accept this model generally maintain that it is the very recognition that p that motivates a person to produce in himself the belief that not-p. What then should we conclude about the nature and possibility of self-deception?
Some philosophers respond to these puzzles by denying that strict or literal self-deception is possible (see Haight 1980). Other philosophers, such as Donald Davidson (1986, 1998) and David Pears (1984, 1985), have developed sophisticated accounts of self-deception that embrace conditions A and B, but avoid—or so they claim—the two corresponding puzzles. Both Davidson and Pears have introduced divisions in the mind of the self-deceiver in order to keep incompatible mental states apart, and thus preserve internal coherence. Pears, at times, seems to be willing to attribute agency (at least in some incipient form) to a part or sub-system that results from such divisions (see Pears 1984). But Davidson firmly denies that these divisions result in there being multiple agents, or “autonomous territories”, in the mind of the self-deceiver. Instead, he asks us to suppose that the self-deceiver’s mind is “not wholly integrated,” and is, or resembles, “a brain suffering from a perhaps self-inflicted lobotomy” (1998, p. 8). On Davidson’s model, it is possible for a self-deceiver to hold contradictory beliefs as long as the two beliefs are held apart from each other. We need to distinguish between “believing contradictory propositions and believing a contradiction, between believing that p and believing that not-p on the one hand, and believing that [p and not-p] on the other” (p. 5). If incompatible beliefs can be held apart in the human mind, then we can coherently describe cases of self-deception that satisfy conditions A and B.
Alfred Mele has rejected the two conditions for literal self-deception, and has developed a “deflationary” account of self-deception (Mele 2001, p. 4). His account of self-deception is based heavily upon empirical research regarding hypothesis testing and biased thinking and believing. He tries to show that ordinary cases of self-deception can be explained by looking at the biasing effect that our desires and emotions have upon our beliefs (pp. 25-49). A person’s desiring that p can make it easier for her to believe that p by influencing the way that he or she gathers and interprets evidence relevant to the truth of p. The ordinary self-deceiver does not do anything intentionally to bring it about that he is self-deceived. Rather, his motivational economy can cause her to be self-deceived automatically, as it were, and without her intervention. One of the ways that a person’s desires can shape the way that she forms beliefs is through what Mele calls “positive misinterpretation”. Positive misinterpretation occurs when one’s desiring that p leads him “to interpret as supporting p data that we would easily recognize to count against p in the desire’s absence” (p. 26). Mele illustrates how this can happen through his example of the unrequited love that a student, Sid, feels for his classmate, Roz. Sid is fond of Roz and wants it to be true that she feels the same way about him. Sid’s desire for Roz’s love may cause him to “interpret her refusing to date him and her reminding him that she has a steady boyfriend as an effort on her part to “play hard to get” in order to encourage Sid to continue to pursue her and prove that his love for her approximates hers for him” (p. 26). Positive misinterpretation is just one piece of Mele’s careful empirical study of the nature and aetiology of self-deception.
Annette Barnes (1997) and Ariela Lazar (1999) have also developed accounts of self-deception that reject conditions A and B. Lazar’s account emphasizes the influence that desires, emotions, and fantasy have upon the formation of our beliefs. Barnes examines the way that “anxious” desires affect what we believe, and cause us to become self-deceived. Barnes, unlike Mele, argues that the desires at work in cases of self-deception must be “anxious” ones. A person has an “anxious” desire that q when “the person (1) is uncertain whether q or not-q and (2) desires that q” (p. 39). For Barnes, self-deceptive beliefs are functional, and serve to reduce the self-deceiver’s anxiety (p. 76).
In dispensing with conditions A and B of self-deception, some theorists might worry that deflationary accounts do away with anything worthy of the name “self-deception”. On this view, what Mele et al succeed in describing is best understood as wishful thinking or a kind of motivated believing (see Bach 2002). They seem to fail to account for self-deception, which is a conceptually distinct phenomenon that is described by conditions A and B (or conditions closely resembling conditions A and B). José Luis Bermúdez (2000) and William J. Talbott (1995), who both defend “intentionalist” accounts of self-deception (that is, accounts that accept condition A but reject condition B), have individually argued that deflationary (and thus, “anti-intentionalist”) accounts cannot explain why self-deceivers are selective in their self-deception. Why is it that an individual can be self-deceived about his artistic talent, say, but not about the fidelity of his spouse? Bermúdez refers to this as the “selectivity problem” (p. 317). Mele is confident that his analysis and application of the “FTL model” for lay hypothesis testing (which combines the results of James Friedrich 1993; and Akiva Liberman, and Yaacov Trope 1996), can provide us with an answer to this question (Mele 2001, pp. 31-46). According to the FTL model, desires and corresponding “error costs” influence the way that we test for truth. When the cost of falsely believing that p is true is low, and the cost of falsely believing that p is false is high, it will take less evidence to convince one that p is true than it will to convince one that p is false (pp. 31-37). It follows from this analysis that individuals may test hypotheses differently due to variations in their motivational states (pp. 36-37). By way of example, Mele explains that
[f]or the parents who fervently hope that their son has been wrongly accused of treason, the cost of rejecting the true hypothesis that he is innocent (considerable emotional distress) may be much higher than the cost of accepting the false hypothesis that he is innocent. For their son’s staff of intelligence agents in the CIA, however, the cost of accepting the false hypothesis that he is innocent (considerable personal risk) may be much greater than the cost of rejecting the true hypothesis that he is innocent—even if they would like it to be true that he is innocent. (pp. 36-7)
On Mele’s view, we can make sense of the different responses that parents and CIA agents would have to the same hypothesis without introducing talk of intentions; for differences in motivation give rise to differences in error costs and, in turn, beliefs. Still, Mele’s critics may remain sceptical about the ability of FTL model to deal with the selectivity problem in its full generality. Can error costs alone determine when a person will, or will not, become self-deceived? Unimpressed by Mele’s treatment of the problem, Bermúdez insists that “[i]t is simply not the case that, whenever my motivational set is such as to lower the acceptance threshold of a particular hypothesis, I will end up self-deceivingly accepting the hypothesis” (p. 318). Clearly, there is still a great deal of disagreement concerning the intentionality of self-deception, and of motivationally biased belief more generally.
There are numerous intermediate, and alternative accounts, of self-deception in the literature. Jean-Paul Sartre is well known for his existential treatment of self-deception, or bad faith (mauvais fois), and the human condition that inspires it. The person who is guilty of bad faith bases his decisions and actions upon an “error”; he mistakenly denies his freedom and ability to invent himself (1948, pp. 50-15). Consider Sartre’s provocative and well-known description of a woman who halfheartedly, and in bad faith, “accepts” the advances of a certain male companion. Sartre tells us that the woman is aware of her companion’s romantic interest in her. However, she is at the same time undecided about her own feelings for him, and so neither accepts nor rejects his advances wholeheartedly. She enjoys the anxious uncertainty of the moment, and tries to maintain it through her ambivalent response to his attempted seduction of her (1956, p. 55). Suddenly, though, the woman’s companion reaches for her hand, and with this gesture “risks” forcing her to commit herself one way or another (p. 56):
To leave the hand there is to consent in herself flirt, to engage herself. To withdraw it is to break the troubled and unstable harmony which gives the hour its charm. The aim is to postpone the moment of decision as long as possible. We know what happens next; the young woman leaves her hand there, but she does not notice that she is leaving it. She does not notice because it happens by chance that she is at this moment all intellect. She draws her companion up to the most lofty regions of sentimental reflection; she speaks of Life, of her life, she shows herself in her essential aspect—a personality, a consciousness. And during this time the divorce of the body from the soul is accomplished; the hand rests inert between the warm hands of her companion—neither consenting nor resisting—a thing. (pp. 55-56)
Sartre charges the woman in this example with bad faith because she fails to acknowledge and take full responsibility for her situation and freedom. Instead of committing herself to one choice or the other (that is, flirting or not flirting), she attempts to avoid both choices through a deliberate but feigned separation of the mental and the physical.
Herbert Fingarette, influenced by Sartre’s existential approach, has developed a theory of self-deception that is couched in what he calls the “volition-action” family of terms. According to Fingarette, we can make progress towards understanding self-deception if we replace the old “cognitive-perception” terminology with his new “volition-action” family of terms (2000, p. 33). Whereas the cognitive-perception family of terms emphasizes belief and knowledge, the volition-action family of terms highlights the dynamic and semi-voluntary nature of consciousness. Crucial to Fingarette’s active or dynamic conception of consciousness is the idea that a person can become explicitly aware of something by “spelling it out” to himself. When a person does this, he directs his attention towards the thing in question and makes himself fully and explicitly conscious of it (p. 38). Fingarette describes the self-deceiver as a person who cannot (or will not) spell-out an “engagement” to himself (p. 46). He is unable, or unwilling, to do this because the engagement in question challenges his conception of himself. He cannot “avow” this threatening feature of himself or the world, and so actively prevents himself from doing so. Moreover, the success of his project demands that he avoid spelling-out that he is not spelling-out a particular engagement in the world. In this way, the self-deceiver adopts a strategy or policy that is “self-covering” (p. 47).
Fingarette offers a plausible and insightful account of the motivation behind typical cases of self-deception. But some may interpret his shift in terminology as an evasion of the central issues that need to be discussed. Fingarette describes the self-deceiver as one who adopts a policy that is self-covering. But how is the self-deceiver able to adhere to this policy without noticing, or even suspecting, that it is his policy? Will he not find himself in the grip of the dynamic puzzle of self-deception? And what, on Fingarette’s model, should we make of the self-deceiver’s doxastic state? Does the self-deceiver hold only desirable beliefs about himself and his engagement in the world? Or is he confused about what he believes because he is engaged in the world in a way that he cannot avow? Fingarette seems to think that his new way of framing the problem avoids these questions altogether. But those who are not immediately sympathetic to Fingarette’s shift in terminology may find his account lacking in detail and clarity on these “key” points.
Also of interest here is Ronald de Sousa’s treatment of self-deceptive emotions. de Sousa has considered the possibility that we can be self-deceived not only about our beliefs, but about our emotions as well. In explaining one source of self-deception, de Sousa examines the way that various social ideologies influence the emotions—or the quality of the emotions—that we experience (1987, p. 334). In explaining how self-deceptive emotions are possible, de Sousa looks at the way that stereotypes shape the emotions that we experience. For example, according to certain gender stereotypes,
[a]n angry man is a manly man, but an angry woman is a “fury” or a “bitch.” This is necessarily reflected in the quality of the emotion itself: a man will experience an episode of anger characteristically as indignation. A woman will feel it as something less moralistic, guilt-laden frustration, perhaps, or sadness. Insofar as the conception of gender stereotypes that underlies these difference is purely conventional mystification, the emotions that embody them are paradigms of self-deceptive ones. (p. 334)
de Sousa adds that we cannot account for the emotions in question on the basis of socialization, or external social forces alone. Individuals whose emotions embrace these stereotypes are not simply socialized; they are self-deceived. And they are self-deceived, according to de Sousa, because they have internalized these stereotypes, and have allowed them to affect the character of what they feel (p. 336). To this extent, they are complicit and deeply involved in the modeling of their own emotions. Fortunately, we have some hope of freeing ourselves from gender stereotypes and other social mythologies through what de Sousa describes as “consciousness-raising”. By engaging in a process of critical review and redescription, we can challenge our assumptions and our view of the situation that is contributing to our emotive response (pp. 337-338).
Now how a theorist approaches the ethics of self-deception will depend upon the view of self-deception that he accepts. As we begin to explore the ethical dimension of self-deception, it is important to keep in mind that there is no single account of self-deception that has acquired universal acceptance among philosophers. At times, these points of disagreement will have a profound impact upon the way that we evaluate self-deception. This will become particularly clear (in Section 6) when we consider whether or not a self-deceiver is ever responsible for his self-deception.
Self-deception is clearly a sin against Socrates’ maxim, “know thyself”. And many people find self-deception objectionable precisely because of the knowledge that it prevents a self-deceiver from achieving. As history has amply demonstrated, ignorance—no matter what its source—can lead to morally horrendous consequences. Aristotle, for instance, believed that temporary ignorance, a state akin to drunkenness, made it possible for the akrates to act against his best moral judgment (1999, 1147a, 10-20). Some scholars might interpret this ignorance as a convenient instance of self-deception that enables the akrates to succumb to temptation. One problem with this reading of Aristotle is that it is not explicitly supported by the relevant texts. But in addition to this, self-deception is generally thought to be a lasting, and not temporary, state. A fleeting spell of ignorance that surfaced and then quickly passed would probably not be best described as self-deception. If my moral judgment in support of vegetarianism is suddenly overcome by an intense craving for a grizzly piece of steak, I may be distracted and temporarily ignorant, but probably not self-deceived in my impaired state of mind. Sometimes, though, a person’s ignorance endures and shapes the way that he perceives himself and his situation. When this happens, we may have grounds for thinking that the person in question is self-deceived.
Bishop Joseph Butler regarded self-deception as a serious threat to morality, and treated it as a problem in its own right in his sermons on the topic. Butler was particularly concerned about the influence that self-deception has upon the conscience of an individual. Butler believed that the purpose of a human being’s conscience is to direct him in matters of right and wrong. A human being’s conscience is a “light within” that—when not darkened by self-deceit—guides a person’s moral deliberations and actions. According to Butler, self-deception interferes with the conscience’s ability to direct an individual’s moral thinking and action. And this, in turn, makes it possible for an individual to act in any number of malicious or wicked ways without having any awareness of his moral shortcomings (1958, p. 158). Butler warns that self-partiality, which is at the root of self-deception, “will carry a man almost any lengths of wickedness, in the way of oppression, hard usage of others, and even to plain injustice; without his having, from what appears, any real sense at all of it” (p. 156). Butler’s condemnation of self-deception is severe, in part, because of the gravity of the consequences that self-deception can bring about. The self-deceiver’s “ignorance” makes it possible for him to act in ways that he would not choose to, were he aware of his true motives or actions. And thus, self-deception is wrong because the acts that it makes possible are wrong or morally unacceptable. Morality demands that we reason and act in response to an accurate view of the world. Self-deception, in obscuring our view, destroys morality and corrupts “the whole moral character in its principle” (p. 158).
Adam Smith shared Butler’s concern about the “blinding” effect of self-deception, and its ability to interfere with our moral judgment. According to Smith, it is our capacity for self-deception that allows us to think well of ourselves, and to cast our gaze away from a less than perfect moral history (2000, p. 222). In this way, we can preserve a desirable but inaccurate conception of our character. Smith observes that
[i]t is so disagreeable to think ill of ourselves, that we often purposely turn away our view from those circumstances which might render that judgment unfavourable. He is a bold surgeon, they say, whose hand does not tremble when he performs an operation upon his own person; and he is often equally bold who does not hesitate to pull off the mysterious veil of self-delusion which covers from his view the deformities of his own conduct. (pp. 222-223)
Self-deception, for Smith, is an impediment to self-knowledge and moral understanding. If a person does not clearly perceive his character, and its manifestations in action, then he is less able to act morally, and to make amends for previous acts of injustice. Self-deception can also interfere with a person’s ability to progress morally, and to reform or refine his character. Both Butler and Smith recognized that even the most patient and careful moral reflection is wholly useless when it responds to a view of things that has been distorted by self-deception.
One worry that we might have about this evaluation of self-deception concerns its apparent neglect of instances of self-deception that do not concern moral issues. We are not always self-deceived about our immoral actions or motives. It is quite common for people to be self-deceived about their intelligence, physical appearance, artistic talent, and other personal attributes or abilities. And it is arguably the case that self-deception about these qualities often gives rise to positive or desirable consequences; that is, it may bring it about that the individuals in question are healthier, happier, and more productive in their lives than they otherwise would be (see Brown and Dutton 1995, and Taylor 1989). Mike Martin, in discussing Butler’s treatment of self-deception, has voiced this concern. On Martin’s view, self-deception does not always lead to negative or immoral consequences, but when it does we should be critical of it. His “Derivative-Wrong Principle” captures this insight: “Self-deception often leads to, threatens to lead to, or supports immorality, and when it does it is wrong in proportion to the immorality involved” (1986, p. 39). For Martin, self-deception is not always wrong in virtue of its consequences. But in evaluating the wrongfulness of any particular case of self-deception, we need to consider its consequences and the actions that it makes possible.
A second worry that we might have with the Butler-Smith evaluation of self-deception stems from the fact that we are not always self-deceived in the positive direction. We are often self-deceived in thinking that the world, or some part of it, is worse than it really is. Donald Davidson, in commenting on such cases, claims that if pessimists are individuals who believe that the world is worse than it really is, then they may all be self-deceived (1986, p. 87). But if pessimists have a more realistic view of things than the rest of us, as the research on depressive realism suggests, then we may want to resist this conclusion (see Dobson and Franche 1989). It may turn out to be the case that pessimists are the only ones who are not deeply mistaken about the world and their role in it. These possibilities certainly need to be considered when weighing the advantages and disadvantages of habitual or episodic self-deception.
Thus far we have examined the way that self-deception can interfere with a person’s moral reasoning. But what should we say about the effect that self-deception has upon our general reasoning, that is, our reasoning about non-moral issues? Might we have reason to extend Butler’s concern about self-deception to other forms of reasoning? W. K. Clifford, in “The Ethics of Belief,” (1886) provided an affirmative answer to this question, and argued very passionately against any form of self-deception. Clifford believed that we have a moral duty to form our beliefs in response to all of the available evidence. It is therefore wrong on his view to believe something because it is desirable, comfortable, or convenient. Clifford supports this position by way of example. He asks his reader to imagine a shipowner who carelessly sends a dilapidated ship to sail. The shipowner is fully aware of the ship’s condition, but deliberately stifles his doubts, and brings himself to believe the opposite. As a result of his negligence, the ship, along with all of the passengers upon it, sinks in mid-ocean (p. 79). According to Clifford, the shipowner should be held responsible for the deaths of the passengers; for, as Clifford puts it, “he had no right to believe on such evidence as was before him” (p. 70). Clifford adds that even if the ship had successfully made its way to shore, the shipowner’s moral status would be the same, “he would only have been not found out” (p. 71). Believing upon insufficient evidence is always morally wrong, regardless of the consequences. And given that self-deception involves believing upon insufficient evidence, the same can be said of it: it is always morally wrong, regardless of its consequences.
Clifford was especially concerned about the effect that believing based upon insufficient evidence would have upon an individual’s (and society’s) ability to test for truth. He thought that believing based upon insufficient evidence would make human beings credulous, or ready to believe. A lack of reverence for the truth not only spreads throughout the life of a single individual—from moment to moment, as it were—it also spreads from one individual to another. In this way, humanity may find itself surrounded by a thick cloud of falsity and illusion (pp. 76-77). Philosophers have been critical of Clifford’s ethics of belief for a variety of reasons. Some have argued that there can be no ethics of belief because beliefs, unlike actions, are not under our direct control (see Price 1954), and others have worried that Clifford’s requirements for belief are mistaken or unduly strict (see James 1999, and van Inwagen 1996). In discussing Clifford’s specific thoughts on self-deception, Mike Martin has argued, contra Clifford, that not all cases of self-deception (or believing on insufficient evidence) lead to credulity, or a general disregard for truth. Indeed, many cases of self-deception seem to be isolated and relatively harmless (1986, pp. 39-41).
Immanuel Kant also expressed grave concern about the corrosive effect that self-deception has upon belief and our ability to test for truth. He refers to falsity as “a rotten spot,” and warns that “the ill of untruthfulness” has a tendency to spread from one individual to another (1996, p. 183). Although a person may deceive himself or another for what seems to be a good cause, all deception should be avoided because it is “a crime of a human being against his own person” (p. 183). When a person deceives himself or another he uses himself as a mere means, or “speaking machine” (p. 183). In so doing, he fails to use his ability to speak for its natural purpose, that is, the communication of truth (pp. 183-184). Kant’s categorical treatment of all forms of deception is the outgrowth of his particular version of deontologism. And his especially harsh criticisms of internal lies has its source in his views about the moral importance of acting from duty. For Kant, a person only acts morally when he acts from duty, or out of respect for the moral law. While we can never be certain that we have succeeded in acting from duty, we have an obligation to strive for this goal (p. 191). Through self-cognition, a person can examine his motives and possibly become aware of internal threats to acting morally. (Given that Kant believed that our introspection is fallible, the qualification is in order here). When he succeeds in his introspection, he will be in a better position to act morally from respect for the moral law. Self-deception is particularly problematic for Kant because it allows a person to disguise his motives and act under the guise of moral purity. A self-deceiver can comfort himself with his actions and with what he sees in the external world, and thus avoid the morally crucial thoughts and questions about the motives for these actions.
Kant’s limited remarks on self-deception are in many ways peculiar to his moral philosophy. But there is still a great deal that we can take away from his insights. Whether or not one is a Kantian, self-understanding seems to be something that is of value to most people, and to most (if not all) moral theories. Anyone who engages in moral reasoning will have to be concerned, if not suspicious, about the accuracy of the beliefs or motives that guide the process. Even consequentialists must concern themselves with the possibility that, as a result of self-deception, they may miscalculate the foreseeable consequences of their actions. John Stuart Mill (1910), for example, admitted that self-deception might interfere with a person’s ability to correctly apply the utilitarian standard of morality. However, he believed that self-deception, and the corresponding misapplication of a moral standard, presents a problem for all moral theories. In responding to this concern, Mill asks:
But is utility the only creed which is able to furnish us with excuses for evil doing, and means of cheating our own conscience? They are afforded in abundance by all doctrines which recognise as a fact in morals the existence of conflicting considerations; which all doctrines do, that have been believed by sane persons. It is not the fault of any creed, but of the complicated nature of human affairs, that rules of conduct cannot be so framed as to require no exceptions, and that hardly any kind of action can safely be laid down as either always obligatory or always condemnable. There is no ethical creed which does not temper the rigidity of its laws, by giving a certain latitude, under the moral responsibility of the agent, for accommodation to peculiarities of circumstances; and under every creed, at the opening thus made, self-deception and dishonest casuistry get in. (p. 23)
As Mill observes here, self-deception can interfere with the application of any standard of morality. For any standard that exists, no matter how rigid or precise, there is always the possibility that it will be misapplied as a result of self-deception. What we can conclude from this, according to Mill, is that the cause of the misapplication is not the standard itself, but the complexity of human affairs and our great capacity for self-deception.
As we have seen thus far, self-deception (for better or worse) can interfere with an individual’s reasoning in a number of ways. Kant, Butler, and (to a lesser extent) Mill are particularly worried about the influence that self-deception can have upon our moral reasoning. Some philosophers have suggested that by interfering with our reasoning, self-deception can decrease a person’s autonomy, where autonomy is understood (roughly) as rational self-governance. Marcia Baron considers the possibility that self-deception diminishes a person’s autonomy by causing him to “operate with inadequate information,” or a “warped view of the circumstances” (1988, p. 436). When one is self-deceived about important matters, one may suffer from a serious loss of control. The ability to make an autonomous decision requires that a person have a certain amount of information regarding the world and available options in it. If I lack information about the world, then I may be unable to develop and act on a plan that is appropriate to it (that is, the world), or to some feature of it. It has been argued, however, that a person who is self-deceived may not always be less autonomous on-balance than he otherwise would be. As Julie Kirsch has pointed out in evaluating the effect of self-deception upon a person’s autonomy, we may need to be sensitive to the self-deceiver’s values, and to the history of the case in question. Was the self-deception intentionally brought about? Did it serve to reduce a crippling spell of anxiety? And does the self-deceiver care more about his own self-esteem or “happiness” than about truth, or the “real world”? If a person engages in deliberate self-deception with his own interest in view, we may interpret his action as an expression of autonomy, and not necessarily as an impediment to it (2005, pp. 417-426). After all, while many of us do value truth over comfort, this preference seems not to be one that is shared by all individuals. Indeed, even truth-loving, tough-minded philosophers and scientists would probably rather be without certain pieces of information, such as the unsavory details surrounding their certain and inevitable deaths.
In examining the connection between self-deception and autonomy, we may also want to consider the extent or frequency of the self-deception. Clifford, as we have seen, believed that habitual self-deception could make a person credulous. Might it also (or in so doing) make him less autonomous? Baron warns that it might, and takes this to be one of the most troubling consequences of self-deception. She claims that self-deception gradually undermines a person’s agency by corroding his “belief-forming processes” (1988, p. 438). This may be true of habitual self-deception, but as we have already seen, not all self-deception is habitual. Self-deception can be isolated or limited to particular areas of concern. Baron’s analysis might seem more plausible, however, if we are willing to accept that self-deception is not always easy to control or oversee. Some theorists of self-deception suggest that the easiest or most effective way to deceive yourself is to do so with your metaphorical “eyes” closed, and to forfeit all control. Self-deception, on such a model, would be difficult (or impossible) to navigate because it relies upon processes that are necessarily blind and independent. As Amelie Rorty observes,
[c]omplex psychological activities best function at a precritical and prereflective automatic or autonomic level. The utility of many of our presumptively self-deceptive responses—like those moved by fear and trust, for example—depends on their being relatively undiscriminating, operating at a deeply entrenched habitual precritical level. (1996, p. 85)
If the success of a strategy depends upon its not being monitored, then the strategy and its reach may be difficult to control. In this way, a single case of self-deception may soon lead to others. This is why Rorty concludes that “[t]he danger of self-deception lies not so much in the irrationality of the occasion, but in the ramified consequences of the habits it develops, its obduracy, and its tendency to generalize” (p. 85). A single case of self-deception may seem prima facie to be innocuous and under one’s control. However, a look at its less immediate or long-term consequences may cause us to reject this initial evaluation as shortsighted and incomplete. In this way, self-deception may be analogous to smoking cigarettes or drinking alcohol. There may be nothing disastrous about smoking a cigarette or enjoying the occasional gin and tonic among friends. However, if one develops—or even begins to develop—the habit of smoking or drinking gin and tonics, then one might very well be on the way to developing an autonomy debilitating addiction.
Whether or to what extent we should hold a self-deceiver responsible for his self-deception will depend upon the view of self-deception that we accept. As indicated in Sections 1 and 2, there is a great deal of disagreement about whether self-deception is (sometimes or always) intentional. Theorists who think that self-deception is intentional will have grounds for holding self-deceivers responsible for their self-deception. If becoming self-deceived is an action, or something that one does, then a self-deceiver may be responsible for bringing this about (that is, he will be just as responsible for bringing this about as he would be anything else). To be sure, if the theorist does not think that we are responsible for anything that we do (say, because he is a hard determinist), then he will of course think the same of the self-deceiver. Matters become more complicated when the theorist in question (like Davidson 1986, 1998, and Pears 1984) also views the self-deceiver as divided, or composed of parts or sub-agents. How, then, should he evaluate the self-deceiver? Should he hold “part” of the self-deceiver, that is, the deceiving “part”, responsible? And view the other “part”, that is, the deceived, as the passive and helpless victim of the former?
Those who do not think that self-deception is intentional, may be reluctant to hold the self-deceiver responsible for his self-deception. Such theorists may view self-deception as something that happens to the self-deceiver; for, the self-deceiver does not actively do anything in order to bring it about that he is self-deceived. Still, even on this view, we might think that the self-deceiver has some degree of control over what happens to him. Although self-deception is not something that a person does, or actively brings about, it is something that he can guard against and try to avoid. If this is true, then we might be justified in holding the self-deceiver responsible for the negligence that contributed to his state of mind. But there are some who will be reluctant to attribute even this weak form of responsibility to the self-deceiver. Neil Levy, who describes self-deception as “a kind of mistake,” argues that we need to “drop the presumption” that self-deceivers are responsible for their states of mind (2004, p. 310). Levy maintains that we are often unable to prevent ourselves from becoming self-deceived because we fail to recognize that we might be at risk. In many cases, our failure to perceive warning signs will itself be a function of our motivationally biased states of mind. If I have doubts about a particular belief that I hold, then I might have reason to exercise a form of control against my thoughtless acceptance of it. However, if I am sufficiently deluded about the truth of my belief due to the force of my desires, then I may hold it without even a hint of suspicion or doubt. And thus, there will be nothing to prompt me to implement a strategy of self-control. If this is true, then it would be inappropriate for others to hold me responsible for my self-deception (pp. 305-310).
The philosophers that we have considered all express serious concerns about the effects that self-deception can have upon our moral lives. Butler, Smith, Clifford, and Kant have shown that our moral reasoning is only effective when it responds to the actual state of the world. And even when our moral reasoning is effective, self-deception enables us to hide our true motivation from ourselves, or that which prompts and guides our reasoning in the first place. But, as we have seen, self-deception is not limited to our desires, motives, and moral deliberations: we can deceive ourselves about the state of the world, the people in it, and even our own personality and bodily flaws. Self-deception, when practiced regularly, can serve as a kind of global anesthetic that immunizes us against the maladies of life. Most philosophers accept that severe and widespread self-deception is harmful and can lead to disastrous results. There is, however, comparatively less agreement about the wrongfulness of mild and localized cases of self-deception that simply boost a person’s ego, or add a touch of romance to an otherwise cold and loveless world. While some philosophers view such cases as harmless and even necessary, others view them as dangerous and destructive to human well-being and autonomy.
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Last updated: June 14, 2007 | Originally published: June/14/2007