As a species of naturalized epistemology, ethnoepistemology treats all human epistemological activities as fully natural phenomena to be described, understood, and evaluated from a broadly anthropological and fully a posteriori perspective. In this spirit it examines the entire gamut of human epistemological activities ranging from those of ordinary folk and cognitive specialists (for example, diviners, shamans, priests, magicians, and scientists) to those of epistemologists themselves. Ethnoepistemology includes both domestic and non-domestic epistemological practices, and accordingly regards Western epistemological practices as simply one among many alternative, contingent epistemological projects advanced by and hence available to human beings. In this manner it aims to decenter and provincialize the definitions, aims, assumptions, methods, problems, and claims of Western epistemology.
Ethnoepistemology rejects what it considers to be the double standard embraced by most Western epistemology that exempts itself from the same kind of anthropological scrutiny that the epistemologies of non-Western cultures receive at the hands of Western ethnographers. And it also rejects the double standard that characterizes the epistemological activities of non-Western thinkers as mere ethnoepistemologies while characterizing the epistemological activities of Western thinkers as epistemology proper. Ethnoepistemologists argue that there is a dualism that is commonly expressed by the assertion that thinkers in other cultures practice mere “ethnoepistemology” or “ethnophilosophy.” What others do is thereby marginalized as mere anthropological curiosity, and those practicing it are deemed unqualified to participate in the West’s “genuinely” philosophical conversation. Indeed, the customary use of the terms “ethnophilosophy” and “ethnoepistemology” by Western philosophers is objectionable to ethnoepistemologists because it assumes that Western philosophy is the benchmark by which all other cultures’ philosophies and reflective activities are to be understood and measured, and that Western philosophy is philosophy simpliciter rather than one among many ethnophilosophies. The more broadly ecumenical and non-ethnocentric use of the term “ethnoepistemology” avoids this shortcoming since it includes all epistemological activities, be they African, East Asian, European, Native American, and so forth. And that is how the term will be used in this article. All epistemological activities are instances of ethnoepistemology in this broad sense; and all ethnoepistemologies are instances of epistemology. Finally, ethnoepistemology reflects critically upon the nature, method(s), aim(s), province and very definition of epistemology itself from the broadly anthropological, fully a posteriori perspective.
Table of Contents
- General Characterization
- Some Questions Addressed by Ethnoepistemology
- Three Areas of Ethnoepistemological Inquiry
- References and Further Reading
Ethnoepistemology is a species of naturalized epistemology devoted to the a posteriori, anthropological style of investigation of all human epistemological activities, both domestic and non-domestic. (For an overview of naturalized epistemology, see Maffie (1990); Kitcher (1992); and Kornblith (1997.). Ethnoepistemology regards human epistemological activities as wholly natural phenomena susceptible to description, understanding, and evaluation from a broadly anthropological and fully a posteriori perspective. It examines the entire gamut of human epistemological activities ranging from those of ordinary folk and cognitive specialists to those of epistemologists themselves. What’s more, it examines not only non-domestic epistemological practices but also domestic Western epistemological practices, and regards the latter as constituting merely one among many alternative and contingent epistemological projects pursued by and available to human beings. In this manner, ethnoepistemology serves to de-center and provincialize the aims, assumptions, problems, methods, and conclusions of Western epistemology. The conception of ethnoepistemology sketched here thus differs from the dominant conception in contemporary Western academic discourse, which conceives ethnoepistemology as the study of non-Western epistemologies only. Lastly, ethnoepistemology reflects critically upon the nature, aims, and province of epistemology, from the selfsame broadly anthropological and fully a posteriori perspective.
As a species of naturalized epistemology, ethnoepistemology rejects epistemology as First Philosophy, i.e. epistemology conceived as an autonomous, a priori enterprise prior to and normative for all other inquiry. It rejects, for example, such mainstay principles of traditional Western epistemologyies, which assert that epistemology employs sui generis, a priori methods and evidence; epistemology employs evidential norms and standards epistemologically firmer or higher than those of the sciences; epistemology proceeds from a vantage point making no use of the substantive findings of the sciences; epistemology yields results epistemologically firmer or higher than those of the sciences; and epistemology is epistemologically prior to the sciences.
Ethnoepistemology conceives its own activities as continuous with the sciences. It endeavors to create such continuity by extending the epistemology of the sciences — e.g. their a posteriori evidential practices, styles of reasoning, and modes of explanation — as well as the substantive findings of the sciences into the ethnoepistemological study of epistemology. In short, ethnoepistemology is conducted within the sciences and as part of the sciences.
Ethnoepistemology thus construes inquiry into human epistemological activities as consisting of “scientific questions about a species of primates” (Quine 1975:68). It seeks an account of these activities that is compatible with creatures possessing the biology, history, cultures, and psychology of Homo Sapiens. Ethnoepistemology thus adopts a broadly interdisciplinary perspective that incorporates the findings of anthropology of knowledge, cultural anthropology, cognitive anthropology, cognitive psychology, indigenized psychology, the sociology of belief and knowledge, linguistics, history, evolutionary biology, etc., and unifies these under a single umbrella: one aptly characterized as “anthropology.” In this manner, its approach to human epistemological activities parallels anthropological approaches to other cultural practices such as morality, magic, shamanism, religion, and law. It regards all epistemological activities — ranging from the less reflective and less critical activities of ordinary folk to the more self-conscious, abstract, and reflective activities of epistemologists — as no different in principle from the aforementioned cultural activities. Epistemological activities are simply one among many natural phenomena, simply one among many human endeavors, and as such properly studied by anthropology. Ethnoepistemology thus considers epistemological activities — e.g. epistemological intuitions, judgments, concepts, norms, and goals — as amenable to the same methods of inquiry as employed by the sciences.
Ethnoepistemology approaches human epistemological activities as historically and contingently constituted natural phenomena conducted by reflective human beings. The nature, aims, norms, theories, concepts, and province of human epistemological activities are to be understood in terms of the life context in which these activities are organically rooted and sustained, rather than in terms of divine imperative, rationality per se, or pre-existing epistemological facts or principles. Epistemological goals, notions, principles, and theories are human postulates and fabrications. Epistemology is fashioned by humans and for humans. However, humans do not fashion their epistemologies in circumstances of their own choosing, and therefore do not fashion their epistemologies entirely as they please. External reality plays a role in the process. Humans fashion their ends and norms as a particular organism with a specific objective make-up, environment, and relationship to that environment which are not of its choosing and which transcend its wishes, language games, culturally-adopted evidential practices, and so forth. Consequently, that which instrumentally promotes the epistemic ends of human beings need not be necessarily socially constructed. In other words, ethnoepistemology (and naturalized epistemology generally) remains neutral between un-realist (constructivist) vs. realist theories regarding the ontological status of epistemological properties. (For supporting argument, see Maffie 1990, 1993, 1995, 1999.)
Ethnoepistemology embraces several methodological principles. The first is Reflexivity, which states that its own manner of description, explanation, and evaluation must be in principle applicable to itself. The practice of ethnoepistemology as proposed herein is itself an instance of ethnoepistemological activity and as such amenable to ethnoepistemological investigation. The second is Symmetry, according to which ethnoepistemology is symmetrical in style of explanation and evaluation. The same kinds of explanations and criteria of evaluation are employed regarding both true and false belief, justified and unjustified belief, and knowledge and ignorance. The third is Impartiality, that is to say, ethnoepistemology is impartial with respect to true and false belief, justified and unjustified belief, and knowledge and ignorance. Both sides of these dichotomies require explanation. Ethnoepistemology thus rejects the various dualisms commonly assumed by traditional epistemology that contradict these three methodological principles. (For related discussion, see Bloor 1991, and Maffie 1999.)
Ethnoepistemology examines all levels of epistemological activity conducted by all epistemological agents in all places. Therefore, ethnoepistemology is universal in scope in this threefold sense. First, it studies the epistemic practices of ordinary people, cognitive specialists such as shamans, priests, jurists and scientists, and of philosophers themselves. Philosophical activity does not transcend naturalistic (e.g., sociological, anthropological, etc.) investigation. It is one species of natural activity alongside cooking, childrearing, and counting. Professional academic philosophy, in particular, is no exception and is thus subject to anthropological scrutiny as well. Academic philosophers are simply one among many groups or subcultures alongside Roman Catholic priests, Yakut shamans, Mesoamerican curanderas, and Yoruba onisegun.
Second, ethnoepistemology studies the epistemological activities of both alien and domestic cultures, and thus incorporates non-domestic and domestic Western anthropology as well as non-domestic and domestic non-Western anthropology. Members of the American Philosophical Association along with the editors and referees of professional journals such as Philosophical Review and Mind are simply one group among many other cultural groups, and as such, are not exempt from anthropological scrutiny. Phenomena for domestic ethnoepistemological research include: (a) professional boundary-work, such as constructing the dominant epistemological canon and tradition, which includes questions such as, who is included in official histories and textbooks of epistemology, who is considered a “serious” epistemologist, and what is a “genuine” epistemological problem; and (b) professional gate-keeping activities such as editorial and investigative, and hiring and promotion decisions.
Ethnoepistemology thus rejects the tacit dualism and double standard of Western epistemology that exempts domestic (i.e. Western) epistemological practices from the same kind of anthropological scrutiny that the epistemological practices of non-Western cultures are subject to. Both are to be studied in the same manner, using the same kinds of methods, norms, and evidence. In addition, ethnoepistemology rejects the kindred dualism and double standard that characterizes the epistemological activities of non-Western cultures as ethnoepistemologies while characterizing the epistemological activities of Western culture as epistemology proper. This view is commonly expressed by the assertion that thinkers in other cultures practice mere “ethnoepistemology” or “ethnophilosophy,” whereas Western academic philosophers practice real epistemology or real philosophy. (This attitude is widespread in Western academia. Ethnoastronomy, for example, is commonly conceived as the study of non-Western astronomies, but not Western astronomy! Western astronomy is immune to anthropological examination because it is “real” astronomy, astronomy simpliciter. The same holds for ethnobotany, ethnomusicology, etc.) What non-Western thinkers do is thereby marginalized as mere anthropological curiosity (e.g. as mythologizing, poetizing, or storytelling), and they are deemed unqualified to participate in the “genuinely” philosophical discourse of the West. What thinkers in other cultures do is endemic and of local interest only. What they think is not universally relevant since it does not apply to humankind in general or reflect the human condition as such. It is simply assumed that this is not the case with Western philosophers.
Indeed, the customary use of the terms “ethnophilosophy” and “ethnoepistemology” by Western philosophers is objectionable, since it assumes that Western philosophy is the standard by which all other cultures’ philosophies and reflective activities are to be understood and measured, and that Western philosophy is philosophy simpliciter rather than one among many ethnophilosophies. (For a recent expression of this view, see Rorty 1991, 1992, 1993.) The more broadly ecumenical and non-ethnocentric use of the term “ethnoepistemology” employed here, however, avoids this shortcoming since it includes all epistemological activities, whether they African, East Asian, European or Latin American. All epistemological activities are instances of ethnoepistemology (in this broad sense); and all ethnoepistemologies are instances of epistemology.
Finally, the scope of ethnoepistemology is universal in the third sense that it subjects to anthropological scrutiny what Anglo-American analytic epistemologists call normative (or basic) level as well as meta-level epistemological activities. Normative level epistemology determines the correct theory of knowledge as well as the scope and sources of human knowledge. It also evaluates and prescribes cognitive behavior. Meta-epistemology investigates the semantics, metaphysics, and epistemology of knowledge claims. It determines the cognitive and epistemic status of epistemic judgments, the reference of epistemic expressions, the ontological status of epistemic properties, and so on. Meta-epistemology also inquires into the nature and content of epistemic ends. Ethnoepistemology examines epistemic agents’ normative level epistemological concepts, judgments, norms, and theories as well as their meta-level theories about the epistemology of epistemology, the ends of epistemology, etc.
Some of the questions that ethnoepistemology addresses include the following: How shall we define epistemology? What is the nature and province of epistemology? What is it about the biological constitution as well as social, cultural, and physical circumstances of humans that engender epistemic judgment, reflection, and theorizing? Why do humans practice epistemological inquiry? How do humans actually practice epistemological inquiry? What explains the importance of knowledge claims and knowledge holders (e.g. sages, scientists, priests) in the lives of humans?
What do humans actually care about when inquiring into epistemological questions? Do human epistemological activities vary across history, culture, class, race, gender, etc.? What is the ontological status of epistemic properties? Are there any nontrivial and cross-cultural generalizations regarding the epistemological landscape of humankind? Is humankind characterized by epistemological unity or relativity? Is epistemology unique to Western culture? Should humans continue to ask epistemological questions?
The foregoing questions are to be resolved a posteriori rather than by appeal to a priori intuitions, transcendental arguments, divine imperatives, rationality per se, or pre-existing epistemological facts or principles (as is customary with non-naturalist epistemologies). Ethnoepistemology regards these strategies as clever ways of begging the question with all the advantages of theft over hard empirical toil. Ethnoepistemology considers its answers to the above questions as scientific hypotheses, that is to say, fallible and corrigible.
Ethnoepistemology addresses these questions within the context of the fallible and corrigible, a posteriori, and social scientific finding that critical reflection and “the unusually stubborn attempt to think clearly” (as William James characterized philosophy) are indeed global endeavors (e.g., see Deloria et al. 1999; Deutsche and Bontekoe (eds.) 1997; Hester, Jr. and McPherson 1997; Oruka 1990; Leon-Portilla 1963; Radin 1957; and Scharfstein 1993). Let’s briefly consider two pressing questions facing ethnoepistemology.
Perhaps the most daunting issue facing ethnoepistemology is: How shall we define epistemology itself? When an intuition, concept, judgment, norm, theory or goal is epistemological, and what makes it so? When are critical reflection and “the unusual attempt to think clearly” epistemological? What definition or criterion shall ethnoepistemologists bring into the field when attempting to identify epistemological activities — as opposed to prima facie non-epistemological activities such as moral, aesthetic, prudential, parental or agricultural activities? Can we assume at the outset that epistemological activities are in principle distinct from moral, aesthetic, and other activities? Are we justified in assuming that there is even a distinctly epistemological — as opposed to moral, aesthetic or prudential — point of view?
How we answer these questions bears crucially upon our answers to other key questions such as: How do we avoid ethnocentrically begging the question in favor of our own domestic, meta-epistemological conception of epistemology and against alternative, nonequivalent conceptions advanced by other cultures? How do we avoid arbitrarily rejecting ex hypothesi alternative conceptions of the epistemological on the grounds that they are not genuinely epistemological? Bluntly put, how do we avoid the dismissive ethnocentrism — and the arrogant provincialism that typically underlies it — expressed by such prominent Western philosophers as: Edmund Husserl, who claimed that the expression “Western philosophy” is tautalogous, and the expression “non-western philosophy,”is oxymoronic (Gupta and Mohanty (eds.), 2000:xi); Emmanuel Levinas, who is quoted as having remarked, “I always say — but in private — that the Greeks and the Bible are all that is serious in humanity. Everything else is dancing” (Bernasconi, 1997:185); and Richard Rorty, (1991, 1992, 1993), who claims that looking for philosophy outside of the West is “pointless” since philosophy is unique to Western culture (quoted in Hallen, 1995:17).
As a start, let’s approach this issue by adopting a rather “thin” conception of epistemology. Although this conception is rooted in our own practices, it may nevertheless serve us well. After all, as contextualism has long urged, we cannot begin from scratch; we have no access to a presuppositionless, Archimedean standpoint from which to conduct inquiry. We can begin only from where we presently are.
According to this conception, epistemology consists of reflection upon the nature, source(s), and limits of knowledge. Epistemological intuitions, judgments, norms, theories, and ends are those concerned with the nature, source, and limits of knowledge. Ethnoepistemology regards this definition as a contingent, fallible, a posteriori anthropological hypothesis about the nature of our own practices — not a deliverance of a priori, rational insight into Platonic concepts or preexisting necessary truths, for example. This conception has the virtue of being sufficiently “thin” so as to enable us to capture a wide range of activities as being epistemological. When we encounter individuals, groups, or cultures and find they reflect, wonder, puzzle, or theorize about — in one degree or another, in one manner or another — the nature, source, and limits of knowledge — then we may claim that they practice epistemology. We may find them using, for example, epistemological notions such as knowledge, wisdom, and evidence or what we regard as their interpretive-translational equivalents. On the other hand, however, this conception appears sufficiently “thick” to warrant our excluding a wide range of activities from counting as epistemological such as farming, cooking, and playing chess. Hence, if we encounter individuals, groups, or cultures who do not reflect upon the nature, limits, and source of knowledge, we may claim they do not practice epistemology.
But is this definition too permissive? Does it allow us to distinguish epistemology from other human endeavors, such as morality and aesthetics, for example? Doesn’t it raise the concern that everything now qualifies as epistemology? If a culture defines right belief, evidence, or knowledge in terms of moral or aesthetic notions such as living a morally upright, genuinely human, or beautiful life, is it doing epistemology? Does it have an epistemology as opposed to an ethics or aesthetics of belief?
By way of answering this question, let’s consider a “thicker” conception of epistemology. According to “thick” views, doing epistemology, having a genuinely epistemological conception of knowledge, making genuinely epistemological judgments, etc., requires that one embraces a specific definition (theory) of justification or knowledge, a specific conception of the end(s) of cognition from the epistemological point of view. “Thick” views certainly enable us to better uphold our familiar domestic distinctions between epistemology, on the one hand, and aesthetics, prudence and morality, on the other. But what is the cost?
One leading “thick” view places decisive weight on the role of truth. Many Western philosophers view correspondence truth as occupying the center stage of Western epistemology’s theories of knowledge and justification since Plato and Aristotle. The most prominent contemporary defender of this view is the North American philosopher Alvin Goldman. Goldman (1999) defends what he calls “veritism,” i.e., the thesis that humans across culture and history uniformly seek truth, epistemic notions such as justification and knowledge are properly defined in terms of truth, the aim of cognition from the epistemological point of view is truth, and a single concept of truth is cross-culturally present (namely, correspondence truth). Goldman is not alone in defending veritism, as it represents an enduring view upheld by the majority of twentieth-century Anglo-American epistemologists from William Alston and Roderick Chisholm to Bertrand Russell and Barry Stroud.
According to veritism, those who conceive of knowledge non-veritistically, as well as those who dismiss the importance or even relevance of correspondence truth to epistemological concepts, are simply not doing epistemology. They are doing something else instead, perhaps morality, aesthetics, pragmatics, etc. Therefore, even if we encounter terms in a target culture’s language that prima facie translate into English terms such as “knowledge” and “evidence,” they may not be properly translated in strictly epistemological terms. Such cultures are using “knowledge,” etc. in some alien, non-epistemological sense. For instance, they may be using the terms in a prudential or practical sense, where “to know” really means “know how,” not “know that.” Such cultures thus have a notion of practical knowledge or “knowledge how” but lack a notion of theoretical knowledge or “knowledge that.” It is the latter that is the proper focus of epistemology as such.
Goldman and others defend veritism in the face of a daunting pantheon of Western philosophers including David Hume, Friedrich Nietzsche, Martin Heidegger, William James, John Dewey, W.V.O. Quine, Nelson Goodman, and Richard Rorty, who reject the relevance of correspondence truth to epistemology, reject veritistic epistemologies, and propose alternative, non-veritistic epistemologies. What do veritists say about these philosophers? Presumably that they have abandoned epistemology per se in favor of some other activity such as reflecting upon the rightness of belief from the moral or pragmatic point of view (e.g., see Goldman, 1999).
Let’s consider this question from the broader perspective of comparative world philosophy. From this perspective, truth clearly appears to be merely one among many ends governing the regulation of belief (or cognition) and merely one among many ends in terms of which knowledge (or wisdom) is conceived. Non-veritistic cognitive ends include: living a life of balance and beauty; becoming a genuinely human; moral rectitude and purity; promoting social harmony; coexisting in harmony with nature; respect for nature; and conformity with sacred text (to name only a few). Let’s briefly review several studies.
Ben-Ami Scharfstein (2001) surveys Bhartriharian, Confucian, European Existentialist, Gangeshan, Neoplatonic, Inuit, !Kung, Navajo, and Taoist (among others) reflections upon the nature of truth and on this basis argues that no single conception of truth is shared universally by all the world’s philosophies. Humans define truth as: correspondence between verbal assertion (or language) and reality; practical utility; the sum-total of ideas that accords with reality; the way things really are (independently of verbal assertion and language); and accurate verbal articulation of what cannot be reasonably doubted because it ought not to be morally doubted.
David Hall (2001), David Hall and Roger Ames (1987, 1998), and Chad Hansen (1992), argue that classical, pre-Han Dynasty Taoist and Confucian epistemologies are not concerned with truth, true belief or truthful representation. Rather, they are concerned with identifying the proper path or appropriate model of conduct that enables humans to live the kind of life suitable for human beings. According to Confucianism, for example, the proper life consists of living harmoniously with one’s social surroundings. Correspondence truth plays no role in attaining or maintaining this life. One aims at living a life characterized by authenticity, genuineness, rectitude and wholeness — not knowledge defined as justified true belief. Confucian epistemology seeks to identify the kind of knowledge that is needed for following this path, i.e., knowledge that is performative and participatory rather than representational. Classical Chinese epistemologies seek right or appropriate belief — not true belief. If truth is relevant, it is defined in terms of genuineness or authenticity — not correspondence.
Indigenous North American philosophers Vine Deloria, Jr. (DeLoria, Jr. (1994) and DeLoria, et al (eds.), 1999) and Lee Hester (Hester and Cheney 2001), contend that indigenous North American philosophies treat cognitive states as maps rather than as beliefs. Hester claims Native American philosophy does not focus upon belief and as a consequence does not worry about the correspondence-truth of belief. Native Americans focus upon actions and practices, and adopt an attitude of non-belief (that is, neither belief nor disbelief) towards actions and practices. This attitude is rooted in the idea that one is defined by one’s actions, not one’s beliefs. Adopting the metaphor of “the map and the territory,” Hester maintains Native Americans adopt an agnostic attitude of epistemological humility regarding the correspondence-truth of their map. They are concerned with the utility of their map as a practical action-guide. Knowledge has a practical not theoretical focus; it concerns concrete experiences and narratives of actual lives in the world. Knowledge is not a species of belief.
Jim Cheney (Cheney 1998, Hester and Cheney 2001) argues that Indigenous North American philosophies conceive truth in moral terms such as responsibility, goodness and human well-being. This view of truth is a component of an ethical-epistemological orientation Cheney calls an “epistemology of respect” rather than an “epistemology of control.” Truth must responsibly guide action in the sense of promoting the well-being of everyone. It must be rooted in the world of concrete everyday practices and experiences in a way that makes possible human flourishing.
Willard Gingerich (1987), Miguel Leon-Portilla (1963), and James Maffie (2000b, 2002, 2003) maintain that pre-Hispanic indigenous Nahuatl-speaking philosophers of the High Central Plateau of Mexico conceived knowledge in non-veritistic terms such as balance, well-groundednness, moral uprightness, authenticity, and disclosingness. Correspondence truth played no role in their notions of wisdom, knowledge, proper belief, etc. Gordon Brotherston (2001) likewise argues that indigenous Amazonian philosophy conceives knowledge pragmatically in terms of the trustworthy, responsible, and careful ordering and arranging of things. It eschews broad, overarching, abstract conceptions of truth such as correspondence between propositions and world.
But what, exactly, does this survey of world philosophies show? Veritists will argue it shows very little. Regardless of what the preceding philosophers may think they are doing, they are simply not doing epistemology proper. They are doing something else: morality, aesthetics, pragmatics, or perhaps some aboriginal activity, that fails to make the necessary conceptual distinctions between the epistemological point of view, on the one hand, and the moral, aesthetic, etc., points of view, on the other.
Non-veritists, however, contend that the preceding shows veritism is a posteriori false. Goldman’s “thick” veritistic conceptions of knowledge, epistemology, and the epistemological point of view do not, as a matter of contingent fact, enjoy global acceptance. This fact demonstrates that Goldman’s veritism is simply too “thick” as a definition of the epistemological. Veritism excludes too many human activities across history and culture that are plausibly translated/interpreted as epistemological, and is therefore too restrictive to serve as an acceptable criterion for the epistemological when doing ethnoepistemology.
Furthermore, rather than simply assuming that non-veritist epistemologies mistakenly fail to draw a conceptually necessary or intrinsically rational distinction between the epistemological and the moral or aesthetic points of view, ethnoepistemology’s status as fallible, hypothetical, and a posteriori enterprise commits us to remain open to the possibilities that non-veritistic epistemologies have simply pursued an alternative path of epistemological development (one that may at some level even be incommensurable with the veritistic path), or that non-veritistic epistemologies have simply not committed the mistake of balkanizing the epistemological from the moral or aesthetic — i.e. the mistake of falsely drawing a distinction where there is no distinction to be made. After all, by naturalist lights, whether there is a distinction to be made is a contingent and a posteriori matter. The veritist’s putative distinction between these various points of view is not rooted in rationality per se, pre-existing non-natural epistemological reality, or a priori conceptual reality. In this regard, therefore, ethnoepistemologists need to be wary of a yet another version of ethnocentrism, namely, philosophical whiggism or the tendency to treat the claims and distinctions of the Western philosophical present not only as correct but as the inevitable, developmental destiny of all philosophical reflection. Comparative world philosophy clearly supports the idea that there is more than one philosophical (and epistemological) trajectory taken by humankind (see Deutsche and Bontekoe (eds.), 1997; Eze (ed.), 1996; Nuccetelli and Seay (eds.), 2004; Scharfstein, 1998; and Waters (ed.), 2004).
How shall ethnoepistemology resolve this question? The “thin” conception of epistemology seems more attractive on several grounds. First, it leaves as open a posteriori question the nature and aims of knowledge and epistemology. Second, it is more inclusive. It recognizes a wider variety of possible answers to our questions concerning the nature and aims of knowledge and epistemology. Third, it achieves this inclusiveness in a manner that simultaneously respects the differences between world epistemologies. That is, it creates a common ground for world philosophers (and philosophies) without making all philosophers (and philosophies) the image of Western philosophers (philosophies). Alternatively put, it does not affirm that the non-Western “other” is doing epistemology by demanding that the non-Western “other” do precisely what Western epistemologists do and thus be indistinguishable from Western epistemologists.
Fourth, it avoids the subtle yet significant error committed by “thick” accounts such as Goldman’s. Goldman confounds normative and meta-levels of epistemology by construing his normative level definition of knowledge as a meta-epistemological constraint upon the nature of epistemology per se. As we’ve seen, Anglo-American philosophers distinguish meta- and normative levels of epistemological inquiry. Normative-level inquiry pursues such issues as the correct definition (or theory) of knowledge. Goldman’s normative-level theory of knowledge, for example, defines correspondence truth as a necessary condition knowledge. Meta-epistemological inquiry investigates the semantics, metaphysics, and epistemology of knowledge claims as well as the nature of epistemology itself. Goldman moves illegitimately from the normative level claim that truth is a necessary (defining) condition of knowledge to the logically distinct meta-level claim that truth is a necessary (defining) condition of epistemology proper. This leads Goldman to reject all non-veritistic conceptions of epistemology not on the grounds that they advocate a posteriori false theories of knowledge but on the grounds that they fail ex hypothesi to be epistemology per se.
In doing so, Goldman illegitimately construes his own peculiar meta-level theory about the correct ends of cognition from an epistemological point of view as a general definition of epistemology per se. Rather than being willing to see his view as one among many possible ways of conceiving knowledge, epistemic ends, etc., Goldman treats his way as the one and only way. In doing so, he forecloses ex hypothesi the possibility of genuine epistemological alternatives to – as well as legitimate dissent from – his own veritism.
Fifth, the “thin” conception leaves open the possibility of relativism concerning definitions of the proper ends of cognition from the epistemological point of view as well as relativism concerning definitions of knowledge, justification, evidence, right (good) belief. “Thicker” approaches, such as veritism, rule out relativism ex hypothesi; anyone who disagrees is simply not doing epistemology. Yet relativism should remain an open and contingent question; one to be resolved via a posteriori inquiry — not by conceptual fiat prior to inquiry.
Lastly, the “thin” view is less ethnocentric than the “thick.” While it is true that the “thin” view requires that others engage in the same kinds of reflective processes that we do on pain of not doing epistemology, it does not require that others arrive at the same substantive conclusions that we do in the way that “thicker” views require. Indeed, the “thin” view includes every cognitive practice we might feel inclined to translate/interpret as “epistemology.” In addition, it turns out that in most, if not all, cultures, individuals practice epistemology as “thinly” conceived.
In sum, ethnoepistemology strives to conceive epistemology as broadly, ecumenically, and open-endedly as possible without lapsing into triviality. In light of this, it adopts the “thin” definition above (at least until something better comes along).
Implicit in the discussion above are two further closely related issues. First, does epistemology enjoy a metaphysical essence that necessarily distinguishes it from ethics, soccer, cooking, and pragmatics? In brief, it would seem not. Naturalism appears to afford us no such metaphysical underpinnings for human activities and no transcendental assurances concerning the eternal essence of epistemology, the ends of cognition from the epistemological point of view, or epistemology’s distinctness from other human activities such as doing science, playing chess or raising children. There is no pre-existing sui generis epistemological reality for humans to seek to discover through epistemology. Similarly, epistemology (like other human activities) does not appear to qualify as a natural kind like say, H2O, quark, and humanness. Rather, epistemology is a contingent enterprise fashioned by humans and for humans. Our conceptions of knowledge, justification and evidence as well as of epistemology itself are all contingent human fabrications.
However, this fact entails neither epistemological relativism nor metaphysical irealism regarding the ontological status of epistemological properties. Whether humankind’s epistemological activities are characterized by unity or relativity remains an open factual question to be settled a posteriori. Similarly, anti-essentialism regarding the essence of the enterprise of epistemology is compatible with realism regarding epistemic properties such as justification. (For supporting argument, see Maffie 1990, 1993, 1995, 1999).
Second, if epistemology is underpinned neither by a metaphysical essence nor by a natural kind, can we maintain that there is a pre-existing fact of the matter whether someone in another culture is really doing epistemology as opposed to something else? Can we maintain that it is precisely such facts that an adequate ethnoepistemology must capture? On the other hand must we deny the existence of such facts and maintain instead that whether or not someone is doing epistemology is ultimately a matter of our translation/interpretation of their behavior? (For relevant discussion, see Quine 1960; Davidson 1984; and Roth 1987).
A second set of a posteriori issues confronting ethnoepistemology concerns the nature of the object of epistemological evaluation. First, assuming we define epistemology as concerned with evaluating whether or not some item qualifies as knowledge, how shall we construe the nature of knowledge: as something psychological, sociological, biological, behavioral, or ecological? Shall we think of knowledge as an entity one apprehends and possesses, as a map one uses, as an appellation bestowed by one’s social peers or as a way of acting in the world? Finally, does the actual practice of epistemology require that one construes knowledge in one of these ways rather than another?Ethnoepistemology ought to remain neutral regarding these questions in order to be as inclusive as possible regarding the variety of possible epistemologies in the world. There appears to be no compelling reason to think that the practice of epistemology proper requires that knowledge be defined as a private, mental entity as opposed to a behavioral or practical disposition; or that it be theorized as an entity to be acquired and possessed as opposed to a way of conducting one’s life, etc.
Second, if epistemology is concerned with knowledge, how shall we understand knowledge: in propositional or sentential terms (that is, as “theoretical knowledge” or “knowledge that”), or in practical terms (that is, as “practical knowledge” or “know how”)? Should we even accept this distinction? Similarly, if epistemology evaluates cognitive attitudes such as belief, should such cognitive attitudes be defined sententially, propositionally, or practically? Finally, how does this question bear upon whether a group or culture may be said to do epistemology?
Western epistemology has traditionally focused upon theoretical to the exclusion of practical knowledge. If one agrees and defines the proper concern of epistemological evaluation to be propositional knowledge (or belief), then it would appear to follow that those individuals, groups, and cultures that conceive knowledge (and belief) non-propositionally must a fortiori fail to be doing epistemology. Whatever they are doing, it simply is not epistemology.
Yet classical Chinese thought (as embodied in pre-Han Taoist and Confucian traditions) focused upon neither propositional (sentential) and theoretical attitudes nor propositional and theoretical (sentential) knowledge. Chinese linguistic theory is pragmatic, not semantic. According to Hansen, it is concerned with the assertability of “words, phrases, sentences, arguments and even whole dialogues” (Hansen 1992:44), rather than the truth of sentences or propositions. Chinese epistemology discusses zhi (knowledge) but interprets zhi non-propositionally.
The grammatical object of zhi (know) is always a noun or phrase, not a subject-predicate sentence. The kind of knowing that makes sense of Chinese views is knowing-how to do something, knowing-to-do something, or knowing-of (about) something (Hansen 1992:44).
According to Roger Ames, zhi is a way of acting in the world; it is “knowing…the ‘way’…” (Ames 1997:259). A host of indigenous North and Mesoamerican philosophies embrace remarkably similar pragmatic accounts of knowledge (and belief) (e.g., see Deloria, et al (eds.), 1999: Hester and Cheney, 2001: Gingerich, 1987: Maffie, 2002: and Waters (ed.), 2004).
Shall we conclude that East Asian and indigenous North and Mesoamerican philosophers cannot be said to be doing epistemology since they define knowledge in non-propositional, behavioral terms — that is, because they define knowledge incorrectly according to (some) Western philosopheis? Doing so clearly appears too restrictive, and ethnoepistemology therefore adopts a more ecumenical approach. We are simply confronted with different kinds of epistemologies: those concerned with propositional knowing, those concerned with non-propositional knowing, and those which reject the propositional vs. non-propositional dichotomy when characterizing knowing. Furthermore, defining the practice of epistemology per se in terms of a particular normative level theory about the nature of knowledge commits the fallacy of treating a normative level claim as a meta-epistemological level claim (see above).
A third issue facing ethnoepistemology concerns the relevance of belief. Western epistemologists have commonly defined knowledge in terms of justified true belief, and commonly construed epistemology as being concerned with evaluating the epistemic credentials of belief. If we accept this account, what happens if there is no such thing as belief? Does epistemology go out of business? If beliefs exist but turn out to be a culturally specific cognitive phenomenon such that individuals in some cultures do not have beliefs, can they be said to practice epistemology?
Rodney Needham persuasively argues against the idea that “the institutions of…belief…express a distinct and universal mode of stable experience (Needham 1972:217), and hence the idea that belief is natural kind that cuts across culture. He quotes E.E. Evans-Pritchard as saying, “There is…no word in the Nuer language which could stand for ‘I believe’” (Needham 1972:23); no word with which to express belief. Whatever mental states, cognitive attitudes or sentiments the Nuer adopt towards the existence of, say, their gods or cosmologies, Evans-Pritchard denies they are felicitously translated/interpreted into English as “believe.” People in other cultures appear to employ different folk psychologies when characterizing their mental states (just as they employ different folk physics when characterizing their environments), and these folk psychologies need not include belief. As a consequence, we should not expect individuals in other cultures to have beliefs. Belief is simply not a useful notion in representing the mental states of individuals in (at least some) other cultures.
If Needham is correct, then it would seem that the epistemologies of such cultures as the Nuer, for example, focus upon evaluating some mental state or cognitive attitudes other than belief. But would this endeavor still qualify as epistemology? Does epistemology require that one evaluates belief specifically?
Hallen and Sodipo (1997) contend the most plausible translation/interpretation of Yoruba linguistic behavior containing abstract terms and concepts used in the evaluation and grading of information yields a reading which does not map neatly onto the English terms “belief” and “knowledge.” The Yoruba’s notions of gbagbo and mo are not logically equivalent to the English notions of belief and knowledge, respectively. Yoruba epistemological concepts and distinctions simply do not map neatly onto Anglo-American epistemological concepts and distinctions. In so arguing, the authors make a strong prima facie case for the non-universality of propositional attitudes as well as the non-universality of epistemological concepts (e.g., the concept of knowledge as justified true belief). Is the Yoruba’s evaluation of information properly characterized as epistemology? Does epistemology cease to exist in a culture wherein there is no belief to evaluate?
Chad Hansen argues that classical Chinese does not possess the notion of belief as a propositional or sentential attitude:
[It] has no grammatically parallel verb for propositional belief…. The closest counterparts to belief…focus on the term, not the sentence. Where we would say, “He believes it is good,” classical Chinese would use a structure something like, “He goods it” or He yi…(with regard to) that, wei (deems) [it] good” (Hansen 1992:44).
The closest counterparts to belief are best understood as “dispositions to use a term of some object” (Hansen 1992:44) rather than as propositional attitudes. Is epistemology possible under these circumstances?
Finally, Paul Churchland (1979, 1981), Patricia Churchland (1986, 1987), and Stephen Stich (1983) contend that the notion of belief is a theoretical constituent of Western culture’s folk psychology about what is the nature of mind. Western folk psychology will undoubtedly be supplanted by neuroscience, just as Western folk physics has been supplanted by Western scientific physics. In the process, they predict, the notion of belief will simply be eliminated, tossed into the rubbish bin of outmoded folk theoretical notions alongside unicorns, faeries, and leprechauns. If this is correct, will epistemology go out of business, or will it shift its focus to the evaluation of neurological states instead?
On this issue ethnoepistemology ought to remain neutral so as to be as inclusive as possible regarding the variety of possible world epistemologies. There are no compelling reasons for requiring that individuals have specific cognitive attitudes such as belief in order for there to be epistemology.
Ethnoepistemology examines the epistemological activities of three groups of epistemic agents: ordinary folk, cognitive specialists (e.g., scientists and diviners), and epistemologists. In what follows, these are called “the ethnoepistemology of folk epistemology,” “the ethnoepistemology of cognitive specialists,” and “the ethnoepistemology of epistemology,” respectively. The three exist along a continuum since their activities differ in degree, not in kind. They differ in terms of their degree of critical self-reflection, abstraction and generality of theorizing. In one degree or another, and from time to time, ordinary folk as well as cognitive specialists engage in epistemological reflection. Reflection upon the general nature of evidence, justification, and knowledge is by no means the monopoly of professional philosophers (For supporting argument, see Maffie 1995, 1999).
Ethnoepistemology’s examination of each group admits of descriptive and critical as well as domestic and non-domestic varieties. Domestic ethnoepistemologies examine the evidential practices of one’s own culture; whereas non-domestic ethnoepistemologies examine those of alien cultures. Descriptive studies aim to describe and report faithfully the goals, norms and methodologies of various human epistemic activities. Critical studies aim to evaluate and critically reflect upon these practices. They also issue in critical or prescriptive reforming accounts of human epistemic norms, theories, and judgments.
The ethnoepistemology of ordinary folk examines what Goldman (1992) calls the “epistemic folkways” — i.e., the largely pre-reflective, untutored, and uncritical workaday epistemic concepts, intuitions, judgments, and norms of ordinary people.
Descriptive studies aim to describe faithfully the intuitions, judgments, standards, and goals of some particular folk epistemic practice. Such studies issue in reported accounts of epistemic folkways. They include (among others): Belenky, et al. (eds.), (1986), Code (1991), Coetze and Roux (eds.), (1998), P. Collins (1991), Crick (1982), Deloria et al (eds.), (1999), Eze (ed.), (1996), Goldman, (1986, 1992), Hallen and Sodipo, (1986), Lopez Austin, (1988), Kitchener (ed.), (2002), Radin, (1957), and Waters (ed.), (2004).
Critical studies reflect critically upon epistemic folkways and typically issue in critical evaluations of these folkways or reforming and prescriptive accounts of folk epistemic norms and concepts. Such projects include the naturalized epistemologies of Code (1991), P. Collins (1991), Goldman (1986, 1992, 1999) and Kornblith (ed.) (1997).
Incidentally, from the perspective of ethnoepistemology, self-proclaimed non-naturalist epistemologists such as Bonjour (1985) and Chisholm (1977) unwittingly practice descriptive or critical domestic ethnoepistemology of their epistemic folkways. After all, they rely upon ordinary intuitions and concepts, common sense judgments, etc., as the raw data for their a priori reflections and theories. Yet as Stephen Stich (1991:209) points out, their studies constitute “a sort of domestic cognitive anthropology which records and formalizes our culture’s commonsense epistemic notions.” Moreover, their projects are epistemologically flawed because their use of intuitions, judgments and thought-experiments amounts to little more than an appeal to anecdotal evidence.
The ethnoepistemology of cognitive specialists examines the epistemological activities of curers, shamans, diviners, priests, scientists, etc. Cognitive specialists are individuals who cultivate the use of one (or more) specific method or style (e.g., altered states of consciousness, intuition, reason or observation) in the formation and regulation of cognitive attitudes. Trained in a specific cognitive method, they tend to be more self-conscious about their use of evidence, rules of evidence, evidential goals, etc., than most ordinary folk.
Descriptive studies aim to describe faithfully the epistemological concepts, judgments, norms and goals of cognitive specialists in various cultures. They may examine the practices of domestic or non-domestic cognitive specialists. Such studies include: Biagioli (1990), Bloor (1976), Deloria et al (eds.) (1999), Evans-Pritchard (1976), Goonatilake (1998), Horton (1993), Latour and Woolgar (1986), Leon-Portilla (1963, 1988), Lopez Austin (1988), Middleton (ed.) (1967), Peek (ed.) (1991), Shapin and Schaffer (1985), Sivan (1995), Turnbull (1993-1994), Watson-Verran and Turnbull (1995), and Wylie (2002).
Critical studies reflect critically upon the evidential concepts, norms, etc. of cognitive specialists. Such studies include: Bloor (1991), Callebaut (1993), Harding (1997, 1998), Harding (ed.) (1987, 1993), Latour and Woolgar (1986), Keller (1985), Quine (1951, 1969, 1975), Roth (1987, 1989) and Wylie (2002).
The ethnoepistemology of epistemologists examines the epistemological activities of epistemologists, i.e., individuals who reflect critically, abstractly, systematically, theoretically, and generally upon the nature, source and limits of knowledge per se — as opposed to the nature, source and limits of knowledge as conceived within the limits of some cognitive practice (e.g., science, religion, etc.). The ethnoepistemology of epistemologists is undoubtedly the most controversial area of ethnoepistemology since it conceives the activity of epistemologists as a straightforward natural phenomenon susceptible to a posteriori examination by cognitive psychologists, anthropologists, sociologists of knowledge, etc. Much like priests and shamans, epistemologists (and philosophers generally) typically maintain their activities and claims reside beyond the limits of naturalistic explanation since they fancy themselves able to transcend the natural realm by dint of special, non-natural cognitive faculties that provide them with privileged access to non-natural metaphysical truths, principles or facts. Ethnoepistemology insists upon studying the activities of philosophers in the same manner as anthropology studies the activities of priests, shamans, and scientists.
Descriptive ethnoepistemologies of epistemologists aim to describe faithfully the epistemological theories, intuitions, judgments, and goals of epistemologists. Such studies may be domestic or non-domestic. They include: Coetze and Roux (eds.) (1998), R. Collins (1998), Deutsche and Bontekoe (eds.) (1997), Deloria, et al (eds.) (1999), Eze (ed.) (1996), Gingerich (1987), Hall and Ames (1987, 1998), Hallen and Sodipo (1986), Kusch (1995), Leon-Portilla (1963), Maffie (2000b, 2002, 2003), Maffie (ed.) (2001), Nuccetelli and Seay (eds.) (2004), Oruka (1990), Presbey et al (eds.) (2002), Scharfstein (1998) and Waters (ed.) (2004).
Critical ethnoepistemologies of epistemologists engage critically with the epistemological concepts, principles, theories, etc., of epistemologists, both domestic and non-domestic. Such studies include: Code (1991), P. Collins (1991), Deloria et al (eds.) (1999), Deloria, Jr. and Wildcat (2001), Hall and Ames (1987, 1988), Harding (1991, 1998), Harding (ed.) (1987, 1993), Maffie (1995, 2000a, 2002, 2003), Maffie (ed.) (2001), Nuccetelli and Seay (eds.) (2004), Presbey et al (eds.) (2002), Roth (1987, 1989), Scharfstein (1993, 1998, 2001) and Waters (ed.) (2004).
Critical ethnoepistemology of epistemologists also involves high level philosophical reflection concerning the nature, aims and province of as well as motivations for epistemology. It is here that the questions enumerated above are most fruitfully addressed. How do we define epistemology itself? Is there a unique epistemological point of view, and if so what is it? How do we avoid begging the question in favor of our domestic definition? Is humankind characterized by epistemological unity or relativity? Seeing as these questions remain largely unanswered, there is much research yet to be done by ethnoepistemology.
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Last updated: June 27, 2005 | Originally published: June/27/2005