Euclides was a native of Megara, and founder of the Megarian or Eristic sect. He applied himself early to the study of philosophy, and learned from the writings of Parmenides the art of disputation. Hearing of the fame of Socrates, Euclides moved to Athens and became a devoted student for many years. Because of an enmity between Athenians and Megarians, a decree was passed which forbid any Megarian from entering Athens under the penalty of death. Euclides moved twenty miles out of Athens, and would sneak into the city at night for instruction, dressed as a woman in a long cloak and veil. He frequently became involved in business disputes in civil courts. Socrates, who despised forensic contests, expressed dissatisfaction with Euclides for his fondness for controversy. It is likely that this provoked a separation between Euclides and Socrates, for after this Euclides was the head of a school in Megara which taught the art of disputation. Debates were conducted with so much vehemence among his pupils, that Timon said of Euclides that he carried the madness of contention from Athens of Megara (Diog. Laert, 6:22). Nevertheless, his restraint is attested to in a story about a quarrel he had with his brother. His brother charged, “Let me perish if do not have revenge on you.” To this Euclides replied, “And let me perish if I don not subdue your resentment by forbearance, and make you love me as much as ever.” In disputes Euclides was averse to the analogical method of reasoning, and judged that legitimate argumentation consists in deducing fair conclusions from acknowledge premises.
His position was a combination of Socraticism and Eleaticism. Virtue is knowledge, but knowledge of what? It is here that the Eleatic influence became visible. With Parmenides, the Megarics believed in the one Absolute being. All multiplicity, all motion, are illusory. The world of sense has in it no true reality. Only Being is. If virtue is knowledge, therefore, it can only be the knowledge of this Being. If the essential concept of Socrates was the Good, and the essential concept of Parmenides Being, Euclides now combined the two. Thus, according to Cicero, he defined the “supreme good” as that which is always the same. The Good is identified with Being. Being, the One, God, Intelligence, providence, the Good, divinity, are merely different names for the same thing. Becoming, the many, evil, are the names of its opposite, not-being. Multiplicity is thus identified with evil, and both are declared illusory. Evil has no real existence. The good alone truly is. The various virtues, as benevolence, temperance, prudence, are merely different names for the one virtue, knowledge of being. It is said that when Euclides was asked his opinion concerning the gods, he replied, “I know nothing more of them than this, that they hate inquisitive persons.”
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Last updated: April 14, 2001 | Originally published: April/14/2001
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