Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy


Events are particular happenings, occurrences or changes, such as Rob’s drinking the strong espresso at noon, the 1864 re-election of Abraham Lincoln in the US, and so on. At least at first blush, events all seem to have something in common, metaphysically speaking, and some philosophers have inquired into what this common nature is. The main aim of a theory of events is to propose and defend an identity condition on events; that is, a condition under which two events are identical. For example, if Brutus kills Caesar by stabbing him, are there two events, the stabbing and the killing, or only one event? Each of the leading theories of events is surveyed in this article. According to Jaegwon Kim, events are basically property instantiations. In contrast, Donald Davidson attempts to individuate events by their causes and effects. However, Davidson eventually rejects this view and, together with W.V.O. Quine, individuates events with respect to their location in spacetime. According to David Lewis, an event is a property of a spatiotemporal region. The selection of a theory of events is not a matter which one decides independently of one’s other metaphysical interests and commitments. The present discusses the relative strengths and weaknesses of several theories of events which can help to guide the reader’s own selection of a theory of events. Further philosophical developments may yield a theory of events which is more attractive than the approaches discussed here.

Table of Contents

  1. Kim’s Property-Exemplification Account of Events
    1. Constitutive Object or Region
    2. Properties
    3. Excessive Fine-Grainedness
      1. The Official Line
      2. The Fallback Position
    4. Is the Constitutive Object (Time, Property) Essential?
  2. Davidson’s Theories of Events
    1. The Causal Criterion
    2. The Spatiotemporal Criterion
    3. Events or Objects?
    4. Davidson and Ontological Commitment to Events
  3. David Lewis’s Theory of Events
    1. Preliminaries
    2. The Details of Lewis’ Theory
      1. A Non-Duplication Principle
      2. Regions
      3. Event Essences
      4. Fine-Grainedness and Logical Relations Between Events
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Kim’s Property-Exemplification Account of Events

Events, according to Kim, are structured: they are constituted by an object (or number of objects), a property or relation, and a time (or an interval of time). For simplicity, the discussion will be restricted to monadic events, that is, events with a monadic property exemplified by a single object at a time. Kim’s theory of events consists of two basic principles, the first states the conditions under which any given event exists, the second gives the conditions under which events are identical. In stating the principles Kim represents events by expressions of the form

[x, P, t]

where the operator “[. . .]” is intended to be a special case of the description operator, read “the unique event, x’s having P at t.” Kim’s two principles are the following:

Existence Condition: [x, P, t] exists iff object x exemplifies the n-adic property P at time t.

That is, the unique event of object x’s having property P at time t exists if and only if the object x has P at a given time.

The second principle is the following:

Identity Condition: [x, P,t] = [y,Q, t'] iff x = y, P = Q, and t = t’.

This principle reads: the unique event, x’s having P at a given time t, is identical to the unique event, y’s having Q at a given time t’, if and only if x is identical to y, P is identical to Q, and t is identical to t’. It is sometimes also called the “non-duplication principle.”

According to Kim, (i) events are non-repeatable, concrete particulars, including not only changes but also states and conditions. (ii) Each event has a spatiotemporal location. (iii) Although events may exemplify any number of properties, only one property, the constitutive property, individuates the event. The constitutive properties are not exemplified by the event, but are exemplified by the constitutive substance:

Events themselves have (exemplify) properties; Brutus’ stabbing Caesar has the property of occurring in Rome, it was intentional, it led to the death of Caesar and caused grief in Calpurnia, and so on…. The properties an event exemplifies must be sharply distinguished from its constitutive property (which is exemplified, not by an event, but by the constitutive substance of the event)…. (Kim, 1993, p. 170).

With this in mind we might call attention to the difference between an event’s exemplifying a property from an event’s being an exemplification of a property. According to Kim the event is an exemplification of only the constitutive property while the event exemplifies any number of non-constitutive properties. (iv) Kim gets a type-token relation for events by regarding the constitutive property as the generic event. Particular exemplifications of the constitutive property by a constitutive object are tokens of the generic event. (v) Kimean events are not just ordered triples of the form . Consider the event of Oedipus’ marrying Jocasta at t. A triple exists when Oedipus,t, and marrying Jocasta exist. But the triple can exist while the event does not, namely, Oedipus may fail to have the property, marrying Jocasta, at t.

What follows are the main criticisms of Kim’s theory of events.

a. Constitutive Object or Region

Myles Brand criticizes the account for not being able to accommodate the intuition many have that an event might not have a constitutive object: “Leaving aside the controversial case of mental events, there are changing weather conditions, changing light conditions, changing fields, and so on.” (Brand, 1997, 335) Brand suggests that Kim modify his account by taking spatiotemporal regions as the constituents of events, rather saying that objects are the constituents. So, if an event involves a flash of lightning or a magnetic field increasing in strength, the event occupies (at minimum) the space in which the flash or field increase occurs. It is certainly open to Kim to modify his theory accordingly.

b. Properties

Since, on Kim’s view, events are property exemplifications, a natural question to ask is: what sorts of properties are acceptable as constitutive properties (and thereby as event types)? Kim provides little specification of what sort of view of properties the theory is to be wedded to. Indeed, Kim’s discussion of events does not even specify whether such properties are universals, tropes (as non-repeatables), natural classes, or something else. (Readers unfamiliar with the different views on the nature of properties should see Oliver, 1996). And we might ask whether the properties are sparse (such as Armstrong’s theory of universals) or abundant, corresponding to every predicate (or nearly every predicate). (Again, see Oliver, 1996). The following passage gives us a rough idea how Kim would answer this latter question:

. . . [T]he basic generic events may be best picked out relative to a scientific theory, whether the theory is a common-sense theory of the behavior of middle-sized objects or a highly sophisticated physical theory. They are among the important properties, relative to the theory, in terms of which lawful regularities can be discovered, described, and explained. The basic parameters in terms of which the laws of the theory are formulated would, on this view, give us our basic generic events, and the usual logical, mathematical, and perhaps other types of operations on them would yield complex, defined generic events. We commonly recognize such properties as motion, colors, temperatures, weights, pushing, and breaking, as generic events and states, but we must view this against the background of our common-sense explanatory and predictive scheme of the world around us. I think it highly likely that we cannot pick out generic events completely a priori. (Kim,1993, p.37)

So Kim would like a theory of events which provides a framework to develop theories of causation, explanation, and to explore the mind-body problem and the relation between micro and macro events more generally (Kim,1993, p.36). Such desiderata seem reasonable and, at least at first blush, Kim’s rough gesturing at a notion of properties seems suitable to such desiderata.

This passage also tells us that Kim is open to the view that an answer to the question, “What properties are there?” might involve an a posteriori element, left to scientific theory. But there are further issues that a proponent of the exemplification theory should eventually address. For instance, which properties can be constitutive of events? (i) If the account of properties selected allows that (purported) properties like being equal to the square root of two are in fact properties, such properties do not seem to be properties that can constitute events. (Brand, 1997, p. 335) (ii) If walking is a property constitutive of events, is walking slowly? (We will turn to ii. shortly).

Myles Brand has criticized the property exemplification view because it lacks a criterion for property identity. (Brand, 1997, p. 335) The problem is that Kim’s account is incomplete because we cannot determine when events are identical. We cannot do this because we do not know when they have the same properties. This objection may strike one as weak because it seems to require too much of the property exemplification account. As Brand notes “. . . solutions to a number of central philosophical problems — for instance the mind-body problem, scientific theory reduction and meaning change — also require identity conditions for properties.” (Brand, 1997, p.335) It seems excessive to require Kim to solve such problems to give a viable theory of events. We now turn to more serious criticisms of the theory.

c. Excessive Fine-Grainedness

Although Kim’s above passage gives us a better idea of what sorts of properties constitute events, it does not answer the following question: if “F” is a predicate or verb designating some generic event, (e.g., walking), and “M” is a predicate modifier, (e.g., slowly) does “M(F)” name a new generic event (walking slowly), or does the modifier indicate that the generic event (the walk) exemplifies the property (being slow)? If Sebastian strolls leisurely through the streets of Bologna at t is the stroll the same event as the leisurely stroll? Most people’s intuition is that they are the same event. Let’s call the need for a satisfactory answer to this question “The Problem of Predicate Modification.”

Indeed, the most serious criticism of Kim’s theory is that it yields events that are too fine-grained. That is, events are regarded as being distinct that, intuitively, are the same event. There are two basic types of prolificacy that worry critics. (i) First, there is the Problem of Predicate Modification. (ii) Second, there are sorts of prolificacy not arising from the M(F) operation but from the question: if S does x by doing y is S’s doing x the same event as S’s doing y? Let’s begin with a discussion of type (ii) cases.

Type (ii) prolificacy. To employ a well-known example, on Kim’s view the stabbing of Caesar is a different event from the killing of Caesar, because the properties of being a stabbing and being a killing are, by any reasonable account of property individuation, distinct. (Bennett, 1991) The criticism begins by noting that it is a historical fact that the method of killing was a stabbing. The critic interprets this as saying that the properties were co-instantiated. To this the critic adds that co-instantiation is sufficient for property identity, although, not, of course, sufficient for event identity. Kim’s account of events turns events into property tokens, getting the nature of events wrong. (Bennett, 1991)

Jonathan Bennett provides a detailed objection along such lines, but adding an additional, informative element to his claim that Kimean events are too fine-grained. First, his general claim:

Kim maintains that two nominals can pick out a single event only if (roughly speaking) their predicative parts are equivalent: so it cannot be true that the kick he gave her was the assault he made on her. I argue against this, contending that most of Kim’s prima facie evidence for it depends on his running events together with facts. It is beyond dispute that his kicking her is not the same as his assaulting her, these being different facts. (Bennett,1991, p.626)

His contention that Kim conflates events and facts is fueled by an informative distinction between imperfect and perfect nominals, which he links to a distinction between fact language and event language, respectively:

Following Vendler, I take it that these [event names] will be perfect and not imperfect nominals. Quisling’s betrayal of Norway (perfect) was an event; Quisling’s betraying Norway (imperfect) is a fact, namely the fact that Quisling betrayed Norway. Quisling’s betraying Norway is different from his doing Norway a disservice; these are two facts. His betrayal of Norway was his disservice to Norway; there was only the one event. (Bennett,1991, p. 625)

Perfect nominals, according to Vendler’s research, are our main device for event talk, passing all of the tests for being an event sortal. (Bennett, 1998, p. 6) (However, it should be noted that not all perfect nominals name events. For discussion of this see Bennett, 1988, p. 7). In contrast, imperfect nominals never refer to events because they “. . . don’t behave syntactically as though they were applicable to located particulars: they don’t take articles or attributive adjective, they don’t have plural forms, and so on. Their semantic behavior is wrong too: they don’t go comfortably into contexts about being observed, occurring at stated times or lasting for stated periods, and so on.” (Bennett, 1988, p.7) Instead of naming events imperfect nominals name facts (that is, states of affairs that obtain) and more generally, states of affairs. Vendler and Bennett provide the following argument to the conclusion that imperfect nominals name facts. First, they claim that there is a sort of imperfect nominal that contains a complete sentence in it, sentence nominals, which function as noun phrases which pass all the tests for being imperfect nominals. Bennett takes it that such constructions name facts. He calls these “that [S] constructions.” Bennett further claims:

I contend that any sentence using an imperfect gerundial nominal is synonymous with one in which that gerundial nominals work is done instead by a “that [S] nominal. Test this, and if you find no counterexamples you will agree that imperfect gerundial nominals are basically interchangeable with “that [S] nominals and are therefore names of facts. If you do find counterexamples, Vendler and I must back off, saying merely that many gerundial imperfect nominals name facts and that none name events, and it will be a further problem to know what marks of the fact names from the rest. But I shall stay with the stronger claim until it is refuted. (Bennett, 1988, p.8)

Bennett applies his claim that perfect nominals are our main device for referring to event kinds while imperfect nominals always refer to facts to help settle the dispute concerning type (ii) prolificacy cases. Bennett illustrates how the distinction is useful with respect to this issue by calling our attention to the following interchange between Kim and Davidson:

It is not at all absurd to say that Brutus’ killing Caesar is not the same as Brutus’ stabbing Caesar. Further, to explain Brutus’ killing Caesar (why Brutus killed Caesar) is not the same as to explain Brutus’ stabbing Caesar (why Brutus stabbed Caesar). (Kim, 1993, p 232)

Davidson remarks:

I turn. . . to Kim’s remark that it is not absurd to say that Brutus’ killing Caesar is not the same as Brutus’ stabbing Caesar. The plausibility of this is due, I think, to the undisputed fact that not all stabbings are killings. . . . But [this does not show] that this particular stabbing was not a killing. Brutus’ stabbing of Caesar did result in Caesar’s death so it was in fact, though not of course necessarily, identical with Brutus’ killing of Caesar. (Davidson, 1980, p. 171)

It does appear that, as Bennett aptly puts it, while Kim is saying true things about facts, Davidson is saying true things about events. The provisional conclusion that I draw on the criticism that Kimean events turn events into facts, getting the nature of events wrong, is the following: if one is impressed by the view that the stabbing of Caesar and the killing of Caesar are the same event then one must make sure that it is not because they find it plausible that Brutus’ killing Caesar and Brutus’ stabbing Caesar are distinct. For Bennett has given us reason to believe that such plausibility derives from the plausible distinctness of facts. (Further, Kim has not disputed Bennett’s distinction or its application to the type (ii) prolificacy dispute). On the other hand, perhaps a proponent of the property-exemplification view would like to dispute the linguistic data, or, instead, claim that while the data capture our ordinary event concept, a philosophical theory of events should not seek to satisfy the ordinary event concept, but should instead engage in a conceptual revision.

Type (i) prolificacy. Although Kim is not interested in renouncing the prolificacy of type (ii) he believes that it is a more serious matter that his view might allow adverbial modification to give rise to distinct generic events, (e.g., Sebastian’s strolling and Sebastian’s strolling leisurely are distinct events). That is, he takes such cases as being more plausible examples of excessive fine-grainedness: “it is more plausible to deny identity in cases like it (the stabbing case) than in cases like Sebastian’s stroll and Sebastian’s leisurely stroll (where we suppose Sebastian did stroll leisurely).” (Kim,1993, p. 44) Kim does not say why the stabbing case is more plausible case of distinct events; but he is certainly in tandem with most people’s intuitions in this regard. He offers two ways to deal with the Problem of Adverbial Modification, advancing one as “the official line” and the other as a fallback position.

i. The Official Line

Kim’s strategy is to regard the events as being different, but not entirely distinct events, by claiming that leisurely stroll includes the stroll. Kim does not explain the sort of inclusion that he is appealing to. It is certainly a different sort than a type of inclusion that we might normally apply to events: for example, we might conceive of a war as an extended event consisting of a number of battles, a buying a book as a standing at the register and handing the money and so forth. In each of these cases the extended event has the events of shorter duration as temporal parts. We might say that Sebastian’s stroll is like these by stipulating that there was a temporal part of the stroll that was not leisurely — say he leapt over a puddle. But this would be missing the point as one could just specify a different case such that an entire stroll was leisurely. Kim offers the following point to motivate the non-standard sort of event inclusion that he has in mind:

Take this table: the top of the table is not the same thing as the table. So there are two things, but of course one table — in fact, there are lots of things here if you include the legs, the molecules, the atoms, etc., making up the table. (Kim,1993, p. 46)

One can construct individuals, as counterintuitive to the layperson they may be, from the mereological sum of any spatio-temporal parts. But given a particular table, it would be quite odd to claim that the mereological sum of all of its parts is a new individual, and not, instead, that very same individual. Since the stroll and the leisurely stroll occupy the same space-time worm, the analogy with physical objects will not go through: for a physical object x to include distinct physical object y it requires at least one proper part that is had by object x that is not had by object y and that x have all of y’s parts as proper parts. There is no proper part (time-space region) occupied by the stroll that is not also occupied by the leisurely stroll. We thus have motivation for turning to the second option that Kim provides for dealing with the Problem of Adverbial Modification.

ii. The Fallback Position

The remaining option is to deny that modifiers, or at least a certain class of them, give rise to new generic events, instead, they indicate properties of the generic events. (For example, strolling leisurely is not a generic event, but being leisurely is exemplified by Sebastian’s stroll.) Kim views this option as bringing with it a major drawback: namely, it compromises his original motivation for supplying a theory of events in the first place — that events be the sort of entities that enter into causal relations and are objects of explanations: “But it is clear that we may want to explain not only why Sebastian strolled, i.e., Sebastian’s stroll, but also why he strolled leisurely, i.e., his leisurely stroll. Under the approach being considered, the second explanation would be of why Sebastian’s stroll was leisurely; we would be explaining why a certain event had a certain property, not why a certain event occurred.” (Kim,1993, p. 45)

d. Is the Constitutive Object (Time, Property) Essential?

A second major challenge to the property-exemplification view is the claim that it relies on dubious claims about the essential properties of events. Consider the constitutive object: could the very same event, the changing of the guard, have occurred if a guard was a different person? Could it have been the same event if, instead, it was slightly earlier? Both of these questions raise plausible possibilities.

Kim agrees that the time is not an essential feature of certain events : “it seems correct to say that the stroll could have occurred a little earlier or later than it actually did.”(Kim,1993, p. 48) Kim is also sympathetic to the claim that the property is not essential, although his concern is limited to cases in which modifiers give rise to new generic events. (Kim,1993, p. 47) However, Kim rejects the view that the constitutive substance is not essential.

The fact that someone other than Sebastian could have taken a stroll in his place does not make it the case that the very stroll that Sebastian took could have been taken by someone else. If Mario had been chosen to stroll that night, then there would have been another stroll, namely Mario’s. (Kim, 1993, p. 48)

One natural reaction is to disagree with this assessment because it seems plausible that in the changing of the guard case, the very same event, the changing of the guard, could have occurred if a guard was a different person. But perhaps it is better to not haggle intuitions; the real issue is how Kim, of all people, can be sympathetic to challenges to the non-essentiality of the constitutive time and property. Doesn’t he have to deny this? The matter hinges on whether it is plausible, as Kim seems to believe, that the following claims be held in tandem:

(1) The constitutive time and (in cases of modification) the constitutive property are non-essential

(2) Both of the following are true:

Identity Condition: [x, P,t] = [y,Q, t'] iff x = y, P = Q, and t = t’.

Existence Condition: [x, P, t] exists (occurs) iff object x exemplifies the n-adic property P at time t.

Begin with the first condition. Identity Conditions do not need to entirely specify an entity’s nature. As Kim notes: “It is at least a respectable identity criterion for physical objects that they are the same just in case they are completely coincident in space and time. From this it does not follow that a physically object is essentially where and when it in fact is.” (Kim,1993, p.48) Now consider the Existence Condition. It tells us something about the modal character of events: events are necessarily exemplifications of properties by objects at times. Kim agrees: “There is an essentialist consequence I am willing to accept: events are, essentially, structured complexes of the sort the theory says they are. Thus, events could not be substances, properties, and so on.” (Kim,1993, p.49) But it doesn’t tell us about the modal character of the event in the following sense: it doesn’t say whether the event can occur without any, or even all, of the constitutive entities. Hence, it doesn’t tell us whether any of the constitutive entities are essential. From these observations once can conclude that the conjunction of (1) and (2) are consistent. Consistent, but informative? Although our brief discussion concludes with the observation that Kim avoids a serious criticism, the discussion has also raised the point that Kim has only given a partial specification of the nature of events. To fully specify the nature of events more needs to be said about the modal character of the constitutive entities. Here, intuition haggling comes into play. As Kim comments, on this score, “the general problem is still open.” (Kim,1993, p.49)

2. Davidson’s Theories of Events

Kim defends a relatively fine grained theory of events, but Davidson types events in a rather coarse way. Davidson has advanced two conditions. Initially, he proposed the principle that no two events can have exactly the same causes and effects. Then, after discarding this principle, he proposed that no two events can occur in exactly the same space-time zone, a view which Quine also advanced. The following sections evaluate both non-duplication principles. The discussion of Davidson’s work on events concludes with some general remarks about his influential argument for the existence of events from the use of action sentences.

a. The Causal Criterion

In “The Individuation of Events,” Davidson sets himself the task of determining a criterion for the sameness and difference of events, where events are understood as particular, non-repeatable occurrences. After considering and rejecting various proposals Davidson settles on the following:

(DT1) events are identical iff they have exactly the same causes and effects

Noting “an air of circularity” about this suggestion, he formulates (DT1) as the following:

(DT1′) (Ax)(Ay)(Az)[x = y iff (z caused x iff z caused y) and (x caused z iff y caused z)]

He then writes: “No identities appear on the right of the biconditional.” (Davidson, 1980, p.179) Well, this is true, but (DT’) is nonetheless circular because, of course, x,y and z are events. The circularity is not excisable either, for the gist of Davidson’s suggestion is that events can be individuated by their causes and effects, but what is a cause or effect, for Davidson, if not an event? Davidson claims (inter alia) that events e and e’ are identical only if e and e’ have all the same causes. But causes are events, and to determine if e and e’ have the same causes we need to determine whether each of e’s causes has all the same effects as some cause that e’ has. And among these effects are e and e’, the very events we are trying to distinguish or, alternately, identify. (Lombard, 1998)

Davidson later concedes that (DT1′) is indeed circular and, in light of this, moves to a theory that he had previously rejected in his discussion of Lemmon’s proposal at (Davidson, 1980, p.178).

b. The Spatiotemporal Criterion

Lemmon’s proposal was:

(DT2) events are identical iff they occur in the same space at the same time

Davidson had previously rejected (DT2) because “. . . I thought one might want to hold that two different events used up the same portion of space-time. . .” (Davidson, 1985, p.175) Davidson’s discussion of Lemmon’s proposal will come back to haunt him. In particular, Davidson provided an intriguing example. This example, many believe, is decisive against DT2, the proposal that Davidson himself continued to favor.

Doubt comes easily in the case of events, for it seems natural to say that two different changes can come over the whole of a substance at the same time. For example, if a metal ball becomes warmer during a certain minute, and during the same minute rotates through 35 degrees, must we say that these are the same event? (Davidson, 1980, p.178)

There are two ways of interpreting the example which the discussions of this example sometimes fails to distinguish. Let us begin with one specification, which we will discard as not even superficially challenging the view that there can be different events in the same spacetime location.

(i) The rotation, although occurring during the same minute, temporally precedes the warming. This interpretation takes “at the same time” in the above passage as meaning, “during the same minute.” This could happen if both events occur at, say, 2:51 and the rotating precedes the warming by, say, ten seconds. This seems to be Simone Evnine’s interpretation of the case. (Evnine, 1991, p. 29) This reading of the problem is much easier to solve because the events would be (at least partly) spatiotemporally distinct. Evnine’s interpretation was probably encouraged by the fact that rotating an object will cause the object to warm slightly, in such cases the rotating will precede the warming. It doesn’t seem useful to conceive of the example in this way because it is not, even at first blush, a potential counterexample to the sufficiency of spacetime location for sameness of event because the spacetime locations obviously differ, although they partly overlap.

(ii) It may be suggested that we forget that rotating causes slight warming, and suppose, for the sake of argument, that some additional warming of the object occurs at the same time as the object rotates. Although Davidson does not note this, we can fairly construe his puzzle as being about the additional warming and its having the same spatiotemporal location as the rotating. We have the strong intuition that the additional warming (hereafter “warming”) and the rotating are different events; this is the interesting interpretation of the case because it raises a potential counterexample to (DT2).

Construed in this way, the matter is quite tricky. First, a general observation. When things warm up their molecules randomly jiggle about. This is a different sort of molecular motion than is involved in a thing’s rotating. Given this observation, it might seem like (DT2) is not challenged by the example, after all. One might have the belief that, given this observation, there should be some way to prove that different, (but not completely distinct), spacetime regions are involved. It is natural to be skeptical that such a maneuver is available, however. The same molecules that are randomly jiggling about, because of the heating, are also revolving. Similarly, one cannot assign different spacetime regions to Joe’s Northeasterly walk, although it is, in a sense, both a Northerly walk and an Easterly walk. So this appears to be a counterexample to Davidson’s proposal.

Now, assuming that one is a proponent of DT2, how should one respond to Davidson’s own example of a top’s spinning and heating up? The proponent could swallow the unintuitive result that the spinning and the heating are very same event, saying that DT2 is still in the running, as a non-duplication, principle, because other leading theories of events also have counterintuitive results in some cases. For recall that Kim holds that

(KT) [x,P,t] exists (occurs) iff object x exemplifies the n-adic property p at time t.

On this view the stabbing of Caesar is a different event from the killing of Caesar because the properties are distinct (according to any plausible property theory). This strikes many as being too fine-grained; the killing and the stabbing are not distinct events, although being a killing and being a stabbing are distinct properties. Selecting a theory of events involves an all-things considered judgment that weighs the various strengths and weaknesses of the competing theories. If other non-duplication principles have equally counterintuitive results, then, ceteris paribus, DT2 is still in the running.

c. Events or Objects?

Any critical evaluation of Davidson’s theory of events should (at least briefly) consider the other influential objection to DT2. A common view is that objects are identical if and only if they occupy the same space-time location. And this is precisely DT2, causing some to believe that it gets the nature of events wrong. The objector’s intuition that events are not objects is grounded in the view that events are occurrences and objects are not. So, by Leibniz’ Law, events and objects are distinct. For Davidson’s position to be convincing he needs to explain away the strong intuition that events are occurrences and objects are not. Davidson is concerned with the conflation, and in light of it offers the following suggestion:

. . . events and objects may be related to locations in spacetime in different ways; it may be, for example, that events occur at a time in a place while objects occupy places at times.

Occupying the same portion of spacetime, event and object differ. One is an object which remains the same object through changes, the other a change in an object or objects. Spatiotemporal areas do not distinguish them, but our predicates, our basic grammar, our ways of sorting do. Given my interest in the metaphysics implicit in our language, this is a distinction I do not want to give up. (Davidson, 1980, pp.176)

It does seem correct that when we conceive of events, we generally think of changes, or occurrences. This feature seems to rest at the kernel of our event-concept.

Evnine’s reaction to Davidson’s claim is that “this attempt to resist the assimilation of events to objects will only work if we are able to make a convincing distinction between occurring and occupying which does not itself rely on the distinction between events and objects.” (Evnine, 1991, p. 31) If Evnine is suggesting that an account of events would be circular should it fail to cash out the notion of occurring in a way that doesn’t presuppose eventhood this is not an entirely decisive objection — the concept of an occurrence could simply be taken as primitive in an analysis. However, some would find it unattractive that an unexplained notion, and one that seems so close to the concept of an event, that of an occurrence, is doing all the work in dividing objects from events.

The following, more decisive objection to Davidson’s suggestion may occur to one: there is an intuitive distinction between occurring and occupying — we see events unfold and objects occupy spaces — but it is important to note that many, including Lewis and Kim, consider events, as a metaphysical category, to include some non-happenings or non-occurrence as well as all happenings. And Bennett notes that Davidson himself has “never said that events must be changes and . . . did once express tolerance for the idea of such movements as standing fast.’” (Bennett, 1988, p.176, quoting Davidson) Davidson’s manner of distinguishing events from objects, in so far as it involves the claim that events are essentially occurrences, seems, at least at first blush, incompatible with the view that events are non-occurrences. If Davidson believes that some non-occurrences are events then, in order to preserve his original point, in addition to telling us more about his occurrence/occupation distinction he needs to answer the question: if non-occurrences can be events why are such non-occurrences not objects? Perhaps the only manner of preserving the idea that events are an ontological kind is by renouncing the view that some non-occurrences are events.

At this point it is not clear if Davidson would be interested in doing so. Here I can only gesture in the direction of a possible difficulty. In his chapter on adverbial modification, Bennett suggests that Davidson needs to consider unchanging events in order to

. . . smooth the way for applying his theory to many uses of adverbs to modify not verbs but adjectives. ‘Marvin was icily silent’ entails ‘Marvin was silent’ and it would be uncomfortable for a Davidsonian to have to exclude such entailments from the scope of his theory. It would be better for him to say that the former sentence had the form: For some x: x was an episode of silence, and Marvin was the subject of x, and x was icy. (Bennett, 1988, p.76)

It is likely that the Davidsonian would be interested in applying his theory to uses of adverbs that modify adjectives. This attractive feature will have to be balanced against any desire to distinguish events from objects.

d. Davidson and Ontological Commitment to Events

Finally, in our discussion thus far the existence of events has been taken for granted, the issue being how to individuate them. But Davidson’s work on events is not limited to a defense of a non-duplication principle, indeed, he argues that we need to posit events (inter alia) to explain the meanings of statements employing adverbial modifiers. In “The Individuation of Events” he writes:

. . . without events it does not seem possible to give a natural and acceptable account of the logical form of certain sentences of the most common sorts; it does not seem possible, that is, to show how the meanings of such sentences depend upon their composition. The situation may be sketched as follows. it is clear that the sentence ‘Sebastian strolled through the streets of Bologna at 2 a.m.” entails “Sebastian strolled through the streets of Bologna”, and does so by virtue of its logical form. This requires, it would seem, that the patent syntactical fact that the entailed sentence is contained in the entailing sentence be reflected in the logical form we assign to each sentence. Yet the usual way of formalizing these sentences does not show any such feature: it directs us to consider the first sentence as containing an irreducibly three-place predicate ‘x strolled through y at t’ while the second contains the unrelated predicate ‘x strolled through y.’ (Davidson, 1980, p.166-7)

Davidson suggests that we solve this puzzle by accepting the intuitive idea that “there are things like falls, devourings, and strolls for sentences such as these to be about.” The sentence

Sebastian strolled though the streets of Bologna at 2 a.m.

has the following logical form:

There is an event x such that Sebastian strolled x, x took place in the streets of Bologna, and x was going on at 2 a.m.

This logical form yields the problematic entailments. Davidson’s view is that this correct logical form for action sentences motivates the ontological commitment to events because quantification over a kind of entity involves an ontological commitment to the existence of entities of that kind.

Is Davidson’s argument plausible? (i) Although it is plausible in standard cases, it is unclear how Davidson’s account can be extended to manage various sorts of nonstandard modifiers. How, for instance, will Davidson analyze (S)”Sebastian almost strolled” to reveal that (S) entails “Sebastian didn’t stroll”? (ii) Terry Horgan objects that Davidson’s account is counterintuitive because most adverb constructions do not contain explicit quantification over events. (Horgan,1978, p.47) Horgan is correct, and in light of this, Davidson’s argument is significantly weakened if there is an equally attractive or (more damaging yet) superior alternate account of adverbial modification available that does not involve quantification over events. In light of (i) we can add that a competing account would be even more attractive if it could handle non-standard cases of modification that Davidson’s theory, as it stands, does not.

Indeed, Horgan has formulated an alternate account that does not involve quantification over events. (Horgan, 1978) Romane Clark’s has proposed an extension of standard first order quantification theory to handle predicate modification. (Clark, 1970) Horgan’s alternate account involves modifying Clark’s proposal in such a way that it does not appeal to states of affairs, which are frequently taken as ontological kinds that are either ontologically equivalent to events or include events as a subcategory. Instead, Horgan appeals to set theory, which is already appealed to in formal semantics. In light of this should we apply Occam’s Razor and deny the existence of events? This move would be premature. Davidson has provided a number of other reasons to quantify over events: “I do not believe we can give a cogent account of action, of explanation, of causality, or of the relation between the mental and the physical unless we accept events as individuals.”(Davidson, 1980, p.165) If any of these other considerations are apt, then quantification over events would be in order even if the Horgan/Clark proposal is superior, on balance, to Davidson’s account. Should all of the other considerations fail, the issue will turn on the problem of adverbial modification and any decision on this matter surely requires a detailed treatment of the relative advantages and disadvantages of each of the proposals.

This concludes the treatment of Davidson’s extensive work on events. Davidson obviously takes events very seriously, going as far as arguing that there are a number of reasons to quantify over them. Lewis, in contrast, has a rather opportunistic approach to events: he fashions a theory of events primarily to suit the theoretical needs of his theories of explanation and causation. Nonetheless, Lewis’s theory is regarded by many as being important in its own right.

3. David Lewis’s Theory of Events

The core conception of Lewis’ theory of events is that an event is a property of spatiotemporal regions. (Lewis, 1986, p. 244) Properties, like events, are not basic to Lewis’ ontological scheme. Lewis holds that, “By a property I mean simply a class. To have the property is to belong to the class. All the things that have the property, whether actual or merely possible, belong…The property that corresponds to an event, then, is the class of all regions, at most one per world – where the event occurs.” (Lewis, 1986, 244) This being said, Lewis proposes the following necessary condition for some entity e’s being an event:

(LT) e is an event only if it is a class of spatio-temporal regions, both thisworldy (assuming it occurs in the actual world) and otherworldly.

(LT) is a rough, first approximation of a theory of events. It only tells us which entities are formally eligible to be events — only such entities that are a class of thisworldly (assuming it occurs) and otherworldly spacetime regions. Any member of the class that is the event “occurs”; the event, itself, understood as the class, doesn’t occur. This would be a kind of category mistake because classes, as abstract entities, don’t occur, although they can exist.

We can get an intuitive grip on (LT) by noting a certain commonality with the previously discussed Quine-Davidson account of events, which holds that events are individuated by their spacetime locations: no two events can occupy the same spacetime location. Recall that one criticism of this theory of events is that it treats the simultaneous rotating and the heating of the sphere as being, counterintuitively, the same event. It can be noted that, in contrast, this is not a drawback for Lewis’ account. The Quine-Davidson account identified an event with a certain spacetime region; Lewis, in contrast, can say that an occurrence of an event can be located in the same region that another event is, claiming that the events, as classes, are nonetheless distinct because there will be some member that is in class A that is not in class B, namely, an occurrence in some region that is a member of A and not B. (Here, it is important to bear in mind that the different regions may be at different possible worlds). So it is available to Lewis to characterize the well known case of the sphere that both heats and spins at t as involving two distinct events because the rotating includes otherworldly regions that the heating does not include. So far, so good for Lewis.

But before going further into the strengths and weaknesses of the theory, it is necessary to say more about the theory.

a. Preliminaries

A few preliminary remarks about the process of evaluating Lewis’ theory are useful to keep in mind. As noted, Lewis is an event-opportunist, if you will, letting his interest in explanation and especially, his counterfactual analysis of causation dictate his theory of events; Bennett captures Lewis’ route nicely:

There remains the less ambitious course of basing judgments about the essences of events on the counterfactual analysis of event causation: start with our firm beliefs about what causes what, put them into their counterfactual form in accordance with the analysis and draw conclusions about what the essences of events must be like if we are not to be convicted of too much error in our causal beliefs. That is the third of my three approaches, and it is the one that Lewis adopts. (Bennett, 1988, p.61)

At least at first blush, there seem to be nothing objectionable about this route into events. After all, even Bennett has urged that our ordinary notion of events is not a notion that leads to a useful philosophical theory of events. Why not, then, begin elsewhere? Perhaps Lewis is less ambitious, but commendably more realistic.

Given this route of entry into a theory of events it is natural that those who are interested in Lewis’ influential counterfactual theory of causation would have a particular interest in his theory of events. (Lewis, 1970) Of course, even with a strong antecedent interest in Lewis’s theories of causation and explanation, one might nonetheless turn away from Lewis’s theory if it entails Modal Realism. Those who reject Modal Realism would agree that the following desideratum is a requirement that Lewis’ theory of events must satisfy:

D1: That the theory of events be formulable within the ersatz framework.

As is well known, Lewis is operating with a controversial notion of “possible world” according to which possible worlds are as real as this world, some containing flesh and blood creatures, solid mountains and planets, and so forth. Such worlds are non-actual in the sense that they are not in our world, but they are equally real as our world is. A world, according to Lewis, is a big object containing all objects that exist there as parts. (Lewis, 1986, p.69) So a world with a talking donkey is a world that has a talking donkey as a literal part.

Ersatzers attempt to avoid commitment to Lewis’ possible worlds, reducing possible worlds to other, more acceptable (but in at least some cases still controversial) sorts of entities. (Armstrong, 1989; Loux, 1980; Plantinga, 1976) Ersatz views hold that instead of a plurality of worlds in the modal realist’s sense, there is only one concrete world, with various abstract entities representing ways that our world might have been. Such theories are actualist; they hold that the actual entities represent (in some sense of the word) possibilia. Ersatz views take the abstract-concrete distinction as being well understood, taking the world and the entities that occupy it as being concrete, and taking the representations of the concrete entities as being abstract. There is one correct abstract representation and there are many misrepresentations; the former represents the concrete world, the misrepresentations of the actual world represent the various ways the concrete world might have been.

There are many ersatzers, although not all of the same variety; in contrast, there was only one modal realist — Lewis himself. (For a variety of ersatz theories see Loux, 1980) So it seems fair to say that D1 must be met by Lewis’ theory of events. If it turns out otherwise, even if the theory is clear and consistent, there will be very few adherents to the account of events. The following section lays out the basic details of the theory, then attention focuses on whether D1 is indeed satisfied.

b. The Details of Lewis’ Theory

We have investigated Lewis’s claim that some entity is an event only if it is a class of spatio-temporal regions, both thisworldly and otherworldy. We now turn to four more features of the theory.

i. A Non-Duplication Principle

From (LT), the axiom of extensionality, (which holds that two sets are identical if and only if they have all the same members) and the predicate logic, we can derive a non-duplication principle for Lewis events. Recalling that Lewis events are classes we can say:

(NP) (x)(y)(where x and y are events, x and y are different events if and only if there is at least one member of x that is not a member of y, (or vice versa)).

It is important to note that although (NP) may judge two events to be different, it is consistent with (NP) that they not be entirely distinct in the sense that one event may be a proper subset of another. Here the term “different” is used in the sense of “non-identical.” Think of “different” as meaning, “at least partly distinct.”

ii. Regions

Lewis outlines several features of the operative notion of spacetime regions: “An event occurs in a particular spatiotemporal region. Its region might be small or large; there are collisions of point particles and there are condensations of galaxies, but even the latter occupy regions small by astronomical standards.” (Lewis,1983, p. 243) Still, there are certain specifications on what can count as a region, namely, that no event occur in two different regions of a world and that an event occupy an entire region; in other words, an event can’t occur in any proper part of a region, although parts of it can. (Lewis, 1983, p.243) Lewis leaves it open whether any region is a region in which an event can occur, writing: “A smallish, connected, convex region may seem a more likely candidate than a widely scattered part of spacetime. But I leave this question unsettled, for lack of clear cases.” (Lewis, 1983, p. 243). It is not clear that there really aren’t cases that decide the issue: consider the televising of the Superbowl, it seems scattered throughout the regions of multiple homes, bars, and so forth. This seems a clear case of a very scattered event, although every part of the event is spatially connected.

Lewis says that his theory of events relies on the following assumption:

(A) Regions are individuals that are parts of possible worlds.

He admits that this is controversial but says that he need not defend (A) in his present discussion of events. Given the aforementioned Modal Realist view of possible worlds, we can appreciate the controversial nature of (A).

Now let us ask, can assumption (A) be recast in terms of an ersatz conception of possible worlds? It appears so; indeed, we will now see that desideratum (D1) can be met. That is, the theory of events, including assumption (A), can be recast in terms of an ersatz theory of possible worlds. This point will be illustrated by using a version of linguistic ersatzism.

“Linguistic ersatzism” (LE) is the generic name for the family of modal theories that takes worlds as being constructions out of words of a language; in broad strokes, possibilities are represented via the meanings that words are given. For instance, a typical LE view takes worlds as being maximal consistent sets of sentences (where a set S is maximal iff for every sentence B, S contains either it or its negation, and S is consistent iff it is possible for all the members of S to be true together). Notice that in contrast to Modal Realism, the building blocks of this typical linguistic ersatz view involve relatively uncontroversial entities (sentences and sets of things). (Of course, someone who appeals to ersatz worlds will have her own ontological scheme that is to account for such uncontroversial entities. The particular details will differ – the important thing is that ersatzism, unlike Modal Realism, does not prima facie require anything metaphysically ornate). So let us assume an ersatz theory along the above, generic, lines. As Lewis suggests, the linguistic ersatzer can take a possible individual as a maximal consistent set of open sentences. (Lewis, 1986, p.149) For instance consider what open sentences correspond to Ersatz Hunter Thompson:

Ersatz Thompson: {x is 6′ tall, x is the author of Fear and Loathing in Las Vegas, x is in LA on 4/5/77, …}

The set is consistent because it is possible for there to be an object such that all of the open sentences are true of it. It is maximal because for every open sentence with only “x” as the free variable the set contains either the sentence or its negation. We could do the same for regions. In this way regions are not mereological parts of possible worlds but are instead, subsets of ersatz possible worlds taken as sets. So (A) can be modified this way:

(A) Regions are individuals that are subsets of possible worlds.

where “possible worlds” refers to ersatz worlds, e.g., on the view considered here, maximally consistent sets of sentences. We can also understand the following condition

(LT) e is an event only if it is a set of spatio-temporal regions, both thisworldy (assuming it occurs in the actual world ) and otherworldly

As involving sets containing sets (regions according to (A), as members).

Finally, we can note that although Lewis reduces events to properties, and properties to classes of actual and otherworldy regions, the ersatzer need not adopt Lewis’ conception of properties to adopt (LT), but can just skip the intermediate step of Lewis’ reduction, taking events as classes of regions. Why is this important? First, the ersatzer may reject Lewis’ account of properties. Second, doing so avoids circularity worries for the proponents of ersatz theories that employ properties in constructing possible worlds (e.g., Armstrong, Plantinga). (Armstrong, 1989; Plantinga,1976) In any case, even if one wants or needs to adopt Lewis’ conception of properties, perhaps the direction of explanation could still be preserved if one adopts two conceptions of properties as Lewis does, one sparse and one abundant, employing the sparse conception in formulating the modal theory. But the ersatzer need not even do this.

iii. Event Essences

Lewis rejects the view that events are structured entities constituted by an essential time, object and property. Consider the nominalization “the death of Socrates at t”, while we may pick out the event, Socrates’ death, by this nominalization, it is conceivable that the very same death happened sooner. Now it might be reasonable, in this case, to say that the very same event couldn’t have had a different (so called) “constitutive” individual or property, but there seem to be other cases suggesting that the “constitutive” property and individual are also problematic: e. g, the firing squad shooting was done by Ned but it could have been done by Ted; the strolling could have been a striding. But this is not to say that Lewis is claiming that events don’t have essences; it is just that events aren’t structured in a Kimean way, rather, the essences are read off from the similarity between the members. This latter point is perhaps best illustrated by way of example: according to Lewis an event is essentially a change if and only if for each region something changes in it; an event essentially involves Socrates if and only if Socrates (more specifically, a temporal segment of Socrates’ counterpart) is present in each region; an event essentially occurs in spacetime region R if and only if each member is either R or a counterpart of R, and so on. (Lewis, 1983, p.248-9)

Essences are not to be mainly extrinsic, such as, for instance, an event that is essentially a widowing, nor are they to be overly varied disjuncts, that is, essences like, “an event that is essentially a walking and another that is essentially a talking.” Lewis’ rationale for these requirements stems from his interests in tailoring a theory of events to his accounts of explanation and counterfactuals. For instance, he rules out mainly extrinsic events, using the (purported) event of the widowing of Xantippe as an example, on the following grounds:

They offend our sense of economy. We would seem to count the death of Socrates twice over in our inventory of events. . .(2) they stand in relations of non-causal counterfactual dependence to those genuine events in virtue of which they occur. Without the death of Socrates the widowing of Xanthippe would not have occurred. (She might still have been widowed sooner or later. But recall that the widowing of Xanthippe, as I defined it, had its time essentially.). . .(3) They also stand in relations of non-causal counterfactual dependence to other genuine events, events logically independent of them. Without the widowing of Xanthippe, the subsequent cooling of Socrates’ body would not have occurred. (For in that case he would not have died when he did.) (Lewis, 1983, p.263)

iv. Fine-Grainedness and Logical Relations Between Events

The needs of Lewis’ counterfactual analysis of causation motivate Lewis to adopt a fine-grained notion of event. Suppose that John greets someone, and being rather tense, he says hello loudly. If he wasn’t tense he would have merely said hello softly. Lewis claims that two events of greeting occur:

John says “Hello.” He says it rather too loudly. Arguably there is one event that occurs which is essentially a saying “hello” and only accidentally loud; it would have occurred even if John had spoken softly. Arguably there is a second event that implies, but is not implied by, the first. This event is essentially a saying “Hello” loudly, and it would not have occurred if John had said “Hello” but said it softly. Both events actually occur, but the second could not have occurred without the first. (Lewis, 1983, p.255)

On this view two events of greeting occur, one with a richer essence than the other. The richer event, call it e1, is essentially a loud greeting and would not have occurred if the greeting was soft, e2 is essentially a greeting and is only accidentally loud. It would have occurred if the greeting was soft. As with Kim’s theory, many of those interested in a theory of events that tracks our ordinary event concept would find this result too fine-grained. From the vantage point of Lewis’ interests in his theory this unintuitive result is not a serious problem — again, capturing our ordinary event concept is not Lewis’ stated project. Lewis makes his motivation for the fine-grainedness clear in the following passage:

The real reason why we need both events. . . is that they differ causally. An adequate causal account of what happens cannot limit itself to either one of the two. The first event (the weak one) caused Fred to greet John in return. The second one (the strong one) didn’t. If the second one had not occurred — if John hadn’t said “Hello” so loudly — the first one still might have, in which case Fred still would have returned John’s greeting. Also there is a difference on the side of causes: the second event was, and the first wasn’t, caused inter alia by John’s state of tension. (Lewis, 1983, p. 255)

The rather counterintuitive fine-grainedness seems to be a necessary evil. As it happens, the events are regarded as being different in order that the theory of events can satisfy the needs of Lewis’s theory of causation. But doing so raises a problem: to regard the events as being distinct, when coupled with Lewis’ counterfactual theory of causation, would yield the undesirable result that the first event causes the second. This would be undesirable because the one event implies the other and intuitively, logically related events do not stand in causal relations with each other. Lewis’ way of handling this case is to regard the two events as being different, but not distinct, and to claim that non-distinct events do not stand in causal relations.

4. Conclusion

The selection of a theory of events is not a matter which one decides independently of one’s other metaphysical interests and commitments. In the context of our discussion, we have noted a number of relative strengths and weaknesses which can help to guide the reader’s own selection of a theory of events. Of course, further philosophical developments may yield a theory of events which is more attractive than the approaches discussed here. And there are some truly worthwhile, although less-influential, theories of events that have not been discussed in this article.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David. A Combinatorial Theory of Possibility, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Bennett, Jonathan Francis. Events and Their Names. Indianapolis: Hackett Pub. Co., 1988.
  • Bennett, Jonathan Francis. “Precis of Events and Their Names,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 51 (1991): 625-628.
  • Brand, Myles. “Identity Conditions for Events.” American Philosophical Quarterly 14 (1997): 329-337.
  • Casati, Roberto, Varzi, Achille, “Events,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2002 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL =
  • Clark, Romane. “Concerning the Logic of Predicate Modifiers,” Noûs. 4 (1970): 311-335.
  • Davidson, Donald. Essays on Actions and Events. New York: Oxford University Press, 1980.
  • Davidson, Donald. “Reply to Quine on Events,” In Actions and Events: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. eds. Lepore, E. and B. Mc Laughlin. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, pp. 172-176, 1985.
  • Evnine, Simone. Donald Davidson. Stanford: Stanford Univ. Press, 1991.
  • Horgan, Terence. “The Case Against Events,” Philosophical Review 87 (1978): 28-47.
  • Kim, Jaegwan. Supervenience and Mind: Selected Philosophical Essays. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Lewis, David. Counterfactuals. Oxford: Blackwell, 1973.
  • Lewis, David. “New Work for a Theory of Universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61 (1983): 343-377.
  • Lewis, David. Philosophical Papers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Lewis, David. On the Plurality of Worlds. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1986.
  • Lawrence Lombard, “Ontologies of Events” in Macdonald, Cynthia and Stephen Laurence, Eds. Contemporary Readings in the Foundations of Metaphysics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1998.
  • Loux, Michael. The Possible and the Actual: Readings in the Metaphysics of Modality. New York: Cornell University Press, 1980.
  • Oliver, Alex. “The Metaphysics of Properties,” Mind 105 (1996): 1-80.
  • Plantinga, A., 1976, “Actualism and Possible Worlds,” Theoria 42.
  • Quine, W.V.O. “Events and Reification” in Actions and Events: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. eds. Lepore, E. and B. Mc Laughlin. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, pp. 162-171, 1985.

Author Information

Susan Schneider
Moravian College
U. S. A.

Last updated: November 11, 2005 | Originally published: