Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Evidence

The concept of evidence is crucial to epistemology and the philosophy of science. In epistemology, evidence is often taken to be relevant to justified belief, where the latter, in turn, is typically thought to be necessary for knowledge. Arguably, then, an understanding of evidence is vital for appreciating the two dominant objects of epistemological concern, namely, knowledge and justified belief. In the philosophy of science, evidence is taken to be what confirms or refutes scientific theories, and thereby constitutes our grounds for rationally deciding between competing pictures of the world. In view of this, an understanding of evidence would be indispensable for comprehending the proper functioning of the scientific enterprise.

For these reasons and others, a philosophical appreciation of evidence becomes pressing. Section 1 examines what might be called the nature of evidence. It considers the theoretical roles that evidence plays, with a view towards determining what sort of entity evidence can be—an experience, a proposition, an object, and so on. In doing so, it also considers the extent to which evidence is implicated in justified belief (and by extension, knowledge, if knowledge requires justified belief). Then, section 2 considers the evidential relationship, or the relation between two things by virtue of which one counts as evidence for the other; and it explores the nature of their relationship, that is, whether the relationship is deductive, explanatory, or probabilistic. Finally, equipped with this theoretical background, section 3 looks at some of the important problems and paradoxes that have occupied those working in the theory of evidence.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature of Evidence: What Is It and What Does It Do?
    1. Propositional Evidence in Explanatory, Probabilistic and Deductive Reasoning
    2. Can Experiences Be Evidence? The Regress Argument
    3. Evidence and Justified Belief: A Closer Look
  2. Theories of the Evidential Relation
    1. Probabilistic Theories
    2. Semi-Probabilistic Theories
    3. Qualitative Theories
      1. Hypothetico-Deductivism
      2. Evidence as a Positive Instance
      3. Bootstrapping
  3. Some Problems of Evidence
    1. The Ravens Paradox
      1. Hempel’s “Solution”
      2. A Bayesian Solution
      3. An Error-Statistical Solution
    2. The Grue Paradox
      1. Goodman’s Solution
      2. Achinstein’s Solution
    3. Underdetermination of Theory by Evidence
      1. Underdetermination and Holism: the Duhem-Quine Problem
      2. A Bootstrapping Solution
      3. A Bayesian Solution
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The Nature of Evidence: What Is It and What Does It Do?

When we think about examples of evidence from everyday life, we tend to think of evidence, in the first place, as consisting of an object or set of objects. Consider evidence that might be found at a crime scene: a gun, a bloody knife, a set of fingerprints, or hair, fiber or DNA samples. The same might be said of fossil evidence, or evidence in medicine, such as when an X-ray is evidence that a patient has a tumor, or koplic spots as evidence that a patient has measles. Yet we also consider such things as testimony and scientific studies to be evidence, examples difficult to classify as “objects” since they apparently involve linguistic entities. Possibilities proliferate when we turn to philosophical accounts of evidence, where we find more exotic views on what sort of thing evidence can be. In philosophy, evidence has been taken to consist of such things as experiences, propositions, observation-reports, mental states, states of affairs, and even physiological events, such as the stimulation of one’s sensory surfaces.

Can all of these count as evidence? Few would think so, and basic principles of parsimony seem to militate against it. But given all of the possibilities with which philosophy and everyday life present us, how would we go about making a decision? What kind of consideration could determine the sorts of entities that can count as evidence? A natural strategy to pursue would be to consider the role or function evidence plays in both philosophy and everyday life. That is, perhaps considering what evidence does affords the best clue to what evidence is.

a. Propositional Evidence in Explanatory, Probabilistic and Deductive Reasoning

One way to approach the matter is to consider the role of evidence in certain kinds of reasoning in which we engage. Recently, such a strategy has led Timothy Williamson to the conclusion that evidence must be propositional—that is, that it must consist in a proposition or set of propositions (Williamson 2000, pp. 194-200). Although Williamson declines to give any theoretical account of propositions, minimally we may take propositions to be the bearers of truth and falsity (what is true or false), the contents of assertions (what is said or asserted) and the objects of propositional attitudes (e.g. what is believed or known). More generally, propositions may be taken to be the referents of that-clauses: for instance, I believe or know that the house is on fire; it is true or false that the Orioles won last night; I said or asserted that Jones is a thief; and so on.

To begin with, Williamson points out that evidence is often featured in explanatory reasoning, in the sense that we tend to infer to the hypothesis that provides the best explanation of the evidence. Whatever else evidence may be, then, at the very least it is the kind of thing that hypotheses explain. But what hypotheses explain, Williamson contends, are propositions; we use hypotheses to explain why such-and-such is the case, and so what is explained—the evidence—is that such-and-such is the case. By contrast, it makes no sense whatsoever to explain an object; we cannot explain this knife, for example. What we might explain, however, is something true about this knife, such as that it is bloody. Here, the evidence would be that the knife is bloody—again, a proposition, not an object. Nor, on Williamson’s view, would it make sense to explain a sensory experience. The hypothesis that I have a cold does not explain the tickle in my throat, but would explain why I have a tickle in my throat. Again, what is explained—the evidence—is that I have a tickle in my throat, not the experience itself. Accordingly, if we consider the role of evidence in explanatory reasoning, it seems that evidence is propositional.

Additionally, Williamson claims that we use evidence to engage in explicitly probabilistic reasoning, where such reasoning may or may not be explanatory. For instance, we often compare the probabilities of competing hypotheses H and H’ on a common body of evidence, E. One way to do so would be to consider the ratio:

P(H)P(E/H)
P(H´)P(E/H´)

(In general, the symbols P(X/Y) mean the probability of X given Y). Here, we would compare the probability of the hypotheses, given the evidence, only by considering the probability of the evidence, given the hypotheses. It follows that evidence must be the sort of thing that can have a probability. But again, Williamson claims that what has a probability is a proposition; for example, it can only be probable or improbable that such-and-such is the case. Even when we speak loosely of the probability of an event, what we mean, says Williamson, is the probability that the event will occur. And surely, such things as objects or experiences cannot be probable or improbable, although it could be probable or improbable that I have an experience under certain conditions, or that an object has a certain property. So again, granted that we engage in probabilistic reasoning with evidence, the conclusion seems to be that evidence must be propositional.

Finally, Williamson points out that we often think of evidence as ruling out certain hypotheses. For instance, that I was in Cleveland at the time of the murder rules out the hypothesis that I was the murderer in Columbus. But evidence E rules out an hypothesis H only when the two are logically inconsistent; in particular, one must be able to deduce ~H from E. And, of course, the premises in a logical deduction consist of propositions—the sort of thing that can be true or false. Indeed, a valid deduction is one such that, if the premises are true, the conclusion must also be true.

Yet, one may well remain unconvinced by these arguments. For example, must the object of an explanation be a proposition, rather than, say, an event? When Newton offered an explanation for the action of the tides, one’s first thought is that he was out to explain a physical occurrence taking place on the surface of the earth, and not anything like the content of an assertion or the referent of a that-clause. Indeed, we might raise the same issue with Williamson’s claim about probabilities. There are well-known interpretations of probability according to which events and event-types have probabilities, and not propositions. For instance, on the standard frequency interpretation, a probability is the limit to the relative frequency of an event-type in a reference class; and on the propensity interpretation, a probability is the disposition of a system—such as an experimental arrangement— to yield a particular outcome, which is manifestly not a proposition. In defense of Williamson, however, his strategy is to consider the function of evidence in particular types of reasoning. And as he frequently points out, if one is to reason with one’s evidence, either probabilistically, deductively, or explanatorily, the evidence must be the sort of thing that one can grasp or understand, namely, a proposition. (It makes little sense to grasp an event, although we can grasp that an event took place). So, while there may be theories of probability or explanation whereby events are implicated, when we turn to explanatory, probabilistic or deductive reasoning with the evidence, we are arguably dealing only with what is propositional.

Whether or not we agree with Williamson, we shall see in the next section, where we consider the important role evidence plays—namely, as something that justifies belief—that we may have strong theoretical ground for accepting, contrary to Williamson, that experiences can also count as evidence.

b. Can Experiences Be Evidence? The Regress Argument

It seems almost a truism that whether a person’s belief is reasonable or unreasonable—justified or not—depends upon the evidence he possesses. For instance, if I believe that my wife is having an affair, but I have no evidence at all to think so, then such a belief seems patently unreasonable. Given my lack of evidence, I am not justified in holding the belief, and rationality would demand that I relinquish it. If, on the contrary, I have overwhelming evidence in support of my wife’s infidelity, but persist in believing that she is being faithful, then such a belief would be equally unreasonable. In this situation, the only belief I would be justified in having, in the light of my evidence, is that my wife is indeed having an affair. Arguably, then, there is another important role that evidence plays: evidence is that which justifies a person’s belief. We shall examine the matter in more detail below (§1c).

This being granted, suppose we were to accept, in addition, that evidence consists only in propositions, as was urged in §1a. If so, the natural conclusion would be that what justifies a subject’s belief are other propositions he believes (his evidence). More formally, we would say that, for any proposition p that a subject S believes at a time t, if S is justified in believing p at t, there must be at least one other proposition q that S believes at t, which counts as S’s evidence for p. But if this is so, it seems we should also require that S’s belief in q itself be justified; for if S is groundlessly assuming q, how could it justify his belief in p? Yet if S’s belief that q must be justified, then by the same reasoning S must possess evidence for q, consisting in yet another proposition r that S is justified in believing. And, of course, there shall have to be another proposition serving as S’s evidence for r. The question is: where, if at all, does this chain of justifications terminate? We refer to this as the epistemic regress problem. As we shall soon see, the regress problem may support the conclusion that experiences can count as evidence as well (see especially Audi 2003).

Now, granted that we cannot possibly entertain an infinite number of justifying propositions, one possible way out of the regress would be simply to reject an assumption used to generate it, namely, that only propositions a person believes can count as his evidence. If we reject this assumption, perhaps we can hold, on the one hand, that the regress does terminate in what S is justified in believing, but on the other, the evidence for these beliefs does not consist in other propositions he believes. And aren’t we perfectly familiar with such cases? Consider beliefs we have about our own perceptual experiences. I believe that I have a pain in my lower back. What justifies this belief is surely not some other belief I have, but simply my experience of pain in my lower back. Here, the belief is grounded directly in the perceptual experience itself, and not in any other proposition I believe. Or consider my belief that there is something yellow in my visual field. Again, what justifies this belief is not any other proposition I believe, but simply my experience of something yellow in my visual field. Moreover, the point arguably need not be limited to beliefs about our perceptual experiences (Audi, 2003; see also Pryor 2000). For example, suppose I hear thunder and a patter at my window, and come to believe that it is raining outside. That it is raining outside is not a belief about my perceptual experiences, yet seems to be grounded in them.

The idea, then, would be that the regress of justifications terminates in a body of beliefs grounded directly in the evidence of the senses, and not by any other beliefs that would themselves need to be justified. This maneuver would terminate the regress, precisely because—unlike a belief—it makes no sense to demand evidence for an experience. Indeed, how can I give evidence for a pain in my lower back? At the same time, experiences do seem to justify certain beliefs, ostensibly making this an ideal solution to the regress problem. It is worth noting that, since this view postulates a body of beliefs that ultimately support all other beliefs without resting on any beliefs themselves, it is an instance of a more general position on the structure of justification known as foundationalism.

While this line of thought may give some reason for accepting that experiences count as evidence, it still does not tell us anything about the particular relationship between experience and belief by virtue of which the former can constitute evidence for the latter. Indeed, if Williamson’s arguments from §1a are correct, we know that experience can neither stand in an explanatory, nor probabilistic or deductive relationship with a proposition believed. By virtue of what sort of relationship, then, can a subject’s experience count as evidence for what he believes? Donald Davidson (1990) has argued that experience can only stand in a causal relationship to belief. For example, my hearing thunder and a patter at the window merely causes me to believe that it is raining outside. For Davidson and others, this is the wrong sort of relationship to account for justification; what we need for the latter is not the sort of relationship in which billiard balls can stand, but the sort of relationship that propositions can stand—again, like an explanatory, probabilistic or deductive relationship. Accordingly, like Williamson, Davidson claims that only propositions a person believes can count as evidence for his other beliefs, and opts for a coherence theory of the structure of justification (and knowledge), rather than a foundationist theory.

Engaging further with Davidson’s claim would take us too far afield. For our purposes, it suffices to say that many philosophers still do think that experience can count as evidence. Indeed, some, such as John McDowell (1996), think that experiences have conceptual and even propositional content—we can see, hear, feel that such-and-such is the case—and thus that experiences can stand in rational relationships to beliefs, and not just causal ones. Part of the urgency for McDowell is that, in his view, the very survival of empiricism demands that experiences count as evidence; indeed, Davidson, who denies this, is perfectly happy to retire empiricism.

However, even those who deny that experiences count as evidence need not think that a person’s experiences are irrelevant to the evidence he possesses. For instance, Williamson entertains the possibility that there are some propositions that would not count as a person’s evidence unless he was undergoing some kind of experience. According to Williamson, in such a case, experience may be said to provide evidence, without constituting it. Whether this will be seen as sufficient to save empiricism depends, of course, on how one understands that doctrine.

c. Evidence And Justified Belief: A Closer Look

Recall that in order to start the regress in §1b, we assumed that evidence is that which justifies a person’s belief. This view can be generalized to cover all so-called doxastic or belief-involving attitudes—belief, disbelief, suspension of belief, and even partial belief. The idea would simply be that S’s doxastic attitude D toward a proposition p at a time t is epistemically justified at t, if and only if having D toward p fits the evidence S has at t. This view, known as evidentialism, makes justification turn entirely on the evidence a person possesses (Conee and Feldman, 2004). But is evidentialism inevitable? Is having evidence sufficient for justified belief? Is it even necessary?

Consider, first, whether possessing evidence is sufficient for justified belief. Some think that justified belief is essentially a deontological notion, involving the fulfillment of one’s duties or responsibilities as a believer. Hence, while having a belief that fits one’s evidence might be implicated in responsible belief, it seems that responsibility also requires making proper use of one’s evidence. For example, suppose I am justified in believing p, and that I am justified in believing that if p then q. Yet, I do not believe q on the basis of this evidence, but believe it simply because I like the way it sounds (Korblith, 1980). If I believe q on these grounds, I am arguably not justified in my belief, even though it “fits” my other beliefs; believing a proposition because of the way it sounds seems like a patently irresponsible and therefore unjustified belief, no matter what unused evidence for it I may possess. In defense of evidentialism here, Conee and Feldman appeal to the auxiliary notion of a well-founded belief: a belief that not only fits the evidence a person possesses, but is properly based upon it. Thus, in the above example, my belief in q is not well-founded, since I do not properly use my evidence, even though the belief is justified by the evidence I possess. This maneuver may do little, however, to placate those who take justified belief to be inextricably related to responsibility.

Perhaps a more pressing challenge to the evidentialist is whether evidence is even necessary for justified belief. Consider again believing a proposition because of the way it sounds. Intuitively, such a process or method of adopting beliefs is horribly unreliable; that is, one is not at all likely to arrive at true beliefs in this way. By contrast, consider the inference from “p” and “if p then q” to the conclusion “q. If the former two are true, then believing q on their bases is guaranteed to result in a true belief; indeed, sound deductive reasoning is the very paradigm of a reliable or truth-conducive process of inference. Accordingly, perhaps the central notion involved in justified belief is not the responsibility or possession of evidence per se, but how truth-conducive or reliable one’s belief-forming process or method is. If so, this opens up the possibility that there are instances of justified belief in which evidence is not implicated at all; for, while making proper use of one’s evidence is surely one way to form beliefs reliably, there is no reason to suspect that it is the only way to do so. Indeed, consider again beliefs formed on the basis of perceptual experience. Perhaps the reason why such beliefs are justified is not because experience is somehow evidence for such a belief; nor even because experience provides evidence for other propositions, as in Williamson’s view; but simply because forming beliefs via experience is generally a reliable or truth-conducive process of belief-formation. This view, which relates justified belief to the reliability of the process by which it is formed, is known as reliabilism (see especially Goldman, 1976, 1986).

It is far from clear, though, how far reliabilism can decouple justified belief from evidence (see Bonjour 1980, but also Brandom 2000). As the view has thus far been described, a belief can be justified even if one has no evidence whatsoever for believing that the process by which the belief is formed is reliable; all that matters is that the belief-forming process be reliable, not that the subject has any reason to think that it is. Indeed, reliabilism is typically thought to involve the thesis of epistemic externalism, or the thesis that one need have no access to or awareness of what makes one’s beliefs justified. With this in mind, consider the well-known case of the industrial chicken-sexer, who can reliably discriminate between male and female chickens without having any idea of how he does so. Suppose we take someone with that ability, but withhold from him whether he is successfully discriminating chickens by sex; that is, he not only has no idea how he reliably discriminates between chickens, but does not even know whether he does so. Would such a person really be justified in believing that a particular chicken is female, even though he hasn’t the slightest clue that he possesses the ability of the chicken sexer? What if we told him that he gets it wrong the majority of the time? Here, he would have evidence against his own reliability. Would he be justified then? Even reliabilists such as Alvin Goldman (1986) take heed here, requiring among other things that a believer must not possess evidence against the reliability of the belief-forming process. This, together with the notion that proper use of one’s evidence counts as a reliable process, ensures that the concept of evidence will not be utterly irrelevant to justified belief, even if we were to reject the strong thesis of evidentialism in favor of something like reliabilism.

Up to this point, we have merely been considering what might be called the nature of evidence: what it is and what it does. And although it has been suggested that evidence can stand in an explanatory, probabilistic, or deductive relationship with a proposition it supports, very little has been said about these relationships. That is, we have yet to consider any theories on the evidential relation, or the relation between two things by virtue of which one counts as evidence for or against the other. It is to this topic that we now turn.

In order to avoid biasing the question of what sort of entity evidence can be, where possible, I will simply refer to the evidence as “E” (although, if Williamson is correct, E will have to be a proposition in each of the theories we shall consider).

2. Theories of the Evidential Relation

A theory of the evidential-relation provides conditions necessary and sufficient for the truth of claims of the form

E is evidence for H.

Such a theory tells us, in philosophically enriched terms, what it is for something, E, to constitute evidence for a proposition or hypothesis, H. There are surely many ways to classify such theories, but one intuitive way to do so would be to divide them into probabilistic, semi-probabilistic, and non-probabilistic or qualitative theories; the first two types of theory feature probabilities at least somewhere in their accounts of evidence, while the latter type avoids reference to probabilities altogether. We will look at probabilistic and semi-probabilistic accounts first.

a. Probabilistic Theories of the Evidential Relation

The most widely accepted probabilistic account of evidence is the so-called increase-in-probability or positive- relevance account. The idea is simply that E is evidence for H if and only if E makes H more probable. In symbols, E is evidence for H if and only if

P(H/E) > P(H)

where this is to be interpreted as saying that the probability of H given E is greater than the probability of H alone. Along similar lines, we can say that E is evidence against H if and only if

P(H/E) < P(H).

Finally, we may say that E is neither evidence for, nor against, H iff

P(H/E) = P(H).

Of course, these definitions are purely formal, and will take on deeper philosophical significance if we interpret the concept of probability employed. Most prominently, subjective Bayesians interpret a probability as a rational subject’s degree of belief in a proposition at a given time t, where the only condition necessary for a subject to count as rational is that his degrees of belief conform to the axioms of the probability calculus. So, for example, where H and H´ are logically incompatible hypotheses, the degree to which a rational subject believes [H or H´] ought to be equal to the degree to which he believes H plus the degree to which he believes H´, since [P(H v H´) = P(H) + P(H´)] is an axiom of the probability calculus. With this interpretation of probability in mind, the positive-relevance definition of evidence says that E is evidence for H, for a rational subject S at a time t, if and only if E would make S believe H more, were he to learn that E is the case. Naturally, then, evidence against H would make a rational subject believe H less, and evidence that is neutral towards H would leave a rational subject’s degree of belief in H unchanged.

As intuitive as these definitions may seem, some think that these simple probabilistic definitions are subject to serious counterexamples, and either try to supplement the probabilistic definition with other concepts, such as explanation, or reject the quantitative approach altogether. Consider a simple counterexample to positive-relevance offered by Achinstein (1983, 2001), devised to show that a mere increase in probability is not sufficient for something to count as evidence. Let E = On Wednesday, Steve was doing training laps in the water; let H = On Wednesday, Steve drowned; and let our background information include that Steve is a member of the Olympic swimming team who was in fine shape Wednesday morning. Achinstein claims that E increases the probability of H over the probability of H alone; that is, swimming makes drowning more probable than when one is not swimming at all. According to the positive relevance definition, then, E ought to be evidence that H. But this is bizarre, for the mere fact that Steve—an Olympian—is doing training laps on Wednesday seems to provide no reason at all to believe that he drowned. Intuitively, the idea behind the counterexample is that positive-relevance is too weak to capture a notion of evidence; E can increase the probability of H without being evidence for it at all. (For responses to this and other counterexamples of Achinstein’s, see Kronz (1992), Maher (1996) and Roush (2005)).

Clark Glymour (1980) has offered a very widely discussed objection to positive-relevance, specifically under its subjective Bayesian interpretation, now known as the “problem of old evidence.” According to Bayesians, the first term in the positive-relevance definition, P(H/E), is to be determined by way of a theorem of the probability calculus known as Bayes’ theorem, which in its simplest formulation is:

P(H/E) = P(H) x P(E/H) / P(E)

With this in mind, Glymour points out that quite often scientists advance an hypothesis to explain “old evidence,” or some phenomenon that is already known to obtain. For example, one known phenomenon that Einstein’s general theory of relativity was advanced to explain was an anomaly in Mercury’s orbit, known as the anomalous advance of the perihelion of Mercury. In these cases, P(E) in the above theorem would equal 1; that is, since the phenomenon is already known to obtain, a rational subject would believe that E obtains with certainty. Assuming now that the theory (being an adequate explanation) entails the phenomenon, then P(E/H) above would be 1 as well. But note that if we plug these figures into the theorem above, the theorem simply reduces to: P(H/E) = P(H). According to our relevance definitions, then, old evidence could neither be evidence for, nor against, an hypothesis. But clearly old evidence can be evidence for, or against, an hypothesis, as was certainly the case with the anomaly in Mercury’s orbit: it was evidence for Einstein’s theory and evidence against Newton’s. Considerations such as these lead Glymour to eschew probabilities altogether in his own influential theory of evidence (see §2c below). (For a subjective Bayesian response to the problem of old evidence, see especially Howson and Urbach (1996)).

One might think that we can easily devise a probabilistic definition of evidence in order to circumvent these problems. Suppose, for example, we say that E is evidence for H, if and only if the probability of H given E is high (Carnap, 1950). Call this the high-probability definition of evidence. In symbols, E is evidence for H if and only if

P(H/E) > k

where k is some threshold of high probability. This would avoid Achinstein’s swimming counterexample, for while swimming does increase the probability of drowning, it does not render it high. Moreover, since it avoids making increase-and-decrease-in-probability a criterion of evidence, it would not face Glymour’s problem of old evidence. But suppose E = Jones has regularly taken his wife’s birth-control pills over the last year, and H = Jones has not become pregnant. Clearly, P(H/E) is as high as can be, but the fact that Jones has taken his wife’s birth-control pills is surely not evidence that he has not become pregnant. The problem, of course, is one of the evidence being relevant to the hypothesis, a problem that will surface again with other accounts of evidence, as we shall see below (§§2ci, 3c).

b. Semi-Probabilistic Theories of Evidence

While an elegant probabilistic definition of evidence may be desirable, these objections and others have suggested to some that such an account might be unattainable. However, not all philosophers who have been skeptical of a purely probabilistic approach have abandoned probabilities altogether.

Achinstein (1983, 2001), for example, accepts the high probability definition as a necessary but not sufficient component to an account of evidence. In order to secure relevance between the evidence and the hypothesis, Achinstein adds to the high-probability definition a requirement that there also be a high probability of an explanatory connection between E and H (given that E and H are true), where there is an explanatory connection between E and H if H correctly explains E, E correctly explains H, or some proposition correctly explains both of them. (Here, probabilities are not subjective degrees of belief, but are objective and have nothing to do with what any subject knows or believes). Obviously, this account avoids the birth control counterexample, precisely because there is no probability of an explanatory connection between Jones’ taking birth control and his failure to become pregnant; and it continues to avoid the swimming and the old evidence problems, for the same reason that the high probability account did on its own. Also, the account seems to yield a correct verdict in some cases. Suppose, for instance, that Jones’ wife is taking birth control pills and fails to become pregnant, but not because of her contraception, but because she is no longer fertile. On Achinstein’s view we can still say, as it seems we should, that her taking birth control pills provides evidence that she will not become pregnant, even though the pills are not the real explanation, since his view only requires there to be a high-probability of an explanatory connection, as there seems to be in this case.

One might think, though, that Achinstein has simply traded one somewhat manageable problem for two more difficult ones. For he is cashing out the evidential relation in terms of explanation and objective probability, two notions that are perhaps more in need of philosophical treatment than the evidential relation.

It should not be thought that one must employ either the positive-relevance or high-probability accounts in giving a theory of evidence. Deborah Mayo’s error-statistical account (1996) is an influential semi-probabilistic approach to evidence, that appeals to neither account. Mayo’ approach, like Achinstein’s and unlike positive relevance, is rather strong; her leading thought takes off from the Popperian intuition that “any support capable of carrying weight can only rest upon ingenious tests, undertaken with the aim of refuting our hypothesis.” Thus she proposes that E is evidence for H if and only if H passes what she calls a “severe test” with E, where H passes severe test T with E if and only if the following two conditions are satisfied:

  • E “agrees with” or “fits” H (which she leaves rather open-ended, provided that P(E/H) is not low)
  • There is a high probability that T would have produced a less fitting result than E, if H were false.

Consider a simple example. Suppose we give a patient a test T to test the hypothesis (H) that he has a disease D, and suppose (E) the test comes out positive. Suppose further that when a patient has D, T yields a positive result 95% of the time, and when the patient does not have D, T yields a negative result 99% of the time. Clearly, conditions (i) and (ii) are satisfied: E not only “fits” H, but T very probably would have yielded a less fitting (i.e. negative) result if H were false. Accordingly, since H passes a severe test T with E, E is quite strong error-statistical evidence that the patient has disease D. Intuitively, T is a very good test to use if we want to rule out that H is the case, and so a result of T that instead passes H is impressive evidence in its favor.

On the other hand, if we were to suppose that T yields false positives 95% of the time, the epistemic status of E would look quite different. While condition (i) is still satisfied, condition (ii) would not be: since the test almost as frequently produces false positives, there is a very low probability that T would have produced a less fitting result if the patient did not have D. Accordingly, T would not count as a severe test of our hypothesis H, and so E would fail to constitute error-statistical evidence for H.

Needless to say, the error-statistical approach has been adapted to cover much more complicated testing situations, and interested readers are invited to consult Mayo (1996). Another severe-testing account of evidence can be found in Giere (1983).

c. Qualitative Theories of the Evidential Relation

Not every approach to evidence has employed probabilities. In this section, we shall look at three of the better-known qualitative theories of evidence. In one way or another, these theories appeal only to deductive relationships between evidence and hypothesis.

i. Hypothetico-Deductivism

Perhaps the best-known non-quantitative approach to evidence would be hypothetico-deductivism, which is popularly thought to constitute the scientific method (see Braithwate in Achinstein (ed.), 1983 or Hempel, 1966). According to the simplest version of this approach, one invents an hypothesis and draws out its observational consequences. One then checks to see whether these consequences turn out to be true, and if so, one is said to have obtained evidence in favor of one’s hypothesis. If the consequence turns out to be false, then one has refuted one’s hypothesis. On this approach, then, evidence for an hypothesis is a true observational consequence of that hypothesis, while evidence against an hypothesis is a false observational consequence.

We consider two well-known objections to hypothetico-deductivism here and another one in §3c below. The first objection is the so-called irrelevant-conjunction objection. If an hypothesis H logically entails E, then so does the hypothesis H & H´, where H´ can be any hypothesis whatever. If E turns out to be true, then, according to this approach, it is evidence for both H and H´, which is unacceptable. The irrelevant conjunction objection shows, as we shall see again in §3c, that hypothetico-deductivism offers a much too indiscriminate an account of the evidential relationship. The second well-known objection to hypothetico-deductivism is the competing- hypothesis objection (see e.g. Mill, 1959). Suppose H entails a body of evidence E1…En, and suppose the evidence comes out true. Still, H is not the only hypothesis from which we can derive E1…En; in fact, there may be indefinitely many such hypotheses, even perhaps some that—as Mill puts it—”our minds are unfitted to conceive.” According to hypothetico-deductivism, then, E1…En would support those hypotheses equally well, and the evidence would never be sufficient to accept one hypothesis among the others. One common reply is that we ought to choose the simplest among the competing hypotheses. But first, this simply shifts the problem to defining simplicity, which has proved to be a difficult task; and second, there seems to be no reason to believe that the simpler theory is more likely to be true. These problems and others have led some philosophers to seek alternatives to hypothetico-deductivism, which we will now examine.

ii. Evidence as a Positive-Instance

One influential alternative to hypothetico-deductivism is offered by Carl Hempel (1965). On this approach, an observation-sentence E is evidence for a universal hypothesis H, just when E describes a positive instance of H—or as Hempel puts it, just when E says of the items mentioned within it what H says of all items. Intuitively, in such a case E would “instantiate” H, thus would be evidence for it. While this is hardly groundbreaking, what is novel about Hempel’s approach is that he marshaled the resources of basic predicate logic to give his account of a positive instance, thereby construing the evidential relation, like deduction, as being a syntactical relation obtaining between sentences. That is, on this approach E is evidence for H not by virtue of the specific sorts of objects E and H describe, but by virtue of the formal features of the manner in which they describe them.

For instance, suppose we are psychological researchers entertaining the “psychological hypothesis”, H, that everyone loves someone. The logical form of this hypothesis is ∀x ∃y Lxy. This simply says that, for anything x, there is some y such that x stands in relation L to y, which is a logical form shared with great many hypotheses (e.g. that everyone hates someone). Suppose further that we have observed in our psychological practice that person, a, loves himself, and that person b loves a. Again, on a purely formal level, our observation-sentence E would be “Laa & Lba“. This says that a stands in relation L to itself, and b stands in relation L to a (again, there are great many observation-sentences that would share this form). Now, to determine whether E describes an instance of H (and whether it is evidence for it), we introduce the notion of the development of H with respect to the individuals mentioned in E. Intuitively, the development of the hypothesis is simply what the hypothesis would assert if there existed only those individuals in E. Thus, purely formally, the development of H for the individuals in E is:

(Laa v Lab) & (Lbb v Lba)

With this in hand, Hempel claims that a statement is evidence for an hypothesis when it entails the hypothesis’ development. Now, since [Laa & Lba] does entail the above development, it follows that E is evidence for our hypothesis H; that is, the observation-report that person a loves himself and b loves a is evidence for the hypothesis that everyone loves someone. Since it is clear that the observation-report says of a and b what the hypothesis says of all individuals, Hempel has captured the notion of a positive instance using basic predicate logic. Moreover, since the criterion involves only the logical form of the evidence-statement and the hypothesis, any statements with those forms stands in the exact same evidential relation.

As ingenious as this may be, one obvious shortcoming of Hempel’s approach is that an observation sentence E can be evidence for an hypothesis H, only if E and H are formulated in the same vocabulary (in this case, both must employ the predicate “L”). Thus this approach cannot be used as a general theory of scientific evidence, since scientific hypotheses often employ theoretical predicates referring to unobservable entities and processes, while observation-sentences employ a strictly observational vocabulary. In the next section, we shall see that Clark Glymour—who, if you recall, raised “the problem of old evidence” against the Bayesians—developed his bootstrapping approach to evidence in part to remedy this shortcoming, while still adhering to Hempel’s basic idea that evidence is a positive instance of an hypothesis.

iii. Bootstrapping

The basic idea of Glymour’s bootstrapping theory (1975, 1980) is quite simple: to test an hypothesis in a theory consisting of several hypotheses, all of which contain theoretical terms, we can use those other hypotheses in the theory, together with observational evidence, to derive a positive instance of the hypothesis we are testing and obtain evidence for it. By repeating this process for each hypothesis in the theory, we can obtain evidence for (or against) the theory as a whole, even though the theory employs a theoretical vocabulary, while the evidence is couched in an observational one. In such a case, we are “pulling ourselves up by our own bootstraps”, in the sense that we are using certain bits of a theory to obtain evidence for other bits of the same theory, in the service of obtaining evidence for (or against) that theory as a whole.

To fill-in this abstract characterization, consider one of Glymour’s historical examples. Newton’s law of universal gravitation asserts that all bodies exert an inverse square attractive force upon one another. As evidence for this, he used Kepler’s laws of planetary motion. Yet none of Kepler’s laws contains the theoretical term “force”; they merely describe observable regularities in the planets’ orbits without offering any theoretical explanation for them. How, then, do we link the observable evidence—Kepler’s laws—to an hypothesis that contains the term “force”, so that the former can become evidentially relevant to the latter? The evidential link is supplied, of course, by other parts of Newton’s theory, namely his second law of motion relating the force on a body with the measurable quantities of mass and acceleration. Newton used the second law and the evidence of Kepler’s laws to derive instances of the law of universal gravitation for planets and their satellites. He eventually generalized this law to all bodies in the universe. Despite being the briefest sketch of Newton’s argument, this illustrates Glymour’s point: here Newton is using observational evidence and other hypotheses in a general theory under test to derive instances of—and thus evidence for—a particular hypothesis in that theory, even though the evidence and the hypothesis employ different vocabularies. This is precisely what Hempel’s instantial approach cannot achieve.

But the worry haunting Glymour’s approach, as might be expected, has surrounded the problem of circularity. A great deal of literature has been devoted by Glymour and others to deal with this and other issues (see Earman 1983).

This completes our survey of theories on the evidential relation. We have not covered all such theories, of course, but have aimed primarily at variety. In particular, we have examined theories that feature probabilistic, deductive and explanatory relationships between evidence and hypothesis. It is worth mentioning again that if Williamson is right, these theories would testify to the propositional nature of evidence.

Now that we are equipped with considerable background, in the remainder of this entry we shall consider some well-known problems and paradoxes in the theory of evidence.

3. Some Problems of Evidence

a. The Ravens Paradox

The famous ravens paradox was formulated by Carl Hempel in the very paper in which he set out his own instantial approach to evidence sketched in §2cii. The paradox arises by reflecting on the following three seemingly uncontestable assumptions.

  1. According to the first assumption, an instance provides evidence for a generalization. So, for example, if our generalization is “All ravens are black,” then an item that is both a raven and black provides at least some evidence for it. This certainly seems correct.
  2. According to the second assumption, an instance that is evidence for a generalization provides evidence for any generalization that is logically equivalent to it, that is, any sentence that is true and false in exactly the same circumstances. The idea behind this assumption is simply that logically equivalent sentences make essentially the same assertion couched in different words, and we cannot have differential confirmation of sentences based simply on the words they use. That seems correct as well.
  3. The third assumption is simply that “All ravens are black” is logically equivalent to “All non-black things are non-ravens,” since the latter is just the contra-positive of the former. This is just a matter of simple deductive logic.

The paradox, then, arises as follows. Since, for example a green book, is a non-black thing that is a non-raven, by assumption (1), it provides evidence that all non-black things are non-ravens. By assumption (2), the same green book provides evidence for any hypothesis logically equivalent to it, which, by assumption (3), means that it also provides evidence for the hypothesis that all ravens are black. In fact, most of the things in a room provide evidence for one’s ornithological hypothesis without one having to look at any birds or even leaving one’s apartment. The paradox, then, is that three ostensibly uncontestable assumptions lead to a consequence that seems intolerable.

i. Hempel’s “Solution”

Since Hempel was in the process of giving a positive-instance account of evidence when he presented the paradox, perhaps we should not be surprised that his own “solution” to the paradox was simply to accept it, arguing that its paradoxical air was a psychological illusion. The problem is that by picking some item or other in the apartment as an example, we antecedently know that it will be a non-raven, and so the outcome of the “observation” of the object seems irrelevant to the confirmation of the hypothesis. When we are then told that, in fact, the object does provide evidence for the hypothesis, this seems simply unacceptable. But suppose that all we knew was that were there is a non-black thing whose identity as a raven was still genuinely in question. In this case, finding that it is not a raven would, says Hempel, seem evidentially relevant to the hypothesis that all ravens are black. In both cases, the non-black non-raven object supplies evidence for the hypothesis, but whether this seems paradoxical or not depends upon what information we include or suppress in stating the example. Despite this, many have still found it intolerable that a green book could provide evidence that all ravens are black.

ii. A Bayesian Solution

Interestingly, Bayesians (see §2a) tend to agree with Hempel that a green book and a black raven each provide evidence for the hypothesis that all ravens are black. However, they mitigate this seemingly outlandish position by using Bayes’ theorem and the positive-relevance definition of evidence to show that one provides much stronger evidence than the other. Consider again the simple version of Bayes’ theorem, which according to Bayesians is the theorem by which we are to compute the conditional probability P(H/E):

P(H/E) = P(H) P(E/H) / P(E)

Now, it is easy to see from the theorem that as P(E) becomes larger, P(H/E) becomes smaller. If we interpret this in light of the positive relevance definition of evidence, this is to say that the more probable the evidence, the less it increases the probability of the hypothesis, and the weaker it is as a piece of evidence. Conversely, the less probable the evidence, the more it increases the probability of the hypothesis, and the stronger it is as a piece of evidence. This result is said by Bayesians to capture the allegedly intuitive notion that surprising evidence supports an hypothesis more. But note that, since there are vastly more non-black things in the universe than there are ravens, the probability of finding a non-black thing that is also a non-raven is far greater than that of finding a raven that is black. According to the theorem, then, finding a non-black, non-raven ought to increase the probability of H (that all ravens are black) much less than finding a black raven. Indeed, it ought to increase the probability of the hypothesis hardly at all, since P(E) should be close to 1. It follows that, while finding a black raven and a non-black non-raven both provide evidence for the hypothesis that all ravens are black, the latter provides much weaker evidence than the former. Indeed, since the latter affords such weak evidence, we would invariably overlook it as such, which may explain why it is so surprising to be told that (say) a green book does provide evidence that all ravens are black.

iii. An Error-Statistical Solution

Those who would regard as preposterous even the notion that a green book could supply extremely weak evidence that all ravens are black, may find some solace in an error-statistical solution to the ravens paradox. Again, to yield evidence for an hypothesis on this view, a testing procedure must severely test that hypothesis. With this in mind, it is not difficult to see that examining all non-black items in one’s apartment would fail to be a severe test of the hypothesis that all ravens are black. Again, appealing to Popper’s dictum, this would precisely not be “an ingenious test, undertaken with the aim of refuting our hypothesis.” For, while finding that all non-black items in one’s apartment are non-ravens may “agree with” the hypothesis that all ravens are black (thus satisfying Mayo’s requirement (i)), one would very probably not obtain a less fitting result from such a procedure if all ravens were not black (thus failing to satisfy requirement (ii)). That is to say, we can be certain that this test would yield the exact same results even if ravens were of a wide variety of colors.

It is important to note, though, that even finding very many black ravens may fail to provide evidence for the hypothesis on this approach. One’s testing procedure would have to ensure that one’s instances were sufficiently varied such that, if not all ravens were black, one would very probably turn up one of those non-black ravens. For example, one would at the very least have to select ravens from different locales and of different ages and sexes. In short, employing what one knows about the properties that make bird-coloration vary, one would have to do one’s best to obtain instances that would refute the hypothesis that all ravens are black in order for one’s results to count as evidence for that hypothesis.

b. The Grue Paradox

Another famous paradox haunting the positive-instance approach to evidence is Nelson Goodman’s grue paradox. Indeed, Goodman’s paradox is often thought to have put an end to purely formal approaches to evidence, such as Hempel’s, and is of tremendous historical significance.

Suppose that all emeralds examined so far have been green. Assuming again that an observed positive instance of an hypothesis provides evidence in support of it, then our observations of green emeralds provide evidence for the hypothesis that all emeralds are green. So far so good. But note that all emeralds examined so far have also been grue, where the predicate “grue” applies to all things observed before some future time t just in case they are green, or to things not so examined just in case they are blue. Again, under the assumption that an observed positive instance of an hypothesis provides evidence in support of it, our observations of grue emeralds have also supplied evidence that all emeralds are grue. Yet the two hypotheses are genuine rivals. For example, they make incompatible predictions: according to the green-hypothesis, the first emerald observed after t will be green, while according to the grue-hypothesis it will be grue (that is, blue). Thus, it seems our observations of emeralds provide no more evidence to believe that the first emerald observed after t will be green than to believe that it will grue (i.e. blue), which is intolerable.

Note that the point of the paradox is not to undermine our confidence that observations of instances can be evidence for a general proposition expressing a law or uniformity of nature. Rather, the paradox begins with that assumption, and asks the more penetrating question of which propositions are apt to express the laws or uniformities of nature, and thus which propositions are supported by observations of its instances (or which propositions are “projectable” in Goodman’s terminology). Ostensibly, both the green and the grue hypotheses are candidates here, since both assert that nature is uniform in a certain respect: one says that emeralds everywhere and throughout all time are green, while the other says they are grue. We of course believe that only the green-hypothesis is lawlike, and thus we believe only the green hypothesis can obtain support from the evidence; but the paradox demands that we give a reason for this bias.

i. Goodman’s Solution

Goodman’s own solution to his paradox is rather startling. Goodman thinks that the deep assumption generating the paradox is that an account of the evidential relationship ought to look no farther than the logical relationship between the evidence-statement and the hypothesis alone (think of Hempel’s account here). Thus, since the green and grue hypotheses both bear the exact same logical relationship to the evidence-statements—that is, since those statements simply describe observed positive instances of the hypotheses—both hypotheses are equally well supported by the evidence, which is intolerable. Hence, Goodman’s strategy involves rejecting the underlying assumption that the evidential relation is a purely logical one. While obviously the logical relation between evidence and hypothesis will be relevant to their evidential relation; there is no reason to think it is the only relevant factor. According to Goodman, our linguistic practices must also play a role. Very roughly, our observations of emeralds are evidence for the green hypothesis, and not the grue hypothesis, because “green” has been used much more frequently in hypotheses that have actually been accepted by us. On this view, the evidence supported by our observations depends in part upon how the world has heretofore been described in words. This, of course, leaves open the possibility that, had “grue” been the better-entrenched predicate, our observations would support the grue hypothesis instead.

ii. Achinstein’s Solution

Goodman’s solution seems rather shallow. It rests upon the obvious fact that we have accepted hypotheses involving the predicate “green” more frequently than those involving “grue”, without offering any rationale for our acceptance. Achinstein claims to be able to provide such a rationale with his own theory of evidence (see §2b). First, recall Achinstein requires that if E is to provide evidence for H, then the probability of H, given E, must be high. Next he requires that if observed instances are to bestow high probability on a universal hypothesis, and thus be evidence for it, the observed instances of the hypothesis must be sufficiently varied. In other words, if one’s instances are not varied, then it is hard to see how they can make the probability of a universal hypothesis high. Finally, note that grue is a disjunctive property; the predicate grue applies to two different kinds of cases, green objects observed before t or blue objects observed after t. Now, given that (1) evidence requires high probability, (2) high probability requires varied instances, and (3) grue applies to two different kinds of cases, it seems that our observed instances could never be evidence that all emeralds are grue, unless some instances of that hypothesis are of both kinds of cases. That is to say, the only way for observed emeralds to be sufficiently varied to provide evidence that all emeralds are grue, is if we examine some emeralds before t and find them to be green, and some after t and find them to be blue. Since one of the very conditions of the paradox is that we have not done so, our observations of emeralds could not provide evidence that all emeralds are grue. In general, the disjunctive nature of “grue”, and the consequent impossibility of obtaining sufficiently varied instances of grue items, explains why “grue” is not a well-entrenched predicate in our language—why we have not frequently accepted hypotheses featuring that predicate in the past. On the other hand, since “green” for us is not a disjunctive property, nothing prevents “green” from being the well-entrenched predicate that it is in our language, as Goodman observed.

c. Underdetermination of Theory by Evidence

There is no more pervasive problem in epistemology than the problem of underdetermination of theory by evidence. Consider, first, radical skepticism about the external world. Here, the skeptic proposes a seemingly far-fetched competing hypothesis to account for all the evidence that experience apparently provides about the mind-independent world. For example, perhaps I am merely a brain-in-a-vat, electrochemically stimulated by a supercomputer to have the very experiences I am having at this moment, or all the experiences I have ever had. This hypothesis is equally compatible with, and indeed entails, that I will have the very same experiential basis for belief that I would have if the world were as I have always believed it to be. Indeed, any test that I could perform to decide between the two competing hypotheses may simply be another set of experiences fed into my brain from the supercomputer. On what grounds, then, can I say that the hypothesis is “far-fetched”? Indeed, given all the evidence I will ever possess, the skeptic’s seemingly bizarre story appears just as likely to be true as my ordinary beliefs. Granted, I may prefer my ordinary beliefs out of familiarity, or even simplicity, but neither of these is a reason for believing that my ordinary beliefs are any more likely to be true; my preference would be just a baseless prejudice. Accordingly, all possible evidence I could have radically underdetermines which theory I ought to believe.

Other skeptical arguments, such as inductive skepticism and skepticism about other minds, are designed to establish the same conclusion. In the case of inductive skepticism, evidence from the past and present course of nature allegedly underdetermines the shape of the future course of nature. In the case of skepticism about other minds, evidence from what others say and do underdetermines not only what their mental life might be like, but also whether they even have a mental life. In both of these cases, the evidence stands in the exact same logical relationships to the skeptical hypotheses as they do to our favored ones. Accordingly, the evidence allegedly provides no justification whatsoever for preferring one hypothesis to the other.

But it’s not just skepticism that runs on underdetermination of theory by evidence. Indeed, the grue paradox from §3c above does so as well: none of our observations before time t favor the green hypothesis over the grue hypothesis. As we saw, the problem forced Goodman to turn to seemingly non-epistemic factors such as the sort of language we use. And there are problems of underdetermination  that are far less esoteric as well, such as the curve-fitting problem. Suppose we have a graph on which very many data points are plotted; for instance, suppose that the data points relate the pressure and volume of various samples of gas. Now, it turns out that there are infinitely many equations describing curves that can fit the evidence; in our case, this means that Boyle’s law of gases is merely one of an infinite number of equations that can fit the data. Moreover, it does not matter how many data points we add; while some curves will be ruled out with the addition of new evidence, there will always be an unending supply of equations that will fit. On what grounds, then, do we accept Boyle’s law? Once more, the idea is that the evidence itself does not determine which of the equations we ought to prefer.

In all of these cases, the evidence allegedly fails to provide any rational grounds for preferring one hypothesis over an indefinite number of competing hypotheses. To make a choice, we seem forced to prefer an hypothesis on non-evidential and therefore non-epistemic grounds. And this threatens to make a mockery of the very idea of evidence. For is evidence not supposed to help us determine what we ought to believe? If something can’t do this, with what right do we even speak of it as evidence?

These problems are far too numerous, and their solutions far too involved, for us to discuss here. We would do best to concentrate on a problem of underdetermination dealing with which the materials of the previous sections have equipped us. Hence, in the remainder of this entry, we shall concentrate on underdetermination as it relates specifically to thesis of evidential holism, or the thesis that evidence never bears on a proposition in isolation from other propositions we accept—and possibly all the propositions we accept. As we shall see, the theories of the evidential relation already on the table will not only help us set-up the problem, but also offer some solutions.

i. Underdetermination and Holism: The Duhem-Quine Problem

Uncovering the problem of holism and underdetermination is usually credited to Pierre Duhem, the late 19th and early 20th century French physicist, historian of physics, and philosopher of science. Duhem asks us to consider the hypothetico-deductive method of theory-testing, sketched in §2ci: again, from the proposition under test we derive an observable prediction; if the prediction comes out true, we are said to have evidence for the theory, while if not, we are said to have evidence against it. Yet Duhem explains that, while correct in outline, the account is much too simple: the scientist does not derive testable implications from the proposition alone, but from that proposition and “a whole group of theories accepted by him…” For example, in order to obtain any observable predictions from Newton’s laws of motion and gravitation with respect to our Solar System, we need take those laws in conjunction with a host of auxiliary hypotheses and assumed facts, such as that only gravitational forces act on planets; or assumptions about the relative masses of the planets, their satellites and the sun; or information about planetary velocities, which are, in turn, derived from instruments whose correct functioning is based on the employment of still other theories; and so on. Granted this, Duhem now asks us to suppose, as is often the case, that the prediction generated by this body of statements does not turn out true. Since no single hypothesis or theory entails the false prediction, but only a whole web of theory and alleged fact taken together, the evidence does not by itself indicate which member of that web is refuted; nature is silent with respect to where the blame lies. To put the point in starker terms, there simply is no fact of the matter with respect to which the evidence is evidence against, which is just to say that the evidence underdetermines which parts of the body are to be believed and which parts are not. This much being granted, the same should also go for evidence consistent with one’s theory: since in no case does that theory by itself entail a true observable prediction, there would simply be no fact of the matter with respect to which the evidence is evidence for. The conclusion, then, seems to be evidential holism: evidence never bears on a proposition in isolation, but only on a body of propositions taken as a whole.

Duhem thought that his problem could be solved by the “good sense” of the practicing physicist, but it was Quine who unleashed the problem of holism, by extending it beyond a theory and its auxiliary assumptions, to an entire body of statements we accept. Quine’s holism is intimately related to his rejection of the analytic-synthetic distinction in the philosophy of language. An analytic statement is one that is true solely by virtue of its meaning (such as all bachelors are unmarried), while a synthetic statement is one that is true or false by virtue of both its meaning and how things turn out in the world (such as all bachelors are less than five feet ten inches tall). Accordingly, while synthetic statements are accepted as true or rejected as false by virtue of what the world affords us in experience, analytic statements are accepted as true come what may in experience. Now Quine’s rejection of the analytic-synthetic distinction is far too involved to review here, and we only need concern ourselves with its outcome: if there is no distinction between a type of statement that is true in virtue of meaning and a type of statement that is true in virtue of how things turn out in the world, then, in principle, any statement can be accepted as true or rejected as false in the light of experience, and any statement can be held true come what may. The only constraints on what to accept or reject given the evidence of the senses are consistency with what else we accept, and pragmatic considerations such as conservatism and simplicity. Otherwise, the evidence so radically underdetermines our web of beliefs that there is an indefinite number of systems of the world that can be made to square with it. Accordingly, whichever picture of the world we choose is merely one of many, with no evidential basis to decide between them. No one puts the point better than Quine himself:

[It] becomes folly to seek a boundary between synthetic statements, which hold contingently on experience, and analytic statements, which hold come what may. Any statement can be held true come what may, if we make drastic enough adjustments elsewhere in the system… Conversely, by the same token, no statement is immune to revision. Revision of even the logical law of the excluded middle has been proposed as a means of simplifying quantum mechanics… The totality of our so-called knowledge or beliefs…is a man-made fabric which impinges on experience only along the edges. Or, to change the figure, total science is like a field of force whose boundary conditions are experience. A conflict with experience at the periphery occasions readjustments in the interior of the field. Truth-values have to be redistributed over some of our statements…But the total field is so underdetermined by its boundary conditions, experience, that there is much latitude of choice as to what statements to reevaluate in the light of any single experience. No particular experiences are linked with any particular statements in the interior of the field, except indirectly through considerations of equilibrium affecting the field as a whole….

ii. A Bootstrapping Solution

Glymour’s bootstrapping approach to evidence, if tenable, provides an ingenious response to the problem posed by Duhem and Quine, for it extracts a kernel of truth from the problem while rejecting what seems most pernicious about it. First of all, we are urged by Glymour not accept the problem, as Quine does, but instead take it as exposing the key weaknesses in the hypothetico-deductive account of evidence that generates it, namely, that such an approach makes the bearing of evidence on the theory unacceptably indiscriminate. Indeed, the irrelevant conjunction problem, as we saw in §2ci, reveals essentially the same flaw. Accordingly, far from accepting hypothetico-deductivism and the holism that comes along with it, we ought to reject the hypothetico-deductive approach on the bases that it fails to meet a crucial constraint on any acceptable theory of evidence, namely, how an observation or test can be relevant to one part of a theory while not to others.

Of course, the bootstrap approach is devised to satisfy exactly this very constraint. Again, according to this approach, we use other hypotheses in the general theory under test, together with observational data, to derive a confirming or disconfirming instance of a specific hypothesis in the theory; and we are enjoined to repeat the same process for the other individual hypotheses composing the theory itself. So while hypothetico-deductivism has the evidence entailed by a mass of theory, leaving underdetermination and holism as the inevitable consequences, bootstrapping has the evidence and a mass of theory entailing an instance of an hypothesis within it, which allows the evidence to bear specifically on a single hypothesis of interest. Hence, we can see that, contrary to holism, evidence does bear on specific parts of the theory, but, crucially, it does not do so in isolation from other parts of the theory. Thus, what is correct about holism is the notion that large parts of a theory must always be involved in theory-testing; what is not correct is to conclude from this, as Duhem and Quine do, that a piece of evidence does not bear on one part of the theory without bearing upon all of it. Of course, the plausibility of this solution can be no greater than the plausibility of the bootstrap approach as a whole, which as mentioned above, some have questioned.

iii. A Bayesian Solution

To consider a different sort of approach, subjective Bayesians (see §2a) use Bayes’ theorem, the positive/negative-relevance definition of evidence and their own subjective interpretation of probability, to illustrate how evidence can indeed single out one hypothesis among others for rejection. (Recall that, for the subjectivist, a probability is a rational subject’s degree of belief in a proposition at a given time). While these illustrations are too complicated to spell out in all their detail here, we will consider an abridged account of an illustration offered by Jon Dorling, employing a case from the 19th century physics. Our hypothesis H is Newton’s theory of motion and gravitation, and the auxiliary hypothesis A is the assumption that tidal effects do not influence secular lunar accelerations. We will suppose that H and A together entail the expected observed acceleration of the moon E´, but what is observed instead is the anomalous lunar acceleration E. Thus E tells us that H and A cannot both be true, but the problem, again, is that it seems to underdetermine which one of the two hypotheses we are to believe.

On the Bayesian view, what we need to consider are the separate effects wrought by E on the probabilities of H and A. Accordingly, the goal will be to compare P(H/E) and P(A/E), both of which can be conveniently calculated by means of Bayes’ theorem:

P(H/E) = P(H)P(E/H) / P(E)
P(A/E) = P(A)P(E/A) / P(E)

With this framework intact, we now need to assign a plausible probability distribution to the right-hand sides of these equations that would mirror the degrees of belief of a typical scientist at the time. Since the typical scientist had much confidence in both H and A, but somewhat less so in A, we can plausibly set P(H) to .9 and P(A) to .6. Next, we need to determine the so-called likelihoods, P(E/H) and P(E/A). Given some uncontroversial transformations, the details of which we will pass over here, it turns out that

P(E/H) = P(E/A & H)P(A) + P(E/~A & H)P(~A)
P(E/A) = P(E/A & H)P(H) + P(E/A & ~H)P(~H)

Now, since the obtaining of E refutes the conjunction of A&H, we already know that P(E/A&H) here would be 0. Thus the above reduce to:

P(E/H) = P(E/~A & H)P(~A)
P(E/A) = P(E/A & ~H)P(~H)

Since we already have P(A) and P(H), we can easily determine P(~A) and P(~H), which will be 0.4 and 0.1, respectively. So the object, now, is to determine P(E/~A & H) and P(E/A & ~H). It is plausible to suppose that, while scientists at the time would believe E to be highly unlikely given H and ~A (say, P(E/~A & H) = .05), it is clear that, given the wide acceptance of Newtonian theory at the time, they would take E to be virtually inexplicable if H were false. That is, the typical scientist at the time would be highly skeptical that there is a competitor to H that could account for E. Granted this, we can plausibly set P(E/A & ~H) to a very low .001. Plugging in our figures we obtain:

P(E/H) = P(E/~A & H)P(~A) = (.05) x (.4) = .02
P(E/A) = P(E/A & ~H)P(~H) = (.001) x (.1) = .0001

This gives us all the figures in the numerator of Bayes’ theorem. We still need to determine the denominator P(E). To expedite matters, we will simply suppose, as was surely the case, that our scientist believes E would be very unexpected, and will stipulate that P(E) ≈ 0.02.

Thus, we now have all of our figures to plug into the above Bayes’ theorem. Performing the calculations we find that P(H/E) ≈ .9, while P(A/E) ≈ .003. Accordingly, while the probability of Newton’s theory would be virtually unchanged given E, the probability of A given E is reduced to almost zero. But, according to the relevance definition of evidence, this means that E is very strong evidence against the auxiliary A, and not Newton’s theory. Clearly, then, it was the auxiliary A and not Newton’s theory that should have been—and was—discarded in light of E. Hence, what Bayesians offer is the machinery with which we can work out exactly how evidence bears on one hypothesis more than others. If this view is correct, the problem of holism and underdetermination would be resolved.

Some have questioned whether this constitutes a solution at all (Mayo 1996, Earman 1992). While we are certainly given probabilities that make the choice of hypothesis obvious, we are not told whether those corresponding degrees of belief would be warranted, and thus whether the choice to reject an auxiliary would be a good one. Indeed, the flexibility of subjective Bayesianism would allow a different probability distribution, according to which H rather than A would bear the brunt of the evidence. But if it would be acceptable to blame either A or H, it seems that, instead of a solution, we have a re-description of the problem—namely, which hypothesis do we reject in light of the evidence?

But for the subjective Bayesian, the objection is entirely specious. Such probability distributions would be warranted, so long as they conform to the axioms of the probability calculus. On the subjective Bayesian view, there is simply more than one rational perspective on a matter.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Achinstein, Peter (ed.) (1983) The Concept of Evidence (Oxford: Oxford University
    Press). 

    • A short collection of essential reading on the evidential relationship.
  • Achinstein, Peter (1995) “Are Empirical Evidence Claims A Priori?” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 46: 447-73.
    • Discusses the question of whether claims to have evidence for an hypothesis are themselves empirical, or known by mere calculation or logic.
  • Achinstein, Peter (2001) The Book of Evidence (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • An extended presentation of Achinstein’s own account of evidence, as well as applications of that account to the paradoxes of grue and the ravens, and the issue of scientific realism.
  • Achinstein, Peter (ed.) (2005) Scientific Evidence: Philosophical Theories and Applications (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press).
    • A collection of papers by various authors addressing Achinstein’s and other views of evidence (including the error-statistical view), along with several papers on the nature of evidence in particular sciences.
  • Audi, Robert (2003) “Contemporary Modest Foundationalism” in Louis J. Pojman (ed.) The Theory of Knowledge: Classical and Contemporary Readings. (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth).
    • Uses the epistemic regress argument to support a view of foundationalism on which experiences count as evidence. Very clear and accessible.
  • Bonjour, Lawrence (1980) “Externalist Theories of Empirical Knowledge” in P.A. French, T.E. Uehling, Jr., H.K. Wettstein (eds.) Minnesota Studies in Philosophy 5: Studies in Epistemology (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press).
    • Classic critique of externalist/reliabilist theories of epistemic justification, and whether one can have justified belief without evidence of one’s reliability, or with evidence against one’s reliability.
  • Brandom, Robert (2000) “Insights and Blindspots of Reliabilism” in Articulating Reasons: An Introduction to Inferentialism (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Among other things, questions how far the notion of reliability can separate justification from reasons for belief or evidence.
  • Carnap, Rudolf (1950) The Logical Foundations of Probability (Chicago: University of
    Chicago Press). 

    • A quantitative approach to confirmation developing Carnap’s own logical or a priori theory to probability. Highly technical but very influential.
  • Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard (2004) Evidentialism. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • Collection of papers surrounding—and defending—the thesis of evidentialism. See especially the papers “Evidentialism”, “Having Evidence”, and “Internalism Defended”.
  • Davidson, Donald (1990) “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge” in A.R. Malachowski (ed.) Reading Rorty. Critical Responses to Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (and Beyond) (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers).
    • An argument for various coherence theories, relating essentially to Davidson’s influential views in semantics.
  • Duhem, Pierre (1954) The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory, translated by P Wiener
    (New York: Athenium). 

    • Classic work in the philosophy of science presenting the problem of underdetermination, among many other important positions.
  • Dorling, Jon (1979) “Bayesian Personalism, the Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes, and Duhem’s Problem” in Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science 10: 177-87.
    • A Bayesian solution to the problem of underdetermination.
  • Earman, John (ed.) (1983) Testing Scientific Theories (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press).
    • Contains critical papers on bootstrapping. Highly technical.
  • Earman, John (1992) Bayes or Bust? (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press).
    • An assessment of Bayesian confirmation theory. Highly technical.
  • Giere, Ronald (1983) “Testing Theoretical Hypotheses” pp. 269-98 in J. Earman (ed.) Testing Scientific Theories: Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol 10 (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press).
    • Presents a severe testing approach to evidence, somewhat similar to Mayo’s.
  • Glymour, Clark (1975) “Relevant Evidence” Journal of Philosophy 72 pp. 403-420.
    • A short presentation of Glymour’s bootstrapping approach to evidence.
  • Glymour, Clark (1980) Theory and Evidence (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press).
    • An in depth presentation of bootstrapping, as well as an evaluation of Bayesian, hypothetico-deductive and Hempel’s approaches, among others. Also presents the problem of old evidence. Technical in spots.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. (1976) “What is Justified Belief?” in G.S. Pappas (ed.) Justification and Knowledge (Dordrecht: D. Reidel).
    • A paradigm of a reliabilist theory of justified belief.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. (1986) Epistemology and Cognition. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
  • Goodman, Nelson (1955) Fact, Fiction and Forecast (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Classic presentation of the grue paradox, and Goodman’s solution.
  • Hacking, Ian (1975) The Emergence of Probability. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
    • An historical account on the development of probability that contains an account of the history of the concept of inductive evidence.
  • Hempel, Carl G. (1965) Aspects of Scientific Explanation and Other Essays in the Philosophy of Science (New York: The Free Press).
    • Contains “Studies in the Logic of Confirmation”—the less technical presentation of Hempel’s positive-instance approach—as well as several other classic papers in the epistemology of science.
  • Hempel, Carl G. (1966) Philosophy of Natural Science (Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall).
    • A classic introduction to the philosophy of science that contains a very clear description of hypothetico-deductivism.
  • Howson, Colin and Urbach, Peter (1996) Scientific Reasoning: The Bayesian Approach,
    3rd Edition (Chicago: Open Court). 

    • A comprehensive presentation of the subjective Bayesian approach to scientific reasoning. Contains Bayesian treatments of many of the important problems in the epistemology of science, including old evidence, grue, the ravens paradox and the Duhem-Quine problem.
  • Kornblith, Hilary (1980) “Beyond Foundationalism and the Coherence Theory”, Journal of Philosophy LXXII: 597-612.
    • Author criticizes foundationalism and coherence theory, arriving at a kind of reliabilist theory of justified belief that combines aspects of both, but which also involves the notion of responsibility.
  • Kronz, Frederick (1992) “Carnap and Achinstein on Evidence” in Philosophical Studies 67: 151-167.
    • Contains a reply to Achinstein’s objections to positive relevance.
  • Mayo, Deborah (1996) Error and the Growth of Experimental Knowledge (Chicago:
    University of Chicago Press). 

    • Mayo’s error-statistical approach to scientific reasoning. Technical in spots.
  • Maher, Patrick (1996) “Subjective and Objective Confirmation” in Philosophy of Science
    63: 149-174. 

    • Contains a defense of positive-relevance against Achinstein, as well as a presentation of the authors own objective theory of confirmation, in opposition to the subjective Bayesian view.
  • McDowell, John (1996) Mind and World. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).
    • Provocative work in which the author navigates between the pitfalls of coherentism and traditional foundationalism, arguing among other things that experience contains propositional content, and thus can stand in rational relationship to belief. Not nearly as difficult or obscure as it often made out to be.
  • Mill, John Stuart (1888) A System of Logic. 8th ed. (New York: Harper and Brothers).
    • A classic work on inductive reasoning, among other things, presenting Mill’s criticisms of hypothetico-deductivism, as well as his contribution to his famous debate with 19th century hypothetico-deductivist William Whewell.
  • Nozick, Robert (1981) Philosophical Explanations, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Contains Nozick’s “truth-tracking” account of evidence (and knowledge).
  • Pryor, James (2000) “The Skeptic and the Dogmatist”, Nous, 34, pp. 517-49.
    • Argues for a modest foundationalism about perceptual beliefs on which experience counts as evidence.
  • Quine, W. V. (1951) “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” in the Philosophical Review vol. 60.
    • Quine’s rejection of reductionism and the analytic-synthetic distinction, with its attendant holism.
  • Quine, W. V. (1992) The Pursuit of Truth. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • A compressed and accessible presentation of many of Quine’s philosophical views, with the first chapter devoted entirely to evidence.
  • Roush, Sherrilyn (2005) “Positive Relevance: a defense and challenge” in Scientific Evidence: Philosophical Theories and Applications, P. Achinstein ed. (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press).
    • A paper co-written with Achinstein where Roush defends positive-relevance, and Achinstein attacks it once more.
  • Roush, Sherrilyn (2006) Tracking Truth: Knowledge, Evidence and Science (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • Updates Nozick’s truth-tracking account of evidence (and knowledge).
  • Snyder, Laura J (1994) “Is Evidence Historical?” reprinted in Philosophy of Science: The Central Issues, Curd and Cover (eds.) (New York: Norton).
    • A contribution to the debate over whether knowing about evidence prior to formulating a theory makes a difference to whether and to what extent the evidence supports the theory.
  • Stalker, Douglas, ed. (1994) Grue! The New Riddle of Induction (Princeton: Princeton University Press).
    • A large collection of papers on the grue paradox.
  • Williamson, Timothy (2000) Knowledge and its Limits (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • An important work in recent epistemology that contains chapters devoted especially to evidence. See especially chapters 8, 9 and 10.

Author Information

Victor DiFate
Email: vdifate1@jhu.edu
Johns Hopkins University
U. S. A.




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