Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Evidentialism

Evidentialism in epistemology is defined by the following thesis about epistemic justification:

(EVI) Person S is justified in believing proposition p at time t if and only if S’s evidence for p at t supports believing p.

As evidentialism is a thesis about epistemic justification, it is a thesis about what it takes for one to believe justifiably, or reasonably, in the sense thought to be necessary for knowledge. Particular versions of evidentialism can diverge in virtue of their providing different claims about what sorts of things count as evidence, what it is for one to have evidence, and what it is for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition. Thus, while (EVI) is often referred to as the theory of epistemic justification known as evidentialism, it is more accurately conceived as a kind of epistemic theory. In this light, (EVI) can be seen as the central, guiding thesis of evidentialism. All evidentialist theories conform to (EVI), but various divergent theories of evidentialism can be formulated.

Before turning to these issues, it is worth noting that evidentialism is also a prominent theory in the philosophy of religion. Evidentialism in the philosophy of religion has its own set of controversies, but this entry will not cover them. On evidentialism in the philosophy of religion, see Alvin Plantinga’s classic article, “Reason and Belief in God.” For a more extended discussion, see Plantinga’s Warranted Christian Belief.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief Prima Facie Case
  2. Developing the Theory
    1. The Justification of Propositions v. The Justification of Beliefs
    2. Evidence
    3. Having Evidence
    4. Support
  3. Objections
    1. Forgotten Evidence
    2. Against a Probabilistic-Deductive Understanding of Support
    3. Essential Appeals to Deontology
      1. Ought Implies Can
      2. An Evidence-Gathering Requirement
      3. Duties Not to Follow One’s Evidence
    4. A Pragmatic Reply
    5. Rationally Believing Skepticism is False
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. More Advanced Studies

1. A Brief Prima Facie Case

When we think about what it takes for one to believe reasonably or justifiably, we think that one has to have good reasons (or, more accurately, adequate reason for thinking the proposition in question is true). We think that one is not believing as one should when one believes something for no reason whatsoever or for very weak reasons. This dependence on reasons seems to be central to the very concept of justified belief. It should be no surprise, then, that the traditional view holds that one is justified only if one has adequate reasons for belief. Thus, evidentialism can be thought of as the default, or commonsense, conception of epistemic justification. Indeed, we can see the centrality of this conception of justification throughout the history of philosophy, especially in its grappling with the problem of skepticism. In order to justify denying skeptical claims, we want to know what reason we have for believing that skepticism is false. Traditional accounts have looked to one’s available evidence or reasons for an answer.

Naturally, then, we see this traditional conception reflected in the writings of many influential philosophers. David Hume, for example, writes that the “wise man. . . proportions his belief to the evidence,” and he proceeds with this as his epistemic ideal (73). Bertrand Russell endorses the view that “[p]erfect rationality consists . . . in attaching to every proposition a degree of belief corresponding to its degree of credibility,” credibility functionally depending on evidence (397-398). W.K. Clifford writes that “it is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” (518). Such quotations help to illustrate the dominance of the view that justified belief depends upon one’s having good reasons or evidence. Though this by no means settles the issue, it does provide reason to try to work out a theory of justification that appeals solely to evidence. The remainder of this entry turns toward a detailed consideration of the theory itself.

2. Developing the Theory

Richard Feldman and Earl Conee, two leading defenders of evidentialism, have explicitly defined evidentialism as a thesis about the justificatory status of all of the doxastic attitudes: belief, disbelief, and suspension of judgment. They write that doxastic attitude, d, toward p is justified for one at t if and only if one’s evidence at t supports one’s taking d towards p (15). So understood, evidentialism is not just a thesis about justified belief, it is also a thesis about justified disbelief and the justified withholding of belief. Only one doxastic attitude towards a proposition is justified for a person at a time, and this is a function of one’s evidence. Here, I focus on the core of evidentialism—the thesis about justified belief given in (EVI)—both for simplicity and because most treatments and criticisms of evidentialism focus on it. What is said about (EVI) can be extended naturally to the rest of the doxastic attitudes and thereby applied to Feldman and Conee’s explicit thesis.

a. The Justification of Propositions v. The Justification of Beliefs

Before proceeding, it is crucial to nail down more exactly what evidentialism is a theory of. As I have defined it in (EVI), evidentialism is the thesis that one is justified in believing a proposition at a time if and only if one’s evidence at that time supports believing that proposition. (EVI) does not entail that whenever one has adequate evidence for p one believes p justifiably. This is for two reasons. First, one can be justified in believing p even if one fails to believe it. For example, one might not believe p simply because one fails to consider whether or not p is true, yet one may nevertheless have good enough reason to think p is true and so be justified in believing p.

Second, one can have good enough reason to believe p and still believe it as a result of something other than this good reason. One might believe it as a result of wishful thinking, for example. In such a case, the evidentialist holds that the person is justified in believing the proposition in question but, nevertheless, believes it unjustifiably. One believes it for or because of the wrong reasons. One way of putting the difference here is by saying that evidentialism is a thesis regarding propositional justification, not a thesis about doxastic justification. That is, evidentialism is a thesis about when one is justified in believing a proposition, not a thesis about when one’s believing is justified. The latter requires not just that one have good reason to believe but also that one believe for those good reasons.

b. Evidence

As introduced above, evidentialism is a kind of theory of epistemic justification; one can formulate various divergent evidentialist theories by providing different analyses of its constituent concepts. The present section focuses on the central notion of evidence and explicates the various ways that one can restrict the sorts of things that count as evidence. Sections 2c. and 2d. turn to complexities in other parts of (EVI). Together, these three sections illustrate the diversity of possible evidentialist theories.

Evidence for or against p is, roughly, any information relevant to the truth or falsity of p. This is why we think that fingerprints and DNA left at the scene of the crime, eye-witness testimony, and someone’s whereabouts at the time the crime was committed all count as evidence for or against the hypothesis that the suspect committed the crime. The sort of evidence that interests the evidentialist, however, is not just anything whatsoever that is relevant to the truth of the proposition in question. The evidentialist denies that such facts about mind-independent reality are evidence in the sense relevant to determining justification. According to (EVI) only facts that one has are relevant to determining what one is justified in believing, and in order for one to have something in the relevant sense, one has to be aware of, to know about, or to, in some sense, “mentally possess” it. The sort of evidence the evidentialist is interested in, therefore, is restricted to mental entities (or, roughly, to mental “information”). In addition, it is only one’s own mental information that is relevant to determining whether one is justified in believing that p. For example, my belief that Jones was in Buffalo at the time the crime was committed is not relevant to determining whether you are justified in believing that Jones committed the crime.

Evidentialist theories can agree on this much while still providing differing accounts of evidence. For example, one might think that only one’s own beliefs can provide one with reason to believe something, as many coherentists do. An evidentialist might then hold that only belief states are evidential states. One’s experiences (that is, experiential states) then would not be evidentially or justificatorily relevant. The standard view of evidentialism, however, is that at least beliefs and perceptual states are evidential states. Not only what you believe but also what you experience can provide you with reason to believe that something is the case. Yet one does not have to stop there. One, for example, might also count memories, apparent memories, or seemings-to-be-true as kinds of evidence. In the end, what sorts of states one takes to be evidential will depend both on one’s intuitions about what sorts of things can provide one with genuine reason to believe and also on one’s strategy for responding to objections.

It is worth noting that while evidentialists have available many options about what to count as kinds of evidence, not just anything mental can properly be classified as evidence. In general, only those states or properties that are themselves informational (or at least can directly and on their own “communicate” information to the subject) can properly be classified as evidential states or properties. Regardless of whether one’s feeling of pain is an informational state, it does, so to speak, directly or on its own “communicate” information to one; so it is open to the evidentialist to classify it as an evidential state. By contrast, one’s ability to, e.g., identify complex geometrical shapes in one’s visual field is not itself a kind of evidence. (Even though this ability will undoubtedly provide one with evidence one would otherwise not possess.) The ability to identify complex geometrical shapes in one’s visual field is not a kind of evidence because it is neither an informational state, nor is it a state that directly and on its own “communicates” information to one. Instead, it is always something else that gets “communicated” to one via that ability. In general, therefore, cognitive abilities are not properly considered as part of one’s evidence. As we will see below, though, this is not to say that one’s cognitive abilities are completely irrelevant to justification on every evidentialist view.

c. Having Evidence

As alluded to above, not just any evidence whatsoever is relevant to determining whether one’s belief is justified; it is only the evidence that one has that is so relevant. The obvious restriction this imposes is that one’s evidence includes only one’s own mental states. One option, then, is to hold that one’s evidence at a time (or, alternatively, the evidence one has at a time) consists in all of the evidential mental states that obtain in the person at that time, including both occurrent and nonoccurrent mental states. On this view, one’s evidence includes not only one’s present experiences and those beliefs presently “before one’s mind” but also stored or standing beliefs, even if one is not presently able to recall or consciously consider them.

To see how this account of having evidence affects the consequences of the theory, consider the following example. Suppose that I believe that most television newscasters reliably report the day’s news. I find that television newscasters almost always report the day’s stories in ways consistent with that reported by other news outlets. For example, if the newscaster were to report that a fire occurred on Elm Street, I would also be able to find a report in the newspaper confirming that a fire did, indeed, occur on Elm Street. When I discuss this topic with people, they tend to agree that this is the case, and I have no strong evidence against this belief. It seems, then, that I justifiably believe that most television newscasters reliably report the news. Also suppose that fifteen years ago I heard reliable testimony that one newscaster, Mick Stuppagin, almost always provides incorrect reports. At the time, I believed that Mick was a very unreliable newscaster. Suppose, however, that although my belief that Mick’s reports are unreliable and the testimony that such is the case are still stored in my long-term memory, I am presently unable to recall them. If someone mentions Mick Stuppagin and asks whether I think he is a reliable newscaster, I may form the belief that he is a reliable newscaster on the basis of my justified belief that most newscasters are reliable.

On the view developed above, I would be believing unjustifiably, since I have outweighing evidence against p. I would not be justified in believing that Mick is a reliable newscaster even though I may be utterly unable to recall my evidence against this belief, even though my so believing may be completely blameless, and even though it may seem to me on deep reflection that I am believing as I should. Some may find this counterintuitive and, as a result, may want to formulate a more restricted account of having evidence.

One such option is to hold that the evidence one has at a time is restricted to one’s occurrent evidential states—i.e., those states involving one’s current assent, those presently “before one’s mind,” so to speak. On this account of having evidence, my stored memory belief that Mick Stuppagin is an unreliable newscaster is not evidence that I have at the present time. Furthermore, it is also not clearly true that I have as evidence my belief that most television newscasters reliably report the day’s news, and it is doubtful that my testimonial and inductive evidence for this belief is properly considered evidence that I presently have. The justificatory status of my present belief about Mick Stuppagin will depend solely on my occurrent evidential states. (The details of the case would need to be filled in order to determine whether or not the theory implies that belief is justified.)

The difficulty for this view is to show how such a restricted view of one’s having evidence can account for the justification of all of the beliefs we think are justified. For instance, we think we have some non-occurrent beliefs that are justified. We need an explanation of this. Similarly, it seems that as soon as I occurrently entertain the proposition that George Washington was the first president of the United States, I am justified in believing it, and its being so justified does not depend upon my consciously recalling anything. Those who restrict the evidence one has to one’s occurrent states need either to provide an explanation of this or to in some way explain away these common intuitions.

Other accounts of having evidence lie between these two extremes. A more typical “internalist” account might hold, for example, that the evidence one has at a time is that which is easily available to one upon reflection, so not all of one’s beliefs count as evidence that one has at a time. On this account, I am presently justified in believing that Mick is a reliable newscaster if and only if my stored memory belief that Mick is an unreliable newscaster (and its supporting evidence) is not easily available to me upon reflection. Various other accounts of having evidence can be developed that allow for varying degrees of availability or varying amounts of reflection. Guiding each account of having evidence are intuitions regarding cases similar to that above and intuitions regarding the extent to which justification is deontological.

We can conclude from the above that evidentialist theories can be formulated so as to account for widely divergent intuitions regarding cases. Furthermore, without a specific account of what it is for one to have evidence, it is not clear which proposed cases are to count as counterexamples to the theory.

d. Support

Recall that on the evidentialist view, S is justified in believing p at t if and only if S’s evidence for p at t supports believing p. We have already seen how evidentialists can provide different accounts of evidence and having evidence. The present section focuses on complexities with the notion of support.

Perhaps the most obvious issue that needs to be addressed in order to understand what it is for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition is the degree to which one’s evidence must support that proposition in order for one to be justified in believing it. Again, this will vary from account to account. One standard account understands it as follows: one is justified in believing a proposition only if the evidence that one has makes it more likely to be true than not. The likelihood of truth given one’s evidence has to be greater than 0.5 in order for one to be justified in believing the proposition, but the threshold required for knowledge might be much higher. In order to know that p, one might not merely have to justifiably believe that p; one might have to justifiably believe it to a certain degree.

This way of understanding the degree of support required in order for one to be justified in believing p is absolute, or we might say non-contextual. The degree required is the same across all possible cases. By contrast, Stewart Cohen presents a contextualist version of evidentialism. On his account, the degree to which one’s evidence must support a proposition in order for one to be justified in believing it will fluctuate with the conversationally determined standards that govern attributions of justification and knowledge. An immediate result is that one’s evidence for p may be enough to make believing p justified in one context (where the conversationally-determined standards for justification are relatively low) while failing to make believing p justified in another context (where the standards for justification are much higher). Evidentialism is, therefore, consistent with both contextualist theories of justification and non-contextualist theories of justification.

A further, more central epistemological issue regarding support has to do with the structure of justification. Evidentialism may be combined with foundationalism, coherentism, a “mixed” view such as Susan Haack’s foundherentism, or any other theory of the structure of justification. Each theory may be incorporated into evidentialism by understanding them as providing an account of the proper nature of epistemic support. Since foundationalism is far more dominant than the other theories, in what follows I will present one way of developing evidentialism with regard to it.

According to foundationalism, a belief is justified if and only if: either it is a foundational belief or it is supported by beliefs which either are themselves foundational beliefs or are ultimately supported by foundational beliefs. From the previous section, we have seen that it is only the evidence one has that is relevant to determining whether a belief is justified. Of all of this, foundationalism implies that only that evidence which is non-doxastic, foundational, or ultimately supported by a foundational belief is capable of supporting (or conferring positive justificatory status on) a belief. (Non-doxastic evidential states may include appearance states, direct apprehensions, rational intuitions, and seemings-to-be-true. For the foundationalist, some such evidential states are crucial as only they can justify the foundational beliefs.)

Assuming this framework, we can proceed as follows. In order to determine whether one is justified in believing that p, first isolate the portion of the evidence that is non-doxastic, foundational, or ultimately supported by a foundational belief. Only this is capable of justifying a proposition. Next, if the proposition under consideration is believed, subtract that belief and anything else whose support essentially depends on (or traces back to) that belief. (This last modification is intended to accommodate the foundationalist thesis that only the more basic can justify the less basic. See, for example, the discussion in section 3e. below.) Finally, determine whether this portion of one’s evidence makes the proposition more likely true than not. If so, then it is prima facie supported by one’s evidence (and thus prima facie justified). If not, it is unjustified, for it is not supported by the evidence one has that is able to justify one’s believing the proposition.

Note that I have had to add a prima facie qualification here. This is due to the, at least, apparent possibility of one’s support for a belief being defeated by other evidence one has that is neither non-doxastic, nor foundational, nor ultimately supported by foundational beliefs. An unjustified belief may be able to defeat the positive justification one has for believing p, but such unjustified beliefs have so far been excluded from consideration. In such a case, we may want to say that one would not be justified in believing p.

3. Objections

The aim in this section is to provide a sampling of objections that have been raised against evidentialist theories of justification. The aim is not to respond to these objections on behalf of the evidentialist nor to evaluate their strength. While the following are not objections to all possible versions of evidentialism, together they illustrate the difficulty in formulating a complete and adequate evidentialist theory. The chief difficulty for the evidentialist is to develop the theory in a way that avoids all such objections and does so in an independently motivated and principled way.

a. Forgotten Evidence

One kind of objection stems from the widespread occurrence of one’s forgetting the evidence that one once had for some proposition. We can distinguish between two sorts of cases here. According to the first sort, though one once had good evidence for believing, one has since forgotten it. Nevertheless, one may continue to believe justifiably, even without coming to possess any additional evidence. Evidentialism appears unable to account for this. According to the second sort of case, when one originally came to believe p, one had no evidence to support believing p. Perhaps one originally came to believe p for very bad reasons. Consequently, just after one formed the belief, one was not believing justifiably as one’s total evidence did not support believing that p. Suppose, though, that one has since forgotten why it is that one originally formed the belief and also has forgotten all of the evidence one had against it. Since it doesn’t seem as though in the interim one has to have gained some additional evidence for p, one might think that the subject of the second case remains unjustified in believing p. The relevant beliefs in both cases appear to be on an evidential par: neither belief seems to be supported by adequate evidence. The objection is that there, nevertheless, is a justificatory difference between the two cases, and evidentialism is unable to account for this.

The details of the cases proposed along these lines are crucial, for evidentialists may be able to motivate a denial of the critic’s justificatory assessment of one of the cases. This, however, is only of help when combined with an explanation for the justification of memory beliefs in general and memory beliefs involving forgotten evidence in particular.

Here evidentialists can appeal to the notion of evidence and to what sorts of states or properties are properly classified as evidential. For example, one may argue that the “felt impulse” to believe the proposition recalled from memory or its “seeming to be true” is itself a kind of evidence. On this account, in the first case one is justified in believing p because one does have evidence that supports believing p. The supporting evidence is the proposition’s “seeming to be true” or the “felt impulse” that accompanies the belief, but this very same evidence is present in the second case as well. Furthermore, this “felt impulse” or “seeming to be true” will necessarily accompany any memory belief, so there will be no cases along the lines of the second sort in which one has no evidence to support believing p. As a result, the critic’s appraisal of the second case is mistaken. In the absence of overriding counter-evidence, one’s memory belief is justified, so the correct appraisal of the second case holds that one is justified in believing p. In short, the critic’s justificatory assessment of the second case is mistaken.

b. Against a Probabilistic-Deductive Understanding of Support

A second objection targets the notion of one’s evidence supporting a proposition. As I have developed the notion of support above, part of it is given by some theory of probability. A body of evidence, e, supports believing some proposition p only if e makes p probable. If we suppose for simplicity that all of the beliefs that constitute e are themselves justified, we can say that e supports believing p if and only if e makes p probable. However, one might argue that, even with this assumption, one’s evidence e can make p probable without one being justified in believing that p. If this is so, the resulting evidentialist thesis is false.

Alvin Goldman, for example, has argued that the possession of reasons that make p probable, all things considered, is not sufficient for p to be justified (Epistemology and Cognition, 89-93). The crux of the case he considers is as follows. Suppose that while investigating a crime a detective has come to know a set of facts. These facts do establish that it is overwhelmingly likely that Jones has committed the crime, but it is only an extremely complex statistical argument that shows this. Perhaps the detective is utterly unable to understand how the evidence he has gathered supports this proposition. In such a case, it seems wrong to say that the detective is justified in believing the proposition, since he does not even have available to him a way of reasoning from the evidence to the conclusion that Jones did it. He has no idea how the evidence makes the proposition that Jones did it likely. Thus, the evidentialist thesis, so understood, is false.

The appeal to probability and statistics here is not essential to this sort of objection, so it would be a mistake to focus solely on this feature of the case in attempting to respond. Richard Feldman has presented an example which is supposed to demonstrate exactly this point. His example of the beginning logic student is supposed to show that being necessitated by one’s evidence is not sufficient for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition (“Authoritarian Epistemology,” 150). Feldman asks us to consider a logic student who is just learning to identify valid arguments. She has learned a set of rules by which one can distinguish between valid arguments and invalid arguments, but she has not yet become proficient at applying them to particular argument forms. She looks at an exercise in her text that asks her to determine whether some argument forms are valid. She looks at one problem and comes to believe that it is, indeed, a valid argument. As the argument is valid, she believes exactly as her evidence entails she should believe, but she is presently unable to see how it is that the rules show the argument is, indeed, valid. Despite her evidence necessitating the proposition that the argument is valid, it seems she is not justified in believing it.

Various responses are available to the evidentialist. One may here appeal to the distinction between propositional justification and doxastic justification in an effort to motivate the claim that the detective is justified in believing that Jones did it and the student is justified in believing that the argument is valid. When combined with a fully developed and well-motivated theory of evidential support, this may provide a response to these examples. Note, however, that this reply depends crucially on being able to hold that the logic student is justified in believing p but not justifiably believing p. This is a tenuous position, at least for standard accounts of the basing relation—i.e., for standard accounts of that which, when added to an instance of propositional justification, yields an instance of doxastic justification. The dominant view is that the basing relation is causal, and the student’s evidence for believing that the argument is valid is causing her belief, and it is not doing so in some non-standard, deviant way. The reply to the objection that appeals to the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification demands, therefore, that one also provide a satisfactory account of the basing relation, and none have so far been formulated.

An alternative response to these examples is simply to accept their lesson. One might just accept that such examples show that we need to develop a notion of evidential support that does not appeal solely to logical relations between one’s evidence and those propositions under consideration. For example, one might hold that one must, in some sense, grasp or appreciate the logical or probabilistic connection between one’s evidence and the proposition in question in order for that evidence to support it. Evidentialism allows for such possibilities.

c. Essential Appeals to Deontology

The view that justification is, in some substantive way, a deontological concept motivates the following three objections. According to a deontological conception of epistemic justification, one has an intellectual duty, requirement, or obligation to believe justifiably. Deontologists commonly hold that people are rightly praised for believing or blamed for failing to believe in accordance with this duty or obligation.

i. Ought Implies Can

Many believe that this deontological conception of epistemic justification entails that one ought to believe a proposition only if one can believe it. Put differently, one might think that one has to be able to believe p in order for one to be justified in believing p. (This second statement of the issue is more perspicuous, as I here set aside issues regarding doxastic voluntarism.) Some propositions are too complicated and complex for a given person to entertain given his or her actual abilities, and other propositions are too complex for humans to even possibly entertain. It seems wrong to say that one is justified in believing that these extremely complex propositions are true. (EVI), however, appears to imply that one can be justified in believing such extremely complex propositions, especially given the theories of evidence and evidential support sketched in section 2d. above. If, however, (EVI) does have this consequence, then one might conclude that evidentialism is false.

The argument here has two main premises. The first premise is that (EVI) entails that one can be justified in believing a proposition that it is impossible for one to entertain. The second premise is that if this first premise is true, then (EVI) is false. Because evidentialism neither rules out nor entails the motivating deontological conception of epistemic justification, evidentialists can plausibly deny either premise.

Standard accounts of evidentialism deny the first premise. According to these accounts, the proper nature of evidential support rules out the possibility that one’s evidence can support a proposition that one cannot entertain. Evidential support is, in this sense, restricted. Whether or not such evidentialist theories are acceptable depends crucially on whether evidentialism is able to accommodate this restriction in a principled way. Here evidentialists can appeal to meta-epistemological considerations regarding the nature of epistemic justification, as well as to intuitions about a sufficiently varied set of cases. For instance, the deontological conception of justification itself can motivate and help explain a companion deontological conception of evidential support. In addition, one can appeal to cases like Feldman’s logic student example (in section 3b. above) in order to illustrate how the notion of evidential support should be restricted. Together, these considerations can help to motivate one’s evidentialist theory. In this way, one can formulate a version of evidentialism that clearly does not have the consequence that one can be justified in believing a proposition that one cannot entertain.

By contrast, an evidentialist who rejects a deontological conception of justification may accept that one can be justified in believing propositions too complex even to consider and as a result may reject the second premise of the argument. Again, the theory of evidentialism itself allows this. This second response to the argument would need to be strengthened by considerations against the motivating deontological conception of epistemic justification, but considering these in this entry would take us too far astray. The crucial point to emphasize here is that evidentialism neither rules out nor entails this conception of epistemic justification, so both responses are consistent with the theory.

ii. An Evidence-Gathering Requirement

Some argue that the justification of a belief depends, at least in part, on the inquiry that led to the belief. Two ways this can get fleshed out are as follows. One might argue that only beliefs that result from “epistemically responsible behavior” can be justified. In order to be justified on such a view, one must not only follow one’s evidence but also gather evidence in an epistemically responsible way. Alternatively, one might argue that one is not justified in believing a proposition if one could have easily discovered (or should have discovered) evidence that defeated one’s present justification for it. Here, we focus primarily on the latter.

When developing evidentialism in his introductory textbook, Epistemology, Richard Feldman presents the following example.

A professor and his wife are going to the movies to see Star Wars, Episode 68. The professor has in his hand today’s newspaper which contains the listings of movies at the theater and their times. He remembers that yesterday’s paper said that Star Wars, Episode 68 was showing at 8:00. Knowing that movies usually show at the same time each day, he believes that it is showing today at 8:00 as well. He does not look in today’s paper. When they get to the theater, they discover that the movie started at 7:30. When they complain at the box office about the change, they are told that the correct time was listed in the newspaper today. The professor’s wife says that he should have looked in today’s paper and he was not justified in thinking it started at 8:00. (47)

The professor has good evidence to believe that the movie starts at 8:00, but the claim is that he is not justified in believing this because he should have (and could have very easily) gathered defeating evidence. Evidentialism does not take into account one’s evidence-gathering and, thus, cannot account for this intuition.

Evidentialism is a theory about the present justificatory status of propositions and beliefs for subjects. It provides an account of what one should now believe, given one’s actual situation. Feldman claims that this is the central epistemological question; it alone determines the justificatory status of one’s beliefs. There are other questions about when one ought to gather more evidence, but these, Feldman claims, should be carefully distinguished from questions regarding epistemic justification (Epistemology, 48). As it is, the professor is believing exactly as he ought to believe as he is driving to the theater. As a result, Feldman concludes, evidentialism provides the correct answer about this case.

iii. Duties Not to Follow One’s Evidence

The previous objection to evidentialism attempted to demonstrate that having evidence that supports believing p is not sufficient for being justified in believing p. One might also attempt to demonstrate this by providing examples that do not appeal to evidence gathering requirements. The following is one such example.

Suppose that Bill comes to possess overwhelming evidence that his recently deceased wife was having multiple affairs throughout their marriage. If he were to come to believe what his evidence supports, he would blame his children and himself. We can further suppose that he is presently so unstable as a result of his loss that believing that his wife was having affairs would cause him to seriously harm his children before committing suicide. In such a case, it is very clear that Bill ought not to believe that his wife was having affairs. Indeed, we might say that he has a duty not to believe exactly what his evidence supports. Since evidentialism implies that he really ought to believe that his wife was having affairs, evidentialism is false.

The standard response to these types of examples is to distinguish between different kinds of demands, oughts, and duties and to hold that sometimes these conflict. For example, we have an epistemic duty to follow our evidence, we have a practical duty to not always seek out more evidence for each of the propositions we consider, and we may also have moral duties to believe or disbelieve certain propositions. While these duties can conflict, nevertheless, the epistemic, moral, and practical demands on us remain. Thus, the response is that Bill does have an epistemic duty to believe what his evidence supports, even though he has overriding moral and prudential duties to believe that his wife was not having affairs. While this response is fairly uncontroversial, the crucial point to emphasize here is that such a move is itself a substantial thesis that is in need of support. We need to be shown in an independently motivated way why we should believe that matters should be understood in this way rather than in some other.

d. A Pragmatic Reply

William James has famously argued that having adequate evidence is not necessary for one to believe justifiably. James notes that our fears, hopes, and desires (in short, our “passions”) do influence what we believe. We do not proceed in conformance with Clifford’s evidentialist thesis, nor should we. Furthermore, when we are confronted with an option to do or not to do something, we cannot help but choose one or the other; the choice is forced. By failing to decide, we embrace one of the options. In such situations, it can be permissible for one to believe a proposition in the absence of sufficient evidence. More specifically, James argues that whenever we are confronted with a live, forced, momentous option to believe or not to believe a proposition that cannot be decided on “intellectual grounds” alone, it is permissible for us to decide on the basis of our “passional nature” (522).

Consider, for example, the proposition that God exists. Believing or failing to believe that God exists is a forced and momentous option. It is forced because we cannot help but choose one or the other; a failure to decide is, in effect, to choose to not believe that God exists. It is momentous since it is a unique opportunity to gain something supremely significant and only one of the options, belief, will deliver this supreme good. Contrary to the evidentialist, James argues that one can justifiably believe that God exists in the absence of supporting evidence if both believing that God exists and failing to believe that God exists are live options for one.

Here, again, evidentialists can respond by appealing to a distinction between different kinds of justification. One may be pragmatically or morally justified in believing against one’s evidence, but this is not to say that one is epistemically justified in so believing. For example, evidentialists can begin by noting that it is in some sense very reasonable to let our “passions” influence our actions and beliefs. It may be in one’s own interest to believe that one’s wife is not having an affair, for instance. We might put this point by saying that one is pragmatically justified in believing that one’s wife is not having an affair. Furthermore, the stakes might be so high that such pragmatic considerations outweigh any epistemic considerations we might have. Hence, even though one’s evidence does not support believing p (and one is therefore not epistemically justified in believing p), it may be, all things considered, more rational for one to believe p than to not believe p. Of course, nothing here turns on the content of the belief in question. Similar cases can be constructed for religious beliefs as well, and some evidentialists might want to focus on the particular nature of religious beliefs in order to directly respond to the religious case James considers. In summary, while it is true that non-epistemic considerations can outweigh epistemic considerations, the epistemic considerations remain. While it is not epistemically permissible to flout our evidentialist duties, we do think that in certain cases it is in some sense permissible to violate them. In this way, evidentialists can try to utilize a distinction between different kinds of justification in order to try to explain away the intuitions that appear to support James’ general thesis, as well as his claims about religious belief in particular.

e. Rationally Believing Skepticism is False

Keith DeRose has presented a more recent objection that has its roots in the philosophical challenge posed by skepticism. Two separate arguments are distinguishable here. First, DeRose argues that evidentialism appears unable to account for the degree to which he is justified in believing that particular skeptical scenarios are false (703-706). The specific argument DeRose presents makes reference to his contextualist intuitions. In the context of discussing theories of evidentialism in general, it is important to note this contextualist dimension of his argument, and I’ll make reference to it below.

DeRose thinks people are justified in believing, to a fairly substantial degree, that they are not brains in vats, and he thinks that any correct theory of epistemic justification must account for the substantial degree to which people are so justified in believing. In order to be an adequate theory of justification, therefore, evidentialism must show how the evidence people normally possess substantially supports believing that they are not brains in vats. DeRose claims that this has not yet been done, and he doubts that evidentialism can accomplish it adequately.

Second, DeRose claims that this difficulty highlights a fundamental complexity in the notion of evidence. In short, he thinks that at any given time we don’t have “one simple body of evidence that constitutes” the evidence that we have (704). For instance, it seems as though my belief that I have hands is evidence that I have and can use to support various other propositions—the proposition that I did not lose them in recent combat, for example. If, though, it is good evidence that I in fact have and can use, then it seems I should be able to appeal to it in order to argue that I am not a (handless) brain in a vat. It seems it should be uncontroversial that one’s evidence justifies one in believing that this skeptical scenario is false, yet justifying the denial of such skeptical scenarios is much more difficult than this implies. My belief that I have hands appears not to be able to justify the proposition that I am not a (handless) brain in a vat. In summary, when some issues are being discussed, my belief that I have hands is evidence I can appeal to, but when other issues are being discussed it appears not to be evidence that I can use. Evidentialism owes us an explanation of this.

As with most of the objections here considered, the force of DeRose’s points will vary with each proposed version of evidentialism. The central notions of evidence and evidential support do have to be explained, and they have to be explained in a way that allows reasonable conclusions about people’s typical appraisals of skeptical scenarios. As I have developed evidentialism in section 2 above, one can develop both contextualist and non-contextualist versions. This is especially important to note because exactly the sorts of considerations regarding skepticism DeRose invokes motivate contextualism in general and contextualist versions of evidentialism in particular. A contextualist version of evidentialism will hold that when skeptical scenarios are not being discussed, people are justified in believing to a very high degree that skeptical scenarios do not obtain. As a result, DeRose’s first argument is much more interesting and intuitively plausible when applied to non-contextualist versions of evidentialism.

The traditional responses to skepticism are exactly the responses that non-contextualist evidentialists have available. For example, non-contextualist evidentialists can utilize some closure principle or inference to the best explanation to try to account for the degree to which we think we are justified in believing that skeptical hypotheses are false. Whether these strategies succeed is controversial, but the problem of skepticism is a difficult and serious one, and no proposed solution is uncontroversial. It should be no surprise, then, that one may object to the consequences any version of evidentialism has for the skeptical challenge. The fundamental lesson here is that the evidentialist needs to develop these consequences and defend them.

The second of DeRose’s arguments is best understood as a demand for a fully developed and adequate theory of evidential support. We want to know how it is that evidence works so as to justify beliefs. This demand is wholly appropriate, of course, since evidence and evidential support are concepts central to evidentialism. On one standard account, I can appeal to the proposition that I have hands in order to come to believe justifiably that I did not lose them in combat precisely because I am justified in believing propositions about the external world (including, of course, the proposition that I have hands). Although, when one is trying to show how it is that one is justified in believing that one has hands, one obviously cannot appeal to the fact that one is justified in believing the proposition that one has hands. One needs to appeal to other propositions, propositions whose justification is prior to (or does not depend on) the justification of the proposition in question. All of this seems to be uncontroversial, but this is just to explain how evidence works so as to justify one in believing that certain propositions are true. The structure of justification is part of evidential support, and it is because some propositions are more basic than other propositions that we cannot appeal to those less basic propositions in order to justify the more basic ones. There is no unclarity here, but the explanation does help to illustrate why a response to DeRose’s first argument is so crucial. The story depends on one’s already being justified in believing some fundamental external world propositions. It is here that the evidentialist has to confront the skeptic and somehow explain how it is that we are justified in believing that skeptical hypotheses are false.

4. Conclusion

This brief treatment of evidentialism explains it as a type of theory of epistemic justification. All evidentialist theories are united in understanding justification as being a function of one’s present evidence as formalized in (EVI), yet many widely divergent options are available to one who seeks to develop the theory. There are competing ideas about which mental states count as evidence, different understandings of the notion of having evidence, various ways of understanding the crucial notion of support, and also various ways of relating these three central concepts. Many of the objections developed above apply only to some of these ways of developing the theory. This highlights the role they can play in one’s attempting to develop a complete evidentialist thesis. As is the case with theories in all areas of philosophy, objections such as those developed above help to guide philosophers towards more promising formulations of the theory. It remains to be seen whether evidentialism can be formulated in a way that not only overcomes each of these objections but also helps us to provide reasonable answers to other central epistemological questions.

5. References and Further Reading

  • W. K. Clifford. “The Ethics of Belief.” The Theory of Knowledge. 3rd. ed. Ed. Louis P. Pojman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003. 515-518.
  • Cohen, Stewart. “How to be a Fallibilist.” Philosophical Perspectives, 2. Ed. James E. Tomberlin. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Co., 1988. 91-123.
  • DeRose, Keith. “Ought We to Follow Our Evidence?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 60 (2000): 697-706.
  • Feldman, Richard. “Authoritarian Epistemology.” Philosophical Topics 23.1 (1995): 147-169.
  • Feldman, Richard. Epistemology. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall, 2003.
  • Feldman, Richard and Earl Conee. “Evidentialism.” Philosophical Studies 48 (1985): 15-34.
  • Goldman, Alvin. Epistemology and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1986.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. 2nd ed. Ed. Eric Steinberg. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Co., 1993.
  • James, William. “The Will To Believe.” The Theory of Knowledge. 3rd. ed. Ed. Louis P. Pojman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003. 519-526.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “Reason and Belief in God.” Faith and Rationality. Eds. Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press: 1983. 16-93.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1948.

a. More Advanced Studies

While this list in no way approximates comprehensiveness, the following are some additional helpful works on evidentialism in epistemology.

  • Conee, Earl and Richard Feldman. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2004.
    • This is, perhaps, the best single work available for exploring these issues in more detail, and it is by all accounts an excellent place to start. It includes their article, “Evidentialism,” which has come to be viewed as the definitive article on the theory. It also contains other previously published articles that not only examine particular aspects of the theory but also defend favored versions as well as new, previously unpublished articles on the topic.
  • Feldman, Richard and Earl Conee. “Internalism Defended.” Epistemology: Internalism and Externalism. Ed. Hilary Kornblith. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 2001. 231-260.
    • Much that has been written on the internalism and externalism debate in epistemology is very relevant to evidentialism. I choose to include only one such article here. “Internalism Defended,” argues that evidentialism is one internalist theory of justification that is able to overcome all of the common objections raised to internalist theories of justification. Both a version of this paper and an “afterward” is included in Conee and Feldman’s book Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology.
  • Feldman, Richard. “Having Evidence.” Philosophical Analysis. Ed. David Austin. Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers: 1988. 83-104.
    • This is a sustained examination of the crucial notion of having evidence. Feldman demonstrates just how vital it is, clearly lays out the complications and difficulties involved, and defends one particular interpretation. Reprinted with an “afterward” in Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology.
  • Haack, Susan. Evidence and Inquiry: Towards Reconstruction in Epistemology. Cambridge, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 1993.
    • This is a sustained explication and defense of a novel evidentialist theory of the structure of epistemic justification. Haack terms this theory, “foundherentism,” as it blends elements of coherentism and foundationalism. This book is helpful reading for those who want to gain a more complete understanding of competing theories of the nature of evidential support.

Author Information

Daniel M. Mittag
Email: dlmt@mail.rochester.edu
University of Rochester
U. S. A.

Last updated: September 6, 2004 | Originally published: