Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

The New Evil Demon Problem

The new evil demon problem first emerged in the literature as a problem for reliabilist theories of epistemic justification. The old evil demon problem is the skeptical problem that preoccupied Descartes. Basically, it is the problem that arises once we acknowledge that it is possible that someone might have had (apparent) perceptual experiences and memories indistinguishable from our own that were induced by a powerful demon bent on deceiving this hapless subject. Since there is nothing introspectively available that would allow us to state that this hapless subject’s plight is not our own, it is hard to determine what justification we might have to claim that we truly know what the external world is like through our sensory experience.

Unlike the old evil demon problem, the new one is not primarily a skeptical problem. Imagine an epistemic counterpart of yours. That is, imagine there is a subject who happens to believe precisely what you believe, undergoes experiences indistinguishable from your own, seems to recall and remember everything you recall and remember, finds intuitive everything you find intuitive, and is disposed to reason in precisely the same way you reason. Imagine that this subject has been in precisely the same non-factive mental states as you have since birth. Imagine that this subject is deceived by a Cartesian demon. Then let us suppose that you are not. By bracketing the skeptical worries, it seems that many of your beliefs about the external world constitute knowledge. As your counterpart is systematically deceived, her beliefs about the external world do not constitute knowledge. Moreover, it seems that while you might suppose that your beliefs are produced by processes that can reliably lead you to the truth, the means by which your counterpart arrives at her beliefs are wholly unreliable. On a reliabilist view, since you cannot have a justified belief about some matter unless the means by which you arrive at that belief is reliable, it seems the reliabilist ought to say that your counterpart’s beliefs are not justified. However, many would consider that position to be strongly counterintuitive. They are convinced that while your counterpart knows nothing, your counterpart is no less justified in her beliefs than you are in yours. The new evil demon problem is the problem of accommodating these intuitions about the justificatory status of your counterpart’s beliefs.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Reliabilist Responses
    1. Denial
    2. Normal Worlds Reliabilism
    3. Weak Justification and Strong Justification
    4. Apt-Justification Beliefs and Adroit-Justification Beliefs
    5. Home World Reliabilism
    6. Personal Justification and Doxastic Justification
  3. Newer Evil Demon Problems
    1. The Internalism/Externalism Debate
    2. Evidence
    3. Warranted Assertion
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

When the new evil demon problem first surfaced in the literature (Cohen and Lehrer (1983) and Cohen (1984)), it surfaced as a problem for reliabilists about justification. Consider Goldman’s process-reliabilist account of justification:

R:

S’s belief that p is justified iff the processes that produced S’s belief are reliable in the kind of environment in which S’s belief was formed and there is no reliable process the subject has such that if this process were used as well this would result in the subject’s not believing p (1979: 20).

The problem Goldman faced was that of trying to show how this simple and intuitively powerful argument could go wrong:

  1. Our deceived counterparts are no less justified in their beliefs than we are in ours.
  2. The processes that produce our deceived counterparts’ beliefs are wholly unreliable.
  3. It is possible for someone’s beliefs to be justified even if the processes that produced those beliefs are not reliable.

This conclusion contradicts the reliabilist thesis that reliability is necessary for justification. It is backed by the widely reported intuition that supports (1), which states that our counterparts are no less justified in their beliefs than we are in ours. Assuming that we are in fact justified in our beliefs, it seems we ought to acknowledge that they are justified in their beliefs. In turn, should we reject reliabilism? Below, we shall consider reliabilist responses to the argument.

2. Reliabilist Responses

a. Denial

Although some might reject (R) upon considering the new evil demon thought experiment, some do not. It seems most epistemologists who have discussed the problem in the literature do have the intuition that underwrites (1), but few intuitions are universally shared. Some defend reliabilism by denying the relevant intuitions. Others say that if your beliefs about the external world are induced by hallucinatory experiences, you do not have the right to believe what you do; rather, you only appear to have that right. Bach (1985), Brewer (1997), Engel (1992), and Sutton (2005, 2007) have denied that our counterparts’ beliefs are justified. If we accept that you have a right to believe only those beliefs you would be justified in holding, this response concedes nothing. It simply denies the claim described as being supported by ordinary intuition.

What is wrong with asserting that the beliefs of our deceived counterparts cannot be justified? There have been at least three ways of trying to bolster the appeal to intuition in the literature. First, Cohen suggested that this response indicates a failure to appreciate that justification is fundamentally a normative notion:

My argument [against reliabilism] hinges on viewing justification as a normative notion. Intuitively, if S’s belief is appropriate to the available evidence, he is not to be held responsible for circumstances beyond his ken (1984: 282).

Second, some hold the view that justification is a deontological notion. That is to say, a belief is justified when that belief can be held without violating any of your epistemic duties. It seems wrong to some to say that our deceived counterparts have failed to fulfill their epistemic duties. Haven’t they “done their duty,” provided that they reflect on the evidence available to them and judge that things are for them the way that we think things are for us? Plantinga (1993: 14) suggests that it is part of our traditional view that “you are properly blamed for failing to do something A if and only if it is your duty to do A (and you fail to do it).” If there is an epistemic duty to refrain from believing any belief for which there is not sufficient justification to hold and if we accept R, it seems to follow that our epistemic counterparts are properly blamed for failing to refrain from believing the mundane propositions that seem to them to be immediately verified through experience (for example, that they have hands, that the sun is shining, etc…). Surely that is too harsh. Third, some hold the view, defended by Langsam (2008: 79), on which “a justified belief is [simply] a belief that is held in a rational way.” Few are willing to characterize our deceived counterparts as irrational for believing falsely that they have hands.

In light of these responses, one might say that if you deny that your deceived counterparts are justified in their beliefs, you should be willing to say that your deceived counterparts are irrational, that they are blameworthy, and that they are less than fully responsible. If you say that they are irresponsible, it seems that you have all but done away with the category of the non-culpable mistake. The beliefs of our deceived counterparts are mistaken, to be sure, but they reason just as carefully as we do. If you are to charge them with irrationality, it seems there ought to be some way of identifying where their reasoning goes wrong. If you consider them blameworthy, it seems you will be hard pressed to avoid the unpalatable skeptical view that anyone who believes propositions about the external world ought to know better than to do so. It seems to be part of our ordinary practice to say that if two subjects are perfectly alike in terms of how things seem to them, the two are equally blameworthy for their inferences. (This, too, is subject to controversy. Gibbons (2006) and challenges the idea that credit and blame depend only on the internal factors common to our counterparts and us.) Some will say that these are not costs we should be willing to pay.

Not everyone believes these are consequences of denying that our deceived counterparts’ beliefs are justified. It seems that justification might be a normative notion even if it is not a normative notion that depends only on matters that are within the subject’s ken (that is, a normative notion that depends only on factors that determine what a subject’s perspective is like or are accessible to the subject). Permissibility is a normative notion. We often excuse people for performing impermissible acts when the facts in virtue of which these acts were impermissible were facts of which the subject is non-culpably ignorant. If this is so, reliabilists can agree with Cohen that justification is a normative notion while denying that justification is among the normative notions that in no way depends on factors beyond our ken.

Cohen does suggest that by stating that justification is a normative notion, he is asserting that it does not depend on factors for which the subject cannot be held responsible. So, perhaps he thinks we ought to sever the connection between justification and any normative notion that depends (in part) upon factors beyond those we can be faulted for failing to take account of. Perhaps he thinks we can only fail to have justified beliefs if we can be blamed for believing what we do. It is worth noting that in his remarks concerning blameworthiness, Plantinga (1993) immediately qualifies his initial remark quoted above by saying that his remarks concern only “subjective” duty. On the ordinary conception of objective duty, one might non-culpably fail to do what one ought to do. If justification is a matter of fulfilling one’s objective duty and the failure to fulfill such duties does not mean that the subject is culpable for the failure, it does not follow from the claim that our deceived counterparts believe without justification that they are properly blamed for so doing. (See Bergmann (2006: 77-105) for further discussion of this point.)

Finally, the identification of the rationally held belief or reasonably held belief with the justified belief is itself a matter of controversy. Sutton (2005, 2007) rejects this identification and attributes much of what he regards as misplaced antipathy towards externalist accounts of justification, such as reliabilism, as stemming from conflating the two notions. It would be unfair to suggest that he believes that subjects who believe without sufficient justification are less than fully rational or reasonable. Again, suppose we think of the justified belief as the permissibly held belief and allow for the possibility of non-culpable, but wrongly held, belief. It seems that if a subject were normatively competent (that is, the subject is not an infant, not subject to brainwashing, and so forth), it would only be proper to excuse them for their failings if we thought that they arrived at their beliefs in a rational way.

Rather than try to explain away the intuitions underwriting the new evil demon argument against reliabilism, the trend in the literature has been to try to accommodate these intuitions. Below, I shall discuss five strategies for trying to reconcile the reliability’s approach with seemingly anti-reliabilist intuitions.

b. Normal Worlds Reliabilism

Goldman tried to reformulate reliabilism so that it did not carry with it the implication that our systematically deceived counterparts cannot have justified beliefs:

Rnw:

S’s belief that p is justified only if the processes that produced S’s belief are reliable in normal worlds (1986: 107).

Because the new evil demon argument concerns the necessity of reliability for justification, we need not consider what additional conditions might be needed for stating the set of sufficient conditions for justification. Note the crucial difference between (R) and (Rnw). According to (R), someone’s belief can be justified only if the processes that produce that belief are reliable in the very circumstances they operate or are imagined to operate in. According to (Rnw), what matters is that the processes that produce a belief are reliable in normal worlds. Normal worlds are worlds in which our general beliefs about the actual world are true. A general belief we all seem to share is that perceptual experience is a good guide to our immediate surroundings. In evaluating our beliefs and the beliefs of our epistemic counterparts, we have to identify the processes by which we all arrive at our beliefs (for example, taking experience at face value) and then ask whether such processes are reliable in normal worlds. Since the processes that lead our counterparts as well as ourselves to hold our beliefs about our immediate surroundings are reliable in normal worlds (that is, it is part of our very conception of such a world that perception is generally reliable in such worlds), the beliefs of our counterparts do not turn out to be unjustified. The conflict between reliabilism and the intuition that our deceived counterparts are justified has been removed.

Normal worlds reliabilism never really caught on. First, it seemed to have the unhappy implication that a process such as clairvoyance could not confer justification under any possible circumstance. In normal worlds, clairvoyance is unreliable. So, in any world in which it is reliable, that world is abnormal. It seems wrong to some to say that there could be no possible world in which clairvoyance generated knowledge much in the way that, say, perception does. Yet, in evaluating the beliefs of these subjects, (Rnw) states that we can only say that their beliefs are justified if they would be reliable not in the circumstances in which they are used, but reliable in worlds that are normal (Lemos 2007: 96). Second, it seems that the normal worlds reliabilist has to say that we cannot coherently question the justification of those beliefs that determine our conception of what a normal world is like. A normal world is a world in which our general beliefs about the actual world are true. The claim that those general beliefs are justified would seem to be trivial, according to the normal worlds reliabilist. Yet, it seems to be no trivial matter whether those beliefs are in fact justified (Peacocke 2004: 133).

c. Weak Justification and Strong Justification

Goldman was not satisfied with the normal worlds reliabilist response to the new evil demon problem and sought to accommodate the intuitions causing trouble for (R) by appealing to a distinction between what he calls “weak” and “strong” justification. According to Goldman, a belief might be either strongly justified or weakly justified:

SJ:

S’s belief that p is strongly justified only if the processes that produced S’s belief are reliable in the kind of environment in which S’s belief was formed.

WJ:

S’s belief that p is weakly justified if and only if S is blameless for believing p but believes p on the basis of a process that is unreliable in the circumstances in which S’s belief is produced.

How does this distinction help? Goldman (1988: 59) tries to accommodate the intuition that our deceived counterparts’ beliefs are justified by saying that their beliefs are weakly justified. Having drawn the distinction between weak and strong justification, he has shown that there is a sense in which even the uncompromising reliabilist can say that our deceived counterparts’ beliefs are justified while saying that there is also a sense in which no belief can be justified unless the processes that produced it were reliable in the circumstances in which they produced that belief.

Critics cried foul. BonJour remarked (2002: 248), “The question is whether this really accommodates the intuition … which seems to be that the demon world people are at least as justified in their beliefs as we are in ours.” BonJour seems to be suggesting that what the intuitive observation critics of reliabilism want explained is not how there is some sense in which the beliefs of the demonically deceived are justified. What they want to see is how the reliabilist can explain how it is that the demonically deceived are no less justified than we are. Goldman wants to distinguish between two types of justification, assigning one type to the demonically deceived and another type to us. BonJour seems to suggest that while this might take care of the problem by saying that our deceived counterparts are irrational, unreasonable, or blameworthy, it does not take care of the problem that it seems, intuitively, that there is a sense in which they are as well aware of as we are.

It might seem that this problem could be mitigated if Goldman made a simple modification to his proposal. As it stands, no belief can be both weakly justified and strongly justified. A belief is weakly justified only if it is blamelessly held and ill formed. A belief is strongly justified only if reliable processes produce that belief. Suppose Goldman were to modify (WJ) as follows:

WJ*:

S’s belief that p is weakly justified if and only if S is blameless for believing p.

Someone might wonder why a reliabilist would propose (WJ*) since the concept of reliability does not figure in the formulation of (WJ*), but the concept of reliability does not play any significant role in (WJ), either. Moreover, it is not entirely clear why Goldman would insist that there is a kind of justification that requires unreliability. On this modified proposal, we can say that our beliefs are both strongly justified and weakly* justified. We can satisfy BonJour’s demand that we not only say that there is a perfectly good sense in which their beliefs are “justified,” but also that there is a sense in which we are no more justified in our beliefs than they are in theirs. Our beliefs and the beliefs of our deceived counterparts are all weakly* justified. The problem with this proposal, however, is that it seems not to go far enough. If someone has been brainwashed into believing p, it seems they would be weakly* justified in believing p. Suppose we might know p on the basis of veridical perception and our demonically deceived counterparts might believe p on the basis of a subjectively indistinguishable veridical perception. As Audi (1993: 28) stresses, it seems there is more going for the beliefs of our demonically deceived counterparts than there is for someone who has been brainwashed into thinking that p is true. Unfortunately, (WJ*) fails to capture this. Moreover, (SJ) cannot help us distinguish between the beliefs of the deceived and the beliefs of the brainwashed since we are supposing that neither arrives at their beliefs by reliable means.

d. Apt-Justification Beliefs and Adroit-Justification Beliefs

Sosa (1991) maintains that a justified belief is arrived at through the exercise of one or more intellectual virtues. In turn, he maintains that nothing could count as an intellectual virtue unless it would lead us to a high ratio of true beliefs through its exercise. Comesana (2002) and Sosa (2003: 159-61) have tried to solve the new evil demon problem by drawing a distinction between two ways in which we might use the notion of an intellectual virtue in appraising someone’s beliefs. We can say that someone’s belief about p is “apt-justified” only if the belief is acquired through the exercise of an intellectual virtue that is reliable in the circumstances in which that belief is formed. The beliefs formed by the demonically deceived are, unfortunately, not apt-justified. However, we can say that their beliefs are “adroit-justified.” A belief is adroit-justified only if the belief is acquired in an intellectually virtuous way where this is partially a matter of acquiring beliefs in a way that would be reliable if only the subject did not suffer the misfortune of being in the inhospitable epistemic environment in which a demon is bent on deceiving our intellectually virtuous counterparts. The suggestion is that in some contexts we refer to someone’s belief as justified if the belief is produced in such a way that beliefs of that type will reliably turn out to be correct in the very circumstances they are formed while in other contexts we refer to someone’s belief as justified if the processes would have reliably led to the truth here. Sosa (1985) considers this latter notion of adroit-justification as being largely a matter of the coherence of the attitudes of the subject being evaluated, and since our deceived counterparts’ beliefs are no less coherent than our own, we are entitled to say that there is a sense in which justification requires reliability (apt-justification) and a sense in which our deceived counterparts are no less justified than we are (adroit-justification).

Goldman (1993: 281) objected to this proposal by saying that ordinary folk are in no way inclined to engage in the sort of epistemic appraisal that would make use of both of these notions. If Comesana and Sosa are suggesting that their account accommodates folk intuition because the folk use both of their notions of justification, Comesana and Sosa seem to be suggesting that we describe our beliefs as “justified” because the processes that produced them were reliable in the circumstances in which they were deployed (that is, they are apt-justified) while we state that our counterparts’ beliefs are “justified” because the processes that produced them were reliable in circumstances other than those in which those processes were deployed (that is, they are adroit-justified). Goldman thinks that it is not part of our ordinary practice of epistemic evaluation to make attributions of justification by making them relative to these different kinds of circumstances in this way.

e. Home World Reliabilism

Majors and Sawyer have defended a version of reliabilism–home world reliabilism– which states that what is necessary for justified belief is not reliability in normal worlds or reliability in the scenario in which a belief is actually formed, but instead says this:

Rhw:

S’s belief that p is justified only if the processes that produced S’s beliefs are reliable in S’s home world understood as that set of environments relative to which the natures of her intentional contents are individuated (2005: 272).

To understand this view, it is important to understand something about the anti-individualist approach to the individuation of intentional contents. It is now widely believed that features of the external environment are among the conditions that go towards determining the contents of our intentional states. It has been suggested w that it is possible for two individuals who are microphysical duplicates to have different beliefs if they were raised in different environments and the further view that the contents of their perceptual states could also differ in light of differences in their environments. If the first individual had been raised in a linguistic community such as ours where “gold” was used to refer to a metallic element which had 79 protons in its nucleus and the second individual was raised in a linguistic community similar to ours that used “gold” to refer to a superficially similar metal which did not have 79 protons in its nucleus, what these two speakers would assert if they said “That is gold” would differ. For example, what the first speaker says might be false if said while pointing at a hunk of fool’s gold even if what the second speaker says could be true if said while pointing at the same hunk. Suppose these speakers then added, “Well, that is what I believe, at any rate.” Just as, “That is gold,” would express different propositions, “I believe that that is gold” would express different propositions. Unless we are prepared to assert that one of these speakers cannot correctly self-ascribe beliefs, we have to accept that their assertions and beliefs differ in content. The conditions that determine what these individuals believe include their “narrow” conditions (that is, the conditions held constant when we say that these two individuals are microphysical duplicates) and the conditions found in their environment (that is, the conditions that determine whether they have been interacting with gold or some superficially similar metal that is not gold).

To see why this matters, note that in setting up the new evil demon thought experiment, we were asked to imagine that there was an individual who is mentally just like us (that is, an epistemic counterpart), who was situated in an environment that is radically different from our own insofar as this subject was systematically deceived and cut off from causally interacting with her environment in the ways that we do. Anti-individualists might say that this is latent nonsense. An anti-individualist can say that it is impossible for a subject to satisfy the first condition and be mentally just like us whilst being situated in a radically different environment because a condition necessary to being mentally just like us is that the subject causally interacts with the kinds of things that we do. The home world reliabilist can say that the new evil demon thought experiment does not cause trouble for reliabilist accounts of justification because when we describe a systematically deceived subject, we are not describing a genuine possibility in which an epistemic counterpart of ours has beliefs produced by wholly unreliable processes. Thus, the home world reliabilist can say that if a subject is an epistemic counterpart of ours, that subject’s beliefs are justified and to the extent that this subject’s mental life is like ours, we have to assume that this subject is not prevented from causally interacting with the environment in the way that the systematically deceived subjects would have to be.

As Comesana (2002: 264) notes, however, it isn’t clear that an appeal to anti-individualism alone can take care of the problem because the problem can reemerge in the form of “switching” cases. Let us suppose that anti-individualism is true and that it is impossible for a subject who has been tormented by a Cartesian demon from birth to be an epistemic counterpart of ours. By depriving this subject of the opportunity to causally interact with an environment like ours, the demon prevents this individual from acquiring the kinds of intentional thought contents that we have. What if a subject were allowed to acquire the kinds of thought contents we have by interacting with her environment for a period of thirty years, but the day after the subject’s thirtieth birthday the demon decides to cause her to hallucinate and so deceive her about her surroundings? Intuitively, it seems that this newly deceived subject is no less justified in forming her beliefs, but her beliefs will now be wrong as a rule. The home world reliabilist might say that their view delivers this verdict because if the subject had been forming beliefs in the kind of epistemically hospitable environment in which she initially had been forming her beliefs, her beliefs would have largely turned out to be correct. This seems to require the home world reliabilist to individuate environments in such a way that with the demon’s decision to start deceiving our hapless subject, the subject is thereby “moved” into an environment that is not part of the “home world”. I suppose that those sympathetic to Goldman’s (1979) original formulation of reliabilism would be bothered by the implication that so far as the facts that matter to justification are concerned, nothing of significance happened when the demon decided to deceive the subject. It is also odd that on the home world reliabilist view, if the subject thought to herself just after the switch that the beliefs formed after her thirtieth birthday were justified, that belief would be true, but if the subject inferred that those very same beliefs are produced by reliable processes, that belief would be false.

It is worth noting that if the home world reliabilist response is to be complete, it must mention something about the epistemic status of a demonically tormented subject’s beliefs. Even if no subject tormented from birth by a demon has thoughts or perceptual experiences with the contents that ours have, unless the home world reliabilist is going to say that such subjects have no beliefs at all, we can ask whether such a subject is justified in believing whatever they happen to believe. We know that the home world reliabilist will have to say that if these subjects have justified beliefs, there must be some matters about which their beliefs are reliably correct. It is hard to imagine what these subjects might have reliably correct beliefs about. It is also worth noting that the view’s verdicts might not be quite in line with the intuitions to which the critics of reliabilism appeal. Suppose that philosophers discovered that some sort of error theory is true. Although the folk might believe things are colored, noisy, good, or what have you, philosophers learn that the world contains no secondary qualities or moral properties. Are we to say that in light of this hard-earned philosophical discovery, the ordinary judgments that ordinary folk make about colors or moral properties can never be justified? It seems that the home world reliabilist would have to say that if we were to discover that a subject’s beliefs are not reliably correct by taking account of facts of which ordinary folk are non-culpably ignorant, we would have to describe their beliefs as unjustified. It is not clear that this is consistent with the basic intuition that underwrites the new evil demon argument.

f. Personal Justification and Doxastic Justification

According to Bach (1985) and Engel (1992), the intuitions thought to cause trouble for reliabilism do no such thing. They think we should grant that our deceived counterparts are no less justified than we are. Intuition confirms this. Nevertheless, these authors claim that this observation is consistent with R. While R does imply that the beliefs of our deceived counterparts are not justified, it does not carry with it the further implication that the systematically deceived believers are any less justified than we are. Following Bach, these authors claim that there is an important difference between ascriptions of “personal” justification (that is, ascriptions of the form “S is justified in believing p”) and ascriptions of “doxastic” justification (that is, ascriptions of the form “S’s belief that p is justified”). Both ascriptions attest to the fact that something is justified. Reliabilism is a theory about the conditions under which a belief is justified and ascriptions of doxastic justification turn out to be true. The intuition underwriting the new evil demon argument, according to Bach, concern ascriptions of personal justification. Since the reliabilist need not say that any justified believer who believes p has a justified belief that p is the case, the reliabilist view is consistent with the intuition that our systematically deceived counterparts are all justified in believing what they do.

The basic idea behind this proposal is simple enough. If epistemic evaluation is concerned with believer qua believer, it is not surprising that we end up saying that our systematically deceived counterparts are no less justified than we are because they reason just as well as we do and take just as much care as we do. If epistemic evaluation is concerned with our beliefs, there is a perfectly good sense in which our beliefs turn out to be better than theirs (their beliefs cannot constitute knowledge because the processes by which their beliefs are produced are unreliable, their beliefs are all false, etc…). In asserting that a believer is justified, we are asserting that the believer does not hold the beliefs she does because of some defect in her. In asserting that a belief is justified, we are asserting that there is not some defect in the belief or the means by which the belief is produced that should lead us to give up that belief.

Perhaps the most serious difficulty for this proposal is that it can only accommodate the relevant intuitions by saying that we are just as (personally) justified in our beliefs as our counterparts are in theirs while denying that their beliefs are (doxastically) justified. According to Kvanvig and Menzel (1990), ascriptions of personal justification of the form “S is justified in believing p” logically entail ascriptions of doxastic justification of the form “S’s belief that p is justified.” If this account of the logic of justification ascriptions is correct, then we cannot consistently say that while our deceived counterparts are justified in their beliefs, their beliefs are not justified. argues that there is no entailment from ascriptions of personal justification to ascriptions of doxastic justification and that we need the personal/doxastic justification distinction to make sense of the more familiar distinction between excuses and justifications.

3. Newer Evil Demon Problems

The original new evil demon problem was a problem for reliabilism. The intuitions thought to cause trouble for the reliabilist now play a role in the internalism/externalism debate, discussions of the nature of evidence, and the literature on warranted assertion.

a. The Internalism/Externalism Debate

Reliabilism is not the only account of epistemic justification that seems to deliver the wrong verdict by classifying the beliefs of our deceived counterparts as unjustified. Consider the proper-functionalist account of epistemic justification defended by Bergmann (2006). While Plantinga (1993) defends a proper-functionalist account of warrant, warrant is typically taken to be distinct from justification and Bergmann intends his account to be one of justification rather than warrant. According to the proper-functionalist account of justification, a belief can be justified only if the belief is the product of cognitive faculties that are functioning properly in an environment in which those faculties will reliably lead to the truth and for which that faculty was “designed” to function. The proper-functionalist position about justification can assert that our systematically deceived counterparts can be justified in their beliefs provided that cognitive faculties that would be truth-conducive in the environments for which they are designed to operate produce their beliefs. However, it seems they must concede that if a counterpart of ours lacks cognitive faculties that reliably lead to truth in the environments in which they were designed to function, this counterpart could never have justified beliefs in spite of being our counterpart. So, it seems that proper-functionalism is at odds with the intuition underwriting the first premise in the argument against reliabilism. This point is not lost on Bergmann (2006: 136), who concedes that only some of our systematically mistaken epistemic counterparts have justified beliefs.

Consider also the knowledge account of epistemic justification defended by Sutton (2005, 2007) or the knowledge account of epistemic reasons defended by According to the knowledge account of justification, a belief can be justified only if it constitutes knowledge. According to the knowledge account of epistemic reasons, p is an epistemic reason of S’s if S knows p. We know that our deceived counterparts do not know their external world beliefs to be true. The knowledge account of justification implies that our deceived counterparts do not have adequate justification for their beliefs. If you think that it is possible for S to have a justified belief that p is the case only if p can serve as an epistemic reason for S to believe obvious consequences of p, it follows from the knowledge account of epistemic reasons that our deceived counterparts’ external world beliefs are unjustified.

According to Wedgwood (2002), the intuitions that underwrite the argument against reliabilism underwrite an argument against all versions of externalism about justification. If a theory of epistemic justification is committed to saying that some subject’s belief about p can be justified only if some condition C obtains such that C does not strongly supervene on the subject’s (non-factive) mental states, it seems that this theory will be at odds with the intuition that underwrites (1). He maintains that the new evil demon thought experiment does not merely tell us what justification is not. It tells us something about what justification is. It tells us that epistemic justification is an internalist notion. It tells us that so long as two subjects are in precisely the same (non-factive) mental states, their beliefs will attain the same justificatory status.

Nelson (2002) has further claimed that the intuitions underwriting the new evil demon argument tell us something about the epistemic status of epistemic principles (that is, principles that state non-normative conditions in virtue of which we might have prima facie justification for our beliefs). He suggests that our intuitions provide us with a priori justification for believing that certain modes of belief formation (for example, perception) confer justification. If this is right, then it seems that the externalist position regarding epistemic justification faces a further difficulty. It seems that on some externalist views (for example, Goldman’s (1979) reliabilist account or Bergmann’s (2006) proper-functionalist account), it is a purely contingent matter that perceptual experience provides justification for our beliefs about the external world. If an externalist were to agree with Nelson that we have a priori justification for saying that perceptual experience confers justification, it seems that they will have to say that this proposition is a contingent proposition for which we have a priori justification.

b. Evidence

The new evil demon problem also seems to be a problem for externalist accounts of evidence. Internalists, such as Conee and Feldman (2004), maintain that if two subjects are in precisely the same (non-factive) mental states, they will necessarily share the same evidence. The externalists deny this and assertthat it is possible for two subjects to be in precisely the same (non-factive) mental states while having different bodies of evidence. Some epistemologists (for example, Hyman (1999), Unger (1975), and Williamson (2000)) defend views of evidence in the neighborhood of this view:

E = K:

S’s evidence includes the proposition that p if S knows p.

According to E = K, since you and some deceived counterpart of yours know different propositions to be true, there are propositions included in your evidence that are not included in your deceived counterpart’s evidence. To make this concrete, suppose that you know you have hands. Your counterpart’s “experience” of the external world is nothing more than a series of demonically induced hallucinations. Your counterpart might be a handless, disembodied spirit living in a dark world. According to E = K, while your evidence will include the proposition that you have a hand, your counterpart’s evidence will not include this proposition. Some find this implication of E = K problematic. First, says it is intuitively correct to say that the two of you share the same evidence. Perhaps this is what explains the comparative epistemic judgment that the two of you are equally justified in your beliefs about the external world. Second, Silins (2005) notes that if we think that a subject’s degree of confidence ought (ideally) to match their evidence, E = K has the odd implication that you ought to have a higher degree of confidence in the belief that you have hands than your counterpart should in her (false) belief that she has hands.

c. Warranted Assertion

Let us say that a subject’s assertion that p is the case is warranted if the subject’s assertion that p is true is epistemically permissible. That is to say, the subject’s assertion is warranted when it is not the case that the subject ought to refrain from asserting that p is true for epistemic reasons. One of the more popular accounts of warranted assertion is the knowledge account of assertion, ascribed to byDeRose (1996), Slote (1979), Sutton (2005, 2007), Williamson (2000), and Unger (1975). According to this account, assertion is governed by the knowledge norm:

K:

S ought not assert that p unless S knows p.

Some (for example Weiner (2005)) have defended the weaker externalist view that assertion is governed by the truth norm:

T:

S ought not assert that p unless p is true.

Suppose we were to grant that our intuitions concerning our deceived counterparts did in fact show that their beliefs are justified. According to Lackey (2008), the intuitions that cause trouble for externalist accounts of epistemic justification cause trouble for externalist accounts of warranted assertion on which knowledge or truth is necessary for permissible assertion. Just as it seems intuitive to some to say that our epistemic counterparts’ beliefs are justified, it seems to her that our epistemic counterparts’ assertions are warranted.

It seems that epistemologists either do not share Lackey’s intuitions about warranted assertion or do not think that they ought to accommodate those intuitions in their accounts of warranted assertion. It is interesting to note that many who defend externalist accounts of warranted assertion are unwilling to defend externalist accounts of epistemic justification. But, it might be that this is an untenable combination of views. For, if Sutton (2005, 2007) is right, you cannot be justified in believing what you lack warrant for asserting:

J:

If S’s belief that p is justified and S asserts that p is the case, S’s assertion that p is the case is warranted.

If our deceived counterparts’ beliefs are justified and there is nothing wrong with their holding them, how could it be wrong for them to assert that their beliefs are true? Since, according to (K) or (T), it would be wrong to assert that something is true unless it actually is true, those who endorse (K) or (T) either ought to say that our deceived counterparts do not have sufficient justification for their beliefs or deny (J) and say that a person’s beliefs can be justified even if the person lacks sufficient warrant for asserting what she justifiably believes to be the case. At any rate, the arguments that have been offered for (J) suggest that the position of those who adopt internalist accounts of justification because of intuitions about our systematically deceived counterparts while defending externalist accounts of warranted assertion cannot have it both ways.

4. Conclusion

The new evil demon problem has been a persistent problem for reliabilists for over two decades. It is most unclear how someone can consistently maintain that the justification of our beliefs depends on the reliability of the processes that produce them while at the same time acknowledging that our systematically deceived counterparts are fully justified in their beliefs. The problem is now not a problem for reliabilists only. The thought experiment Cohen introduced into the literature and the intuitions it elicits now play a significant role in the literature on the internalism/externalism debate, the nature of evidence, and the conditions of warranted assertability.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Audi, R. 1993. The Structure of Justification. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bach, K. 1985. A Rationale for Reliabilism. The Monist 68: 246-63.
  • Bergmann, M. 2006. Justification Without Awareness. (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • BonJour, L. 2002. Internalism and Externalism. In P. Moser (ed.) The Oxford Handbook of Epistemology. (New York: Oxford University Press): 234-64.
  • Brewer, B. 1997. Foundations of Perceptual Knowledge. American Philosophical Quarterly 34: 41-55.
  • Cohen, S. 1984. Justification and Truth. Philosophical Studies 46: 279-96.
  • Cohen, S. and K. Lehrer. 1983. Justification, Truth, and Knowledge. Synthese 55.
  • Comesana, J. 2002. The Diagonal and the Demon. Philosophical Studies 110: 249-66.
  • Conee, E. and R. Feldman. 2004. Evidentialism. (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • DeRose, K. 1996. Knowledge, Assertion, and Lotteries. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 568-80.
  • Engel, M. 1992. Personal and Doxastic Justification. Philosophical Studies 67: 133-51.
  • Gibbons, J. 2006. Access Externalism. Mind 115: 19-39.
  • Goldman, A. 1979. What is Justified Belief? In G. Pappas (ed.) Justification and Knowledge (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press): 1-23.
  • Goldman, A. 1986. Epistemology and Cognition. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
  • Goldman, A. 1988. Strong and Weak Justification. Philosophical Perspectives 2: 51-69.
  • Goldman, A. 1993. Epistemic Folkways and Scientific Epistemology. Philosophical Issues 3: 271-85.
  • Knowledge and Action. Journal of Philosophy Hyman, J. 1999. How Knowledge Works. Philosophical Quarterly 49: 433-51.
  • Kvanvig, J. and C. Menzel. 1990. The Basic Notion of Justification. Philosophical Studies 59: 235-61.
  • Lackey, J. 2008. Learning from Words. (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • Langsam, H. 2008. Rationality, Justification, and the Internalism/Externalism Debate. Erkenntnis 68: 79-101.
  • Lemos, N. 2007. An Introduction to the Theory of Knowledge. (New York: Cambridge University Press).
  • Littlejohn, C. 2009. The Externalist’s Demon. Canadian Journal of Philosophy 39 (3): 399-434.
  • Majors, B. and S. Sawyer. 2005. The Epistemological Argument for Content Externalism. Philosophical Perspectives 19: 257-80.
  • Nelson, M. 2002. What Justification Could Not Be. International Journal of Philosophical Studies 10: 265-81.
  • Peacocke, C. 2004. The Realm of Reason. (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • Plantinga, A. 1993. Warrant: The Current Debate. (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • Silins, N. 2005. Deception and Evidence. Philosophical Perspectives 19: 375-404.
  • Slote, M. 1979. Assertion and Belief. In J. Dancy (ed.) Papers on Language and Logic (Keele: Keele University Library): 177-90.
  • Sosa, E. 1985. The Coherence of Virtue and the Virtue of Coherence. Synthese 64: 3-28.
  • Sosa, E. 1991. Knowledge in Perspective. (New York: Cambridge University Press).
  • Sosa, E. 2003. Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues (Malden, MA: Blackwell).
  • Sutton, J. 2005. Stick To What You Know. Nous 39: 359-96.
  • Sutton, J. 2007. Without Justification. (Cambridge, MA: MIT University Press).
  • Turri, J. The Ontology of Epistemic Reasons. Nous.
  • Unger, P. 1975. Ignorance. (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • Weatherson, B. Deontology and the Demon. Journal of Philosophy.
  • Wedgwood, R. 2002. Internalism Explained. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 65: 349-69.
  • Weiner, M. 2005. Must We Know What We Say? Philosophical Review 114: 227-51.
  • Williamson, T. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits. (New York: Oxford University Press).

Author Information

Clayton Littlejohn
Email: cmlittlejohn@yahoo.com
Southern Methodist University
U. S. A.

Last updated: March 3, 2009 | Originally published: