Evolutionary Epistemology (EE) is a naturalistic approach to epistemology and so is part of philosophy of science. Other naturalistic approaches include sociological, historical and anthropological explanations of knowledge. What makes EE specific is that it subscribes to the idea that cognition is to be understood primarily as a product of biological evolution. What does this mean exactly? Biological evolution is regarded as the precondition of the variety of cognitive, cultural, and social behavior that an organism, group or species can portray. In other words, biological evolution precedes (socio-)cultural (co-)evolution. Conversely, (socio-)cultural (co-)evolution originates as a result of biological evolution. Therefore:
A general account of the meaning and history of the term “evolutionary epistemology” is given in sections 1 and 2 below. It is important to understand in advance that different kinds of evolutionary epistemology (EE) can be distinguished, but all forms share the following assumption: that cognition –to a greater or lesser extent- needs to be studied from within evolutionary theory. Disagreements arise about:
Evolutionary theory itself is far from synonymous with the theory of evolution by natural selection. Rather, heterogeneous views on evolution arise when one takes the units and levels of selection debate (sections 3 through 6) as points of departure. Different perspectives on evolution emerge when one looks at evolution from the point of the environment (section 4), the organism (section 5), and genes (section 6). The development of different EEs parallels this perspectivism. That is, based on these different viewpoints, different EEs have been put forward. The adaptationist approach to evolution is the basis of traditional EE. Non-adaptationist approaches to EE have been based on the constructivist approach to evolution. The “gene’s eye view” of evolution has resulted in a quest for universal evolutionary epistemological mechanisms.
The concept “evolutionary epistemology” was first introduced by Donald T. Campbell (1974). However, he repeatedly refused to be called the founding father of EE since he saw himself as denoting “… something that has sprung up all over for a hundred years or more” (Campbell in Callebaut, 1993: 289).
If EE were to have a motto, it might come from Michael Ruse’s (1988) famous book title Taking Darwin Seriously. This means that when one adheres to an evolutionary view of life, one needs to understand all biological processes not only as the outcome of evolution, but also as something that can only be investigated adequately by making use of evolutionary theory.
Evolutionary epistemology understands epistemology to be a product of biological evolution. Therefore, epistemology is studied from within evolutionary biology. Cognition is no longer understood to be linguistic (propositional) or a human-bounded characteristic. Rather, all organisms can show behavior that is cognitively based.
Hence, the first major quest of evolutionary epistemologists is distinguishing between the different cognitive processes that biological organisms from all major kingdoms of life can display.
Second, they investigate how these cognitive capacities evolved from unicellular organisms onwards.
Third, the products of cognition (on the one hand, the perception of light, or color, on the other hand, science, culture and language) are understood from within an evolutionary approach.
The use of biological theories and mechanisms to comprehend cognition is either meant to be descriptive or explanatory. In this context, Ruse (1988: 32) differentiates between an “analogy-as-heuristic” and an “analogy-as-justification.” The former term refers to using metaphors and analogies from evolutionary theory to describe, for example, the evolution of science loosely and to discover new approaches to research. The latter research strategy involves applying evolutionary analogies to justify and thus to validate such things as the evolution of science.
In sum, the underlying view of EE is thus that there is a universal evolutionary mechanism that lead first to the evolution of life in general, and second, that this mechanism is also at work within the evolution of cognition, and within the products of cognition such as language, science and culture.
Some evolutionary epistemologists such as Campbell (1974), therefore also assume that this evolutionary mechanism in its own workings portrays an evolutionary mechanism. This concept will be discussed later.
The concept “EE” today is commonly used as a synonym for selection theory on the one hand, and, on the other hand, as part of the EEM and EET program.
EE has strong affinities with selection theory (Campbell, 1997). The latter is a theory that adheres to the view that all and only selectionist —as opposed to instructionist (behaviorist) — explanations of an organism’s traits (including cognitive ones) are valid. Behaviorist explanations state that it suffices to describe the visible, external behavior that an organism portrays in order to develop adequate explanations of that behavior. Selectionist accounts, by contrast, also examine internal elements that underlie a certain trait (such as genes, for example) and the evolutionary emergence of that trait. The term selection theory was first introduced by Simmel and Baldwin in the 19th century (Campbell, 1997). Today, however, a wide range of biologists, neurologists, and evolutionary epistemologists are selectionists (for an example, see Cziko 1995), but these scholars do not recognize or accept any direct influence of Simmel and Baldwin’s selection theory.
Throughout this article, the more general term EE is maintained. The reason is twofold. First, not all topics that are investigated by selectionists are relevant for the study of cognition. Second, not every Evolutionary Epistemologist defends a solely selectionist account of cognition. Rather, other evolutionary principles such as self-organization, for example, are also included to comprehend (the products of) cognition (as will be discussed in section 5). Finally, analogies are not only drawn between evolutionary theory and the evolution of science and knowledge. Culture, language, economics etc. can also be interpreted from within these evolutionary epistemological frameworks.
A useful distinction within EE is made by Bradie (1986). Two different programs are identified, the EEM and the EET program. Within the Evolution of Epistemological Mechanisms, the evolution of cognition and cognitive knowledge mechanisms is investigated from within the Modern Synthesis. The Modern Synthesis is the standard paradigm within evolutionary biology on how evolution occurs. This is based on the principle of evolution by natural selection as first introduced by Charles Darwin.
Furthermore, the products of cognitive evolution, such as language, science, or culture, are also understood to be the result of biological evolution, and it is assumed that in their emergence or structure an evolutionary pattern can also be found. The following example can illustrate this: the evolution of language or culture is at least partly the result of biological evolution. Hence, the same evolutionary mechanisms that are used to describe the evolution of cognition are also applicable to the products of cognition, such as language or culture. The EET program (Bradie, 1986) was introduced specifically for epistemological or scientific theories. The ways in which analogies are drawn between the evolution of science on the one hand and natural selection on the other are investigated within Evolution of Epistemological Theories.
Different evolutionary epistemologists are active within the above mentioned various fields and within extra-philosophical scientific fields, which makes it difficult to pinpoint the common assertions made by all evolutionary epistemologists. Adherents of an EEM position, for example, can object to the widely subscribed idea that science also needs to be explained from within evolutionary epistemology, as adherents of the EET program state. What binds evolutionary epistemologists is the idea that evolutionary theory, to some extent, can explain aspects of cognition.
What is so different about EE that it can be distinguished from all other epistemological endeavors? To answer this question, we need to first situate, and secondly, evaluate EE in relation to other philosophical frameworks.
EE is part of the naturalistic turn. The naturalistic turn itself is a larger movement that emphasizes the importance of a sociology of knowledge, anthropology of knowledge, and the historical study of knowledge. Evolutionary Epistemology in turn emphasizes the importance of the biology of knowledge. More specifically, the study of biological evolution is the precondition of all investigations into cognition (Wuketits, 1984: 2-19). Therefore, it explains evolution itself as a cognitive process.
Furthermore, within EE, knowledge and cognition are no longer conceived of as necessarily proposition-like or language-like or human-bounded. As such, EE stands opposed to traditional philosophical approaches to cognition (such as empiricist and rationalist ones that understand knowledge to be language-like), and it also goes beyond Quine’s Naturalized Epistemology. In order to understand this, first naturalized epistemology is briefly discussed and then the difference with EE is explained.
Naturalized epistemology was first introduced by Quine (1969), who stressed that the study of science and scientific thinking should revolve around how knowledge is processed, rather than what knowledge is in itself. Therefore, he emphasized that we should reject the idea of a first philosophy. Within a first philosophy, it is assumed that philosophy can make claims about science without using the sciences. If one would make use of the sciences, this would be understood as circular. Quine, however, stressed that we should investigate epistemology from within the natural sciences, more specifically, psychology:
The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has had to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world. Why not see how this construction really proceeds? Why not settle for psychology?” (Quine, 1969: 269-70) […] [A]t this point it may be more useful to say that epistemology still goes on, though in a new setting and a clarified status. Epistemology, or something like it, simply falls into place as a chapter of psychology and hence of natural science. (Quine 1969: 273-4)
Epistemology is defined as that discipline which studies exactly how our sense organs construct a picture of the world. The study of knowledge involves the investigation into (1) the relation between neural input and observational sentences, and (2) an investigation into the relation between theoretical and observational sentences. Hence, according to Quine, knowledge, or more specifically, cognition, is still understood to be language-like: it is assumed that somehow our neural input is transformed into verbal output. A rather behaviorist position is taken by Quine, because the study of how our neurological abilities relate to language is not assessed. Somehow the relation between sensory input and language is assumed to be direct.
Neurology today, however, has shown us multiple times that at the neurological or cognitive level, there is no direct, and certainly no necessary relation between our categorizations and our language (Changeaux 1985; Gazzaniga 1994, 2000; Damasio 1996 and 1999; Ledoux 1998).
Furthermore, because of the rise of ethology and ecology (the study of the external behavior of animals in relation to their natural settings), cognition as a scientific concept has been broadened to include non-linguistic behavior as well.
It is here that evolutionary epistemology makes its entrée. Konrad Lorenz (1958) for example, was one of the founding fathers (together with Nikolas Tinbergen) of ethology. Lorenz stressed the importance of a cognitivist approach of behavior, hereby also including internal behavior.
In contrast to Naturalized Epistemology, EE does not only examine the relation between human, language-like knowledge and the world. Any type of relation that an organism engages in with its environment is understood as a knowledge relation, irrespective of whether or not these organisms have language.
Munz (2001: 9) points out that what makes EE unique is that knowledge is comprehended as a cognitive relation between an organism and its environment. Empiricists for example understood knowledge to be a relation between a knower and something knowable by induction, while rationalists define knowledge as a relation between a knower and something known because of deduction. Even within the sociology of knowledge movement, knowledge is not understood from within its relation between an organism and its environment, rather here it is comprehended as a relation between different knowers.
What makes EE different from all other naturalistic approaches within philosophy, is that it does not regard epistemology as a mere study of how a human knower comes to know what is knowable. Rather EE studies how knowledge about the environment is gained across different species, and what knowledge-gaining mechanisms arise in biological organisms through time enabling these organisms to cope with their environment. This means that within EE not only human cognition but all sorts of behavior that organisms at all levels in biological evolution display (ranging from instinctive behavior to cultural behavior or even chemotaxis – that is to say, communication between cells) are regarded as devices that are put to use to gain knowledge. And equally important, these mechanisms themselves are also comprehended as knowledge in and of themselves.
Within EE, contrary to behaviorism, internal factors that determine behavior and cognition are also included. Because biological evolution led to the rise and acquisition of different cognitive/knowledge processes, this evolution itself is explained as a knowledge process.
The units and levels of selection debate is taken as the point of departure to distinguish between different types of EE. EEs draw on evolutionary theory to explain epistemology or cognition. However, there are disagreements on what evolution in general is. Therefore different, sometimes complementary evolutionary theories are put forward by evolutionary biologists. It is only logical that this results in different evolutionary epistemologies. Three different perspectives are described to understand evolution and the different EEs that arise when using these perspectives:
How did the units and levels of selection debate get started?
The Modern Synthesis (Ayala, 1978, Maynard-Smith, 1993, Mayr, 1978), which is the standard paradigm on how biological evolution occurs, states very strictly that the phenotype (the visible organism) is the unit of selection. This phenotype either is selected at the level of the environment, if this visible organism is adapted to that environment, or the organism dies out, if it is maladaptive.
With the rise of Postneodarwinian theory on the one hand, and Systems Theory on the other, the debate over the units and levels of selection was introduced first in biology, and later within evolutionary epistemology. In this discussion the primary question asked is whether there are units and levels of selection other than the phenotype and the environment. The concept “units of selection” was coined by the biologist Richard Lewontin in his famous homonymous article of 1970. The concept “levels of selection” was introduced by Robert Brandon in his 1982 article by the same name. However the discussion dates back to scientific debates concerning the possibility of group selection in the 1960s between William Hamilton (1964) and George C. Williams (1966, chapter 4), and still even further back in time to the 19th century when Herbert Spencer introduced and applied the “survival of the fittest” idea to human populations and society.
The concept “adaptationist program,” was first introduced by Gould and Lewontin (1979) — but is not subscribed to by these authors themselves. The adaptationist program regards “ […] natural selection as so powerful and the constraints upon it so few that direct production of adaptation through its operation becomes the primary cause of nearly all organic form, function, and behavior” (Gould and Lewontin, 1979:584-5).
To understand this, the distinction between ontogeny (the development of an organism from conception until death) and phylogeny (the evolution of species) is in order. Within Lamarckian theory, no strict separation between ontogenetic and phylogenetic processes is adhered to. Within this paradigm, also known as the inheritance of acquired characteristics, traits acquired during the lifetime of an individual can be passed on immediately to the next generation.
With the introduction of Darwin’s principle of natural selection, for the first time in history it was possible to distinguish between ontogenetic and phylogenetic processes, because of the distinction that is made between the inner and the outer world of the organism (Lewontin: 2000: 42-3). The inner milieu of the organism is, according to Darwin, subjected to, amongst other things, developmental growth processes that are not themselves subjected to evolution by natural selection. The outer environment, by contrast, is the sole scene where evolution by natural selection occurs. Here the environment either does or does not select an organism. Regarding the inner milieu of the organism, Darwin himself quite often made use of Lamarck’s theory. He used it as an explanation for how novel individual variation arises. Natural selection was never interpreted by Darwin as being the cause of the variation; in fact, he did not know how variation occurred. Therefore, he invoked Lamarck’s principle of the inheritance of acquired characteristics. Natural selection only selected amongst the given variation.
These ideas were later incorporated into the Modern Synthesis. Organisms vary. This variety is the result of, on the one hand, the specific combinations of genetic material that an organism carries, and on the other hand, possible random mutations that occur within these genes. One acquires the genetic material that one carries through birth, thus no child can choose its specific genetic code. And, the genetic mutations that sometimes occur, occur randomly, they are blind. That is to say, mutations are random errors that occurred during the copying of this genetic material. The genetic material that one carries can be neutral, adaptive or maladaptive for the carrier in the “struggle for existence.” The point, however, is that from this perspective, the organism itself cannot by any means whatsoever influence the genetic material that it carries. Eventually, it is the environment that indirectly selects adaptive organisms through the elimination of the unfit. Thus, the Modern Synthesis views this selection process as taking place between the phenotype and the environment. And the selection process itself is said to occur only externally: the “level of selection” is the external environment, and the selection of the “unit of selection,” the organism, occurs independently of internal processes such as developmental growth.
Figure 1. The adaptationist approach focuses on the external relation
between the environment and the organism.
Thus, within the adaptationist approach the organism and the environment are conceived as two separate entities that only interact during the selection process but develop independently from one another (fig. 1).
Adaptation is literally the process of fitting an object to a pre-existing demand… Organisms adapt to the environment because the external world had acquired its properties independently of the organism, which must adapt or die. (Lewontin, 2000: 43)
In other words, Neodarwinian theory adheres to a strict dualistic viewpoint (Gontier, 2006) between organism and environment: the organism is passively selected, or not, by an active environment. The organism cannot influence its chances of survival or fitness. For this reason, according to Lewontin (1978), one can defend the position that because of the emphasis these scholars lay on adaptation, Neodarwinians explain evolution from the point of view of the environment. Hence, they actually give a description of the environment through the organism, rather than describing the organism itself.
It is the latter position that has been one of the basic tenets of traditional EE, namely, that one is able to gain knowledge about the environment by studying the organisms that live in it, because organisms literally “re-present” the outer world.
What does this mean? Logical empiricism failed in providing a non-arbitrary relation between the world and human language. However, the search for such a non-arbitrary relation between the outer world and the organisms that inhabit that world was continued from within the adaptationist approach. In this position it is assumed that there is an unchangeable outer world to which organisms adapt. If it is true that organisms are adapted to the outer world, and that all and only the fit survive and reproduce in the long run, then these adaptive organisms can tell us something about that environment. An ant, for example, can tell us something about the soil.
This section provides an overview of the major traditional evolutionary epistemologies and how they developed out of the adaptationist view of evolution.
Beginning with Sir Karl Popper’s (1963) ideas concerning conjectures and refutations (also called trials and errors), the following position is defended within traditional EE: there is a growth of (scientific) knowledge which is comparable with the succession of adaptations in evolution. The task of EE thus becomes explaining this growth.
Adhering to the strict distinction made between ontogeny and phylogeny, it is argued that at no stage during evolution does an organism receive knowledge from the outer world. Bold conjectures are made about the outer world and if these hypotheses are not falsified by experiments performed by the scientific community, they survive. In the long run, unfit theories are eliminated by the process of falsification, and there is a growth in knowledge. Theories that survive longer than others are understood to tentatively corroborate the truth. The analogy with biological evolution is clear: a selectionist account is preferred over an instructionist one. This means that at no point does an organism choose its genetic endowment. However, if this organism, with the genetic endowment that it is born with, stands the test of the environment, that is, if it survives long enough so that it can reproduce, than the organism‘s genetic traits survive, and it is said that it is adapted to its environment. In the long run, only the fit survive; maladaptive organisms are not able to survive long enough to reproduce and spread their genes in the gene pool again, and therefore die out.
Thus, just as the Modern Synthesis stresses that an organism can by no means directly receive instructions from the environment, Popper (1963: 46) emphasizes that we force our interpretations upon the world prior to our observations: “Without waiting, passively, for repetitions to impress regularities upon us, we actively try to impose regularities upon the world.” These are the conjectures that are put forward for trial, to be selected or eliminated according to the test-results. Scientific theories are thus not the result of observations, but of wild hypotheses. Although Popper himself is not part of the field of EE, his work on conjectures and refutations is often regarded as a first account on EE.
Konrad Lorenz is also a representative of traditional EE, since he too worked within the adaptationist program. Lorenz (1941, 1985) is famous for reinterpreting Kant’s synthetic a priori claims. No longer are the inborn categories regarded as evidently true, rather, they are understood to be “ontogenetically a priori and phylogenetically a posteriori.” This means that an individual organism is born with innate dispositions. These innate dispositions are acquired phylogenetically, through the evolution of the species, by means of the mechanism of natural selection. Most importantly, these dispositions are fallible, because they are the result of selection, not instruction. That is, these dispositions are adaptations, and natural selection only weeds out maladaptive organisms, which results in the survival of the adaptive ones. According to the Modern Synthesis, at no time in evolution does natural selection actually cause or create the adaptive traits that are presented to the environment (again because of the strict distinction made between ontogeny, where natural selection does not work, and phylogeny, where it does.
According to Lorenz, and contrary to Kant, the thing in itself (Das Ding an Sich) is knowable through the categories of the knower, not the characteristics of the thing in itself, and selection results in a partial isomorphism through adaptation. Lorenz states that:
The central nervous apparatus does not prescribe the laws of nature any more than the hoof of the horse prescribes the form of the ground. Just as the hoof of the horse, this central nervous apparatus stumbles over unforeseen changes in its task. But just as the hoof of the horse is adapted to the ground of the steppe which it copes with, so our central nervous apparatus for organizing the image of the world is adapted to the real world with which man has to cope. (In Campbell, 1974: 447)
Thus, through adaptation, there is a correspondence between our images of the world and the world in itself, or between organism and environment, or between theories and the world. This is of course not a 1-to-1 correspondence; our image of a tree is not like a real tree, but because our cognitive apparatus is adapted to the world, there is a partial isomorphism between the two. Adaptations thus become a description of the world in a biological language (Lorenz, 1977).
The reinterpretation of Kant’s synthetic a priori claims is not solely the work of Lorenz; rather it dates as far back as Herbert Spencer. For the most complete overview of authors who have reinterpreted Kant’s ideas in this way, see Campbell (1974).
Donald T. Campbell (1974) goes one step further than Lorenz because he rethought the distinction between ontogeny and phylogeny. No longer is natural selection something that solely works on the level of the environment; natural selection is internalized as well. Furthermore, the mechanism of natural selection, in its own workings, is said to work selectively as well.
Campbell’s (1959: 153-5) main goal was to develop an empirical science of induction (not to be confused with behaviorist instruction; see section 1). This empirical science consisted of a comparative study of the psychology of knowledge, a biological science of cognition, a sociology of knowledge, and a science of history. In other words, he wanted to build a science of science, which Campbell (1974) termed EE. This discipline had to be compatible with evolutionary biology and social evolution (Campbell, 1974: 413). In his 1959 paper he characterized biology as the study of “progressive adaptation.” Therefore, he made an abstraction of the mechanism of natural section by introducing the blind-variation-and-selective-survival mechanism (Campbell, 1959). Later he would call it the blind-variation-and-selective-retention scheme (Campbell (1960).
Campbell’s (1959: 156-8) EE is based upon six philosophical assumptions:
According to Campbell, science was only one aspect of a general knowledge process and this process was hierarchical in nature. Knowledge is no longer merely language-like and human bounded. On the contrary, different biological and social layers can be distinguished which, each on its own, encompasses a different aspect of knowledge. And here too, the focus lies on the acquisition and growth of knowledge.
In his 1959 article, Campbell distinguishes between 12 knowledge processes. These include machines on the one hand, but also bisexuality, heterozygosis, and meiotic cell division, on the other. In his 1960 article Campbell discusses creative thinking as a separate learning process.
Finally, in his 1974 article he distinguishes ten different levels that are applicable to biological and social evolution. This is the last and most canonized hierarchy that Campbell (1974: 422-435) introduced and it are these ten levels that are now discussed.
(i) Non-mnemonic problem solving
Organisms that engage in non-mnemonic problem solving do not have a memory. Bacteria, for example, are such organisms. They blindly search for food until they find it: they cannot remember previous food sources, and they cannot voluntarily go to one. They are just swept away by the wind.
(ii) Vicarious locomotor devices
Examples are the echolocation of bats, or a blind man’s cane. They replace the blind exploration of the surrounding space by trial and error movements.
(iii) Habit and (iv) Instinct
Habit, instinct, and visual diagnosis are all closely related to each other, according to Campbell. Both instincts and habits are mostly founded upon visual stimuli that trigger a learned or innate response. Innate knowledge does not represent innate ideas; rather it corresponds to expectations or hypotheses that have no prior validity. Therefore, the distinction between “primitive instincts” and “learned habits” is false: all instincts are fine-tuned by learning processes and all learning makes use of inborn knowledge mechanisms. And both are hypotheses that need to be tested. Furthermore, Campbell introduces the popular habit-to-instinct view of his time, namely that by means of natural selection, habits will become instincts (without explaining how this takes place).
(v) Visually supported thought
This can be thought of as insightful problem-solving. Organisms endowed with this knowledge process are able to perform insightful behavior when they can visually perceive their surrounding environment. Campbell offers as an example the Köhler experiments, where primates are capable of showing some kind of “aha” experience.
(vi) Mnemonically supported thought
Organisms with memory capacities can re-present the environment, thereby replacing the need for a constant visually perceivable environment. Because one can imagine the environment, one can also have creative and intelligent thoughts, of unseen or unexperienced things (such as a mermaid).
(vii) Socially vicarious exploration: observational learning and imitation
Trial and error exploration by one member of the community can replace the trial and error exploration by all the other members of society. This is because certain organisms are able to learn by observing others. Imitating other’s behavior reduces the possibility that each individual on its own needs to invent a certain behavior. This implies that we live in a shared world; a solipsistic view is impossible. Campbell also stresses that learned behavior cannot jump from brain to brain; rather it needs to be learned in turn by trial and error. So a memetic position is not feasible in Campbell’s view.
Language overlaps with (vi) and (vii) and is broadly conceived as including human language but also other communication systems such as bee language and pheromones. With language, the environment is represented by words that are contingently chosen (they don’t necessarily correspond with the world; the relation is indirect). Language acquisition too, does not merely encompass the direct passing on of words to children. Children, through trial and error, learn to correctly use the words they hear to describe certain objects and/or events, which again implies a strictly behavioristic model.
(ix) Cultural transmission
Changes in technology and culture also represent a blind variation and selective retention scheme. Complete social organizations or either selected or not and their respective leaders replace the behavior of the members of the community.
Science is part of cultural evolution. And also science reveals a trial and error pattern.
Many of the above mentioned knowledge mechanisms that Campbell introduced are today further divided or re-defined. Nevertheless it was Campbell who for the first time in history so clearly distinguished between different knowledge processes. Thus he showed that knowledge is not to be understood in a uniform manner.
Campbell’s more general blind-variation-and-selective-retention scheme, that is supposed to run through all levels of the hierarchy, is still applied today.
All increases in knowledge or adaptivity are an inductive process, and adaptivity is also comprehended as knowledge (Campbell, 1960). This differs from an instructionist process, because at no time is the organism a blank slate that is written upon by the environment. While natural selection does not cause blind variation, in a way it does cause indirect selective retention, through the elimination of the unfit. “At no stage has there been any transfusion of knowledge from the outside, not of mechanisms of knowing, nor of fundamental certainties.” (Campbell, 1974: 413). Therefore, according to Campbell (1960: 380-381):
In his 1995 article (published posthumously in 1997 by Heyes and Frankel), Campbell rejected his earlier ideas about treating adaptations as knowledge and he restricted knowledge to be those vicarious selectors. In fact, the whole adaptationist approach became more and more problematic to Campbell (1987: 140) in his later writings and he started to emphasize that Panglossian adaptationism needs to be avoided at all times within EE. Retention is equally important, just as variation and selection are, especially when science is concerned.
Specifically regarding scientific thinking, especially in the works of Stephen Toulmin (1972), a strong analogy is drawn with natural selection. Ideas and concepts are the results of scientific thinking and these are, by analogy with the gene pool, introduced into the pool of scientists through science journals, conferences, books etc., leading to the rise of competition between different ideas. Only the fittest ideas survive while the less fit die out. However, this “fitness” is not solely the result of the scientific value of the idea; other factors enter into the equation. For example, sociological reasons are included as causal factors for why an idea is or is not rejected.
Peter Munz, another author working within the adaptationist program, calls his version of EE, “Philosophical Darwinism” (2001). Contrary to the previous authors discussed, Munz states that even variation, which is normally conceived of as being blind (the result of random mutations and genetic recombinations), is the result of a selective process. Inspired by the works of Popper, he goes so far as to state that organisms are “embodied theories,” and theories are “disembodied organisms.”
According to Munz (2001: 151-160), every organism is a theory about its environment. That is, an organism primarily gives knowledge about the environment. Moreover, an organism can be regarded as a definition of that environment. An organism mirrors its environment because of selective adaptation. Therefore, an organism literally becomes a not yet falsified theory of a certain aspect of the environment, its Umwelt/niche, and thus it becomes a provisionally true hypothesis. A theory/organism — the two are synonymous in Munz’s view — has certain expectancies about its environment, and if these are met, then the organism/theory survives; if not, the organism/theory is falsified. The longer an organism/theory survives, the more truth is approximated.
The behavior of a fish and the functioning of a theory of water are exactly identical. The fish represents water by its structure and its functioning. Both features define an initial condition (for example, the degree of viscosity of water) which, when spotted or sensed, trigger off a prognosis or behavioral response which, in case of a fish, fails to be falsified. By contrast, a bird does not represent water. (Munz, 2001: 155) .
Thus, an organism is an embodied theory about its environment. An organism re-presents that part of the world that it is adapted to and this representation is thus no longer verbal or conscious. Embodied theories, according to Munz, are also no longer expressed in language, but in anatomical structures or reflex responses, etc.
Besides regarding organisms as embodied theories, theories become disembodied organisms in Munz’s view. A human being is both because it possesses linguistic knowledge. Linguistically expressed theories, according to Munz (2001: 160-8), are also the result of a process of variation and selective retention. Here too, linguistically expressed theories are literally organisms. In the wake of Popper, Munz stresses that theories should be reified. Linguistic theories are built up from language, and there exists no causal link between this language and the causal impact that the world has upon the non-linguistic body. Therefore, language and consciousness create uncertainty: expressions can only be hypothetical. In addition, at first language appears to be maladaptive, since it delays non-linguistic, embodied responses. Nevertheless, such expressions are adaptive as well, because they enable variation. Selection can only work when there is variation which it can select from, and therefore, for Munz, the growth of scientific linguistic knowledge is possible.
In contrast to previous adaptationist EEs, according to Munz, this variation is also the result of selectionist processes. Eventually, Munz (2001: 184) stresses that his theory results in an antropic principle. With the origin and evolution of life, the world represents itself, onto itself, through disembodied organisms and embodied theories. Contrary to physics, it is biology that can give us a valid picture of how the world is.
In summary, within traditional evolutionary epistemological accounts, the strict distinction between phenotype and environment, as put forward by adherents of the Modern Synthesis, is adhered to. This leads to the possibility that one can gain knowledge about the environment by studying organisms that are adaptive to that environment. Thus, within this tradition it is assumed that organisms can provide a non-arbitrary relation, not between language and the outer world, but between whole organisms (their bodies) and the outer world. This position however encounters problems when one takes an organismic point of view, a position that will be discussed in the next section.
When evolution is regarded from within an organismic point of view, a constructivist account emerges which in turn leads to the non-adaptationist approach within EE. Therefore, first the constructivist approach is examined. Secondly, the elements that are subtracted from this approach for the development of the non-adaptationist approach to EE are outlined.
Following Lewontin and Gould’s critical review of the adaptationist program, evolutionary theory was interrogated from less adaptationist perspectives as well. Opposed to the strict adaptationist account, the systems theoretical approach defends the following constructivist position.
…[T]he claim that the environment of an organism is causally independent of the organism, and the changes in the environment are autonomous and independent of changes in the species itself, is clearly wrong. It is bad biology, and every ecologist and evolutionary biologist knows that it is bad biology. The metaphor of adaptation, while once an important heuristic for building evolutionary theory, is now an impediment to a real understanding of the evolutionary process that needs to be replaced by another. Although all metaphors are dangerous, the actual process of evolution seems best captured by the process of construction. (Lewontin: 2000: 48)
Instead of portraying organisms as passive elements that are subjected to selection, Lewontin (2000: 51-64) introduces a more constructivist approach to evolution in which five different aspects of the organism-environment relation are distinguishable.
Hence, from within the systems theoretical approach, the relation between an organism and its environment is understood from within a dialectical point of view (Callebaut & Pinxten, 1987: 41, Gontier, 2006).
Figure 2. Within systems theory, the focus lies not only on the mutual relation between the organism and
its environment, rather internal processes specific to the organism and/or the environment are taken into account.
An organism not only is determined by the external environment, the organism can also, to a certain extent, determine its environment by construing and reconstruing it in an active manner (fig. 2). Therefore, the concept “environment” is also broadened to include the inner environment where inner homeostatic, self-regulating processes are responsible for an organism’s survival (point 4 and 5 above). Because of this, it is said that the constructivist approach explains evolution from the organismic point of view (Gutmann and Weingarten 1990; Wuketits, 2006).
The non-adaptationist approach to EE was first introduced by Franz Wuketits (1989). All adaptationist approaches to EE adhere to the view that it is possible, to an extent, to develop a correspondence theory. A correspondence theory states that there is a 1-to-1 correspondence between the environment and the organisms that live in it, or between theories and the world. For instance, the ant can tell us something about the soil. In order to make this claim feasible, natural selection needs to be reduced to, or at a minimum the emphasis should rest heavily on, the mechanism of adaptation. It is only through the mechanism of adaptation that such correspondence can be obtained.
In the wake of Ludwig von Bertalanffy, one of the founders of systems theory, the importance of the study of the whole organism is stressed, next to the study of the (adaptive) relation between the organism and the environment. Within systems theory, organisms are conceived of as partly open, partly closed systems. That is to say, organisms constantly take matter and energy from, and give matter and energy to, their environment, while they themselves maintain a “steady state” (Wuketits, 2002: 193). Later on, Prigogine (1996) would introduce the concept of “dissipative structures.” A whirlpool, for example, maintains its form while the water of which it is composed, constantly changes. But once the water flow stops, the whirlpool no longer exists. Organisms are more than such dissipative structures. They are homeostatic systems, because not only can they self-regulate and self-organize, they can also maintain themselves to a certain extent. That is why it is said that organisms are partly open, partly closed systems; they receive and donate matter and energy to and from their environment. They also distinguish themselves from that environment and are able to construct their environment as well.
Developmental systems theory (DST) (Maturana and Varela 1980; Oyama 2000a and b; Dupré 2001) grew out of systems theory and, as the concept suggests, it focuses on developmental processes. It understands organisms to be autocatalytic systems, systems which are able to self-organize and self-maintain, not so much because they are adapted to the environment they live in, but because they are able to self-maintain, sometimes even despite the environment, due to the inner mechanisms they develop in order to survive. Therefore, these inner mechanisms of self-organization and self-regulation are comprehended as causal factors that need to be part of the explanation of why organisms behave in a certain manner.
Within the non-adaptationist tradition of EE, being adapted does not mean that there is a one-to-one correspondence with the environment. Instead, being adapted implies having the ability to change the environment to make it livable for the organism, and thus to enhance survival. Adaptation thus becomes only one aspect that needs to be studied, together with non-adaptationist approaches. Wuketits (2006: 38-9):
… a nonadaptationist view of cognition and knowledge and a nonadaptationist version of evolutionary epistemology (…) is mainly based on the following assumptions: (1) Cognition is the function of active bio-systems and not of blind machines that just respond to the outer world. (2) Cognition is not a reaction to the outer world but results from complex interactions between the organism and its surroundings. (3) Cognition is not a linear process of step-by-step accumulation of information but a complex process of continuous error elimination.
In sum, an EE based upon systems theoretical evolutionary theory is not anti-adaptationist (Wuketits 1995: 359-60). It is non-adaptationist because the world constantly changes because of the organisms that inhabit it. This makes it difficult to approximate a one-to-one correspondence.
Instead of adhering to such a correspondence theory, the non-adaptationist approach puts forward a coherence theory. Because of these processes of inner self-organization, self-regulation and the possibility for an organism to partially (re)construct its environment, an organism is partly capable of creating its own habitat. Different organisms develop different habitats because they have evolved differently and have different inner mechanisms which enable them to cope with, and interact with, the outer world. Here, according to Wuketits (2006), it is not useful to ask which habitat is more real or more in correspondence with the world in itself (an sich), because every organism capable of surviving has proven that it is adequate. Therefore a coherence theory adheres to a functional notion of reality. What an organism, according to its own inner mechanisms of perception, perceives as real, is real for that organism in its struggle for existence. If that organism is able to survive because of the way it perceives things, it is able to reproduce and reintroduce its genes into the gene pool. Wuketits (2006: 43):
First, organisms do not simply get a picture of (parts of) reality, but develop, as was already hinted at, a particular scheme of reaction. … Second, the notion of a world-in-itself becomes obsolete or at least redundant. What counts for any organism is that it copes with its own world properly.
Thus far we have examined the “organismic point of view” towards evolution defended by the systems theoretical approach, and the description of evolution from the “point of view of the environment” as is the case with the Modern Synthesis. A third and final alternative for describing evolution is the “gene’s eye view.” The gene’s eye view was introduced by Richard Dawkins (1976), following Williams (1966).
This approach opened the discussion concerning universal Darwinism (section 7) and introduced the important concept of a “replicator,” a concept that is often used within universal selectionism.
According to Dawkins (1982: 162) the unit of selection is not the phenotype, but the replicator: “… any entity in the universe of which copies are made” and this replicator, contrary to the vehicles that temporarily house them “…is potentially immortal… the rationale is that an entity must have a low rate of spontaneous, endogenous change, if the selective advantage of its phenotypic effects over those of rival (‘allelic’) entities is to have any significant effect.” (Dawkins, 1982: 164).
A replicator carries information that can be copied. An example par excellence is genetic material that, according to the specific sequence of nucleotides (the building blocks of genes), encodes for certain characteristics. Organisms, according to Dawkins, are mere vehicles that temporarily accommodate such information-carrying replicators. In the long run, because of their longevity, fecundity and copying-fidelity, these “selfish genes” outlive their temporary housing. Therefore, the emphasis for Dawkins should lie on the replicator, not the individual organism. That is not to say that the environmental approach so characteristic of the Modern Synthesis is wrong, according to Dawkins, rather it should be complemented with the gene’s point of view of evolution.
…[t]here are two ways in which we can characterize natural selection. Both are correct: they simply focus on different aspects of the same process. Evolution results from the differential survival of replicators. Genes are replicators; organisms and groups of organisms are not replicators, they are vehicles in which replicators travel about. Vehicle selection is the process by which some vehicles are more successful than other vehicles in ensuring the survival of their replicators. (Dawkins, 1982: 162)
It is the organism’s job to deliver its genes as quickly and faithfully as possible within the gene pool. “Vehicle selection is the differential success of vehicles in propagating the replicators that ride inside them.” (Dawkins, 1982: 166) Every behavior an organism displays that is not reducible to the benefit of its genetic material is, from the point of view of the gene, futile and even unnecessarily costly. Organisms are only important in so far as they are able to propagate their genes. Therefore, although this view can be complemented with the Modern Synthesis, it stands opposed to the “organismic point of view.”
Thus far we have seen that the units and levels of selection debate that started within biology also set off an evolutionary epistemological debate concerning the different units and levels of selection in science.
One of the main goals set forward by many Evolutionary Epistemologists is the development of a normative and explanatory framework that is based upon, and is at the least analogical to, evolutionary thinking. The quest for universal selection formulas that was already launched as early as the nineteenth century was spurred again by this units and levels of selection debate. The goal of such a uniform universal formula is that it not only explains biological evolution, but also the evolution of science, culture, the brain, economics, etc.
Scientists and philosophers alike have introduced different formulas that generalize and universalize natural selection and other evolutionary theories. Discussions in the field revolve around the question of whether there exists one universal selection formula which can be utilized to interpret all other kinds of evolutionary processes (including the evolution of culture, psychology, immunology, language, etc.), or whether such formulas can only help at a descriptive, and therefore, merely analogical, level. In what follows, different evolutionary frameworks are briefly touched upon so that the interested reader has an idea of where to look for different applications of these schemas.
Lewontin (1970: 1) was the first to make an abstraction of natural selection. He argued that “the logical skeleton” of Darwin’s theory is “a powerful predictive system for changes at all levels of biological organization.” Lewontin distinguishes between three principles: phenotypic variation, differential fitness (because of different environments) and the heritability of that fitness. Lewontin (1970: 1) introduced this logical skeleton to pinpoint “different units of Mendelian, cytoplasmic, or cultural inheritance.” He distinguished between the selection of molecules (regarding the origin of life), cell organelles (regarding cytoplasmic evolution), cellular selection (different cell types divide at different rates, comparable with what today is called epigenetics), gametic selection, individual selection, kin selection and population selection.
Dawkins (1983: 15) states that wherever life originates, that life can only be explained by using Darwin’s theory of natural selection. According to Dawkins, the most important property of life is that it is adapted to its environment, and adaptation requires a Darwinist explanation. Dawkins (1983: 16) states: “I agree with Maynard Smith […] that ‘The main task of evolution is to explain complexity, that is, to explain the same set of facts which Paley used as evidence of a Creator.’”
Organisms are “adaptively complex” (Dawkins, 1983: 17). This means that a complex structure like the eye, for example, evolved by natural selection for vision. Organisms or organismal traits are adapted to the environment and also evolved to enable adaptation towards that environment. Thus, through adaptation, an organism possesses information about that environment (Dawkins, 1983: 21). Selection refers to “…the non-random selection of randomly varying replicating entities by reason of their ‘phenotypic’ effects” (Dawkins, 1983: 32). It can be further divided into “one-off selection” and “cumulative selection.” The former relates to the selection of a stable configuration, a universally occurring process. The latter enables complex adaptation, because the next generation builds upon earlier generations through such things as the passing on of genes, but not solely by this mechanism.
Most importantly, for Dawkins, it is replicators that are selected. The reason that he introduces the concept “replicator” is twofold. First, he wants to extend the Modern Synthesis by introducing the gene’s eye view. Second, he introduces the term replicator, instead of gene, because he wants to universalize the principle of natural selection. The unit of selection, according to Dawkins, is the replicator, but replicator is a generic term; not only genes (individual genes or whole chunks of the chromosome), but also memes –which he defines as “… brain structures whose ‘phenotypic’ manifestation as behavior or artifact is the basis of their [cultural] selection,” are replicators (Dawkins, 1982: 164). The idea of memetics was later expanded by Blackmore (1999).
Campbell’s scheme is a formula that can be universalized. Every relationship that an organism engages in with its environment is a knowledge relation. Variation is blind, either because of random mutations and genetic recombinations, or, in the case of the development of scientific theories, blind trials result in blind variation.
Selection does not only occur at the level of the interaction between phenotype and environment, for selection is also internalized by the process of vicarious selection (see above). And trial and error learning has always been somewhat synonymous with blind-variation-and-selective-retention, according to Campbell.
In his earlier writings, Campbell (1959, 1960) emphasizes the notion of variation, because only when there is sufficient variation will there be competition and selection. Later, he emphasized the selective retention-part of his theory: those traits that are already adaptive also need to be retained by the current generation in order to keep being adaptive. In science as well, existing theories must be retained and passed on to the next generation through learning, or this information dies out. Hence tradition within culture or science, for example, also became a more important element in Campbell’s later writings (1987).
The concept “universal selectionism” was first introduced by Gary Cziko (1995) and roughly corresponds with Campbell’s blind-variation-and-selective-retention scheme, although he prefers the term selectionism. In his 1995 book, Cziko explains this scheme as being applicable not only to biological evolution, but also to the evolution and growth of knowledge, immunology, and the development of the brain, thinking and culture. Selectionism is the only theory that, according to Cziko (1995: 13- 26), can explain the fit of an organism with its environment. Throughout history, providentialism and instructionism have also been assumed to explain this fit, but only selectionism can explain the mechanism of adaptation.
The replication, variation, and environmental interaction scheme was first introduced by David Hull (1980) as a critique on Dawkins’s notion of replicators and vehicles. In Dawkins’s view, organisms are mere vehicles that temporarily accommodate the selfish genes that ride inside them and an organism can actually be equated with the workings of its genes. Hull’s theory differs from Dawkins’s, because the former states that organisms can display behavior that is not reducible to their genes. On a more general level, Hull introduced the notion of an interactor to complement Dawkins’s view (1980). Thus, he basically re-introduced the common assumption held by the Modern Synthesis that what interacts with the environment are organisms, not genes. But the notion of interaction can also be universalized. The most recent account of this formula is given in Hull, Langman and Glenn (2001).
For selection to occur, three conditions need to be met: replication, variation, and environmental interaction. Replication is dependent on the interaction between the organism and its environment (Hull, Langman and Glenn, 2001: 511). The formula they propose should be equally applicable to biology, immunology and operant behavior, although it should not be identical to biological selection theory. All three sorts of evolution share certain properties but also have their own peculiarities. Changes in operant behavior, for example, are not transmitted immediately to the next generation.
In contrast to Campbell and Plotkin, Hull, Langman, and Glenn (2001: 513) define selection as “[The] repeated cycles of replication, variation, and environmental interaction so structured that environmental interaction causes replication to be differential. The net effect is the evolution of the lineages produced by this process.”
Within postneodarwinian theory, variation is either perceived as part of the selection process, or as a precondition for selection to occur. If variation occurs, this results either from mutations that occur in the sex cells at the biological level, or from different behavioral patterns that in their own right are the result of environmental interaction. Replication, according to these authors (Hull, Langman and Glenn, 2001: 514-6), concerns the repetition/copying of “information.”
Finally, environmental interaction is characterized as causing replication to differ because certain replicators are more frequently selected than others, which in turn has nothing to do with the introduction of new variation. Only at the level of interaction between the organism and the environment does selection occur.
Hull’s scheme is one of the few schemes that has already been implemented in extra-philosophical and extra-biological fields. William Croft (2000, 2002) for instance uses it for the study of language change.
Plotkin prefers the notion of “universal Darwinism” over universal selectionism (1995, chapter 3). He distinguishes between two universal formulas. The first, the generate-test/selection-regenerate formula is more general. It does not a priori say anything about the mechanisms or units that cause this generating and testing. This formula is again very close to Campbell’s scheme. as well as Lewontin’s (Plotkin, 1995: 84). A second formula does specify the units and mechanisms: replication, interaction and lineages. The reason Plotkin distinguishes between the two is that he wants to avoid having to pinpoint a priori a replicator in cultural evolution.
Selection processes, according to Plotkin, always take place in three steps: first, there is the generation of variation, and the nature of variation does not in itself need to be specified (genes, phenotypes, theories etc. all can vary). This phase is always followed by a test phase, where natural selection is of course the prototypical way in which there occurs selection based upon the test results. Finally, there is regeneration of old and newly evolved varieties (Plotkin, 1995: 84). While it is obvious that Plotkin mainly has the selection of genetic material in mind here, he also sees his formula appropriate in order to explain learning and intelligence. How information is transmitted is not determined a priori, rather it is important that old variations are regenerated throughout time.
The replicator-interactor-lineage formula is first an elaboration and specialization of Plotkin’s first formula since it combines Dawkins’s notion of a replicator with Hull’s notions of an interactor and lineage, the latter term referring to “… entities that can change indefinitely through time as a result of replication and interaction.” (Plotkin, 1995: 97). Hull himself defines lineages as “… spatiotemporal sequences of entities that causally produce one another. Entities in the sequence are in some sense ‘descended’ from those earlier in the sequence” (1981: 146).
According to Plotkin (1995: xv), adaptation and knowledge are related in two ways: first the capacity to acquire knowledge is in itself an adaptation, and secondly, adaptations are also a form of knowledge. Adaptations are “in-formed” by the environment. Therefore, adaptation is knowledge (Plotkin, 1995: 116) and there can be a tentative growth of knowledge.
SET, the Serial Endo-symbiogenetic Theory of Lynn Margulis and Dorian Sagan (2002), is a theory that describes the origin of the five kingdoms. In brief, different bacteria merged and evolved into multi-cellular life. What is interesting here is that different bacteria literally merged and thus that evolution does not exclusively occur according to speciation models. The physicist Freeman Dyson (1992) therefore introduces the principle of universal symbiogenesis, where symbiotic mergings and speciation models intertwine. Throughout the evolution of life, which is the same for the evolution of the universe, there is an increase in diversification on the one hand and symbiogenesis on the other. Different structures originate and then later merge to form new structures. Within the evolution of life, there was the origin of the first microbial organisms, which than merged again and evolved into multi-cellular organisms.
Dyson defines universal symbiogenesis as “the reattachment of two structures, after they have been detached from each other and have evolved along separate paths for a long time, so as to form a combined structure with behavior not seen in the separate components” (Dyson, 1998: 121).
In conclusion, it can be said that the specific theory of evolution that one adheres to also partly determines what kind of evolutionary epistemology can be adhered to. Since evolutionary epistemology bases itself first on the sciences, no attempt is made by different evolutionary epistemologists to put forward one all-encompassing theory or program that all evolutionary epistemologists should adhere too. On the contrary, the diversity of evolutionary epistemologies is championed by scholars working in the field.
Research for this article was supported by the Fund for Scientific Research – Flanders (F.W.O.-Vlaanderen) and the Centre for Logic and Philosophy of Science, where the author is a Research Assistant.
Vrije Universiteit Brussel
Last updated: September 8, 2006 | Originally published: