Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Evolutionary Ethics

Evolutionary ethics tries to bridge the gap between philosophy and the natural sciences by arguing that natural selection has instilled human beings with a moral sense, a disposition to be good. If this were true, morality could be understood as a phenomenon that arises automatically during the evolution of sociable, intelligent beings and not, as theologians or philosophers might argue, as the result of divine revelation or the application of our rational faculties. Morality would be interpreted as a useful adaptation that increases the fitness of its holders by providing a selective advantage. This is certainly the view of Edward O. Wilson, the “father” of sociobiology, who believes that “scientists and humanists should consider together the possibility that the time has come for ethics to be removed temporarily from the hands of the philosophers and biologicized” (Wilson, 1975: 27). The challenge for evolutionary biologists such as Wilson is to define goodness with reference to evolutionary theory and then explain why human beings ought to be good.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Figures and Key Concepts
    1. Charles Darwin
    2. Herbert Spencer
    3. The Is-Ought Problem
    4. The Naturalistic Fallacy
    5. Sociobiology
  2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory
  3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Key Figures and Key Concepts

a. Charles Darwin

The biologization of ethics started with the publication of The Descent of Man by Charles Darwin (1809-1882) in 1871. In this follow-up to On the Origin of Species, Darwin applied his ideas about evolutionary development to human beings. He argued that humans must have descended from a less highly organized form–in fact, from a “hairy, tailed quadruped … inhabitant of the Old World” (Darwin, 1930: 231). The main difficulty Darwin saw with this explanation is the high standard of moral qualities apparent in humans. Faced with this puzzle, Darwin devoted a large chapter of the book to evolutionary explanations of the moral sense, which he argued must have evolved in two main steps.

First, the root for human morality lies in the social instincts (ibid. 232). Building on this claim by Darwin, today’s biologists would explain this as follows. Sociability is a trait whose phylogenetic origins can be traced back to the time when birds “invented” brooding, hatching, and caring for young offspring. To render beings able to fulfill parental responsibilities required social mechanisms unnecessary at earlier stages of evolutionary history. For example, neither amoebae (which reproduce by division) nor frogs (which leave their tadpole-offspring to fend for themselves) need the social instincts present in birds. At the same time as facilitating the raising of offspring, social instincts counterbalanced innate aggression. It became possible to distinguish between “them” and “us” and aim aggression towards individuals that did not belong to one’s group. This behavior is clearly adaptive in the sense of ensuring the survival of one’s family.

Second, with the development of intellectual faculties, human beings were able to reflect on past actions and their motives and thus approve or disapprove of others as well as themselves. This led to the development of a conscience which became “the supreme judge and monitor” of all actions (ibid. 235). Being influenced by utilitarianism, Darwin believed that the greatest-happiness principle will inevitably come to be regarded as a standard for right and wrong (ibid. 134) by social beings with highly evolved intellectual capacities and a conscience.

Based on these claims, can Darwin answer the two essential questions in ethics? First, how can we distinguish between good and evil? And second, why should we be good? If all his claims were true, they would indeed support answers to the above questions. Darwin’s distinction between good and evil is identical with the distinction made by hedonistic utilitarians. Darwin accepts the greatest-happiness principle as a standard of right and wrong. Hence, an action can be judged as good if it improves the greatest happiness of the greatest number, by either increasing pleasure or decreasing pain. And the second question–why we should be good–does not pose itself for Darwin with the same urgency as it did, for instance, for Plato (Thrasymachus famously asked Socrates in the Republic why the strong, who are not in need of aid, should accept the Golden Rule as a directive for action). Darwin would say that humans are biologically inclined to be sympathetic, altruistic, and moral as this proved to be an advantage in the struggle for existence (ibid. 141).

b. Herbert Spencer

The next important contribution to evolutionary ethics was by Herbert Spencer (1820-1903), the most fervent defender of that theory and the creator of the theory of Social Darwinism. Spencer’s theory can be summarized in three steps. As did Darwin, Spencer believed in the theory of hedonistic utilitarianism as proposed by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. In his view, gaining pleasure and avoiding pain directs all human action. Hence, moral good can be equated with facilitating human pleasure. Second, pleasure can be achieved in two ways, first by satisfying self-regarding impulses and second by satisfying other-regarding impulses. This means that eating one’s favorite food and giving food to others are both pleasurable experiences for humans. Third, mutual cooperation between humans is required to coordinate self- and other-regarding impulses, which is why humans develop principles of equity to bring altruistic and egoistic traits into balance (Fieser, 2001, 214).

However, Spencer did not become known for his theory of mutual cooperation. On the contrary, his account of Social Darwinism is contentious to date because it is mostly understood as “an apology for some of the most vile social systems that humankind has ever known,” for instance German Nazism (Ruse, 1995: 228). In short, Spencer elevated alleged biological facts (struggle for existence, natural selection, survival of the fittest) to prescriptions for moral conduct (ibid. 225). For instance, he suggested that life is a struggle for human beings and that, in order for the best to survive, it is necessary to pursue a policy of non-aid for the weak: “to aid the bad in multiplying, is, in effect, the same as maliciously providing for our descendants a multitude of enemies” (Spencer, 1874: 346). Spencer’s philosophy was widely popular, particularly in North America in the 19th century, but declined significantly in the 20th century.

Which answers could he give to the two essential questions in ethics? How can we distinguish between good and evil and why should we be good? Spencer’s answer to question one is identical to Darwin’s (see above) as they both supported hedonistic utilitarianism. However, his answer to question two is interesting, if untenable. Spencer alleged that evolution equaled progress for the better (in the moral sense of the word) and that anything which supported evolutionary forces would therefore be good (Maxwell, 1984: 231). The reasoning behind this was that nature shows us what is good by moving towards it; and hence, “evolution is a process which, in itself, generates value” (Ruse, 1995: 231). If evolution advances the moral good, we ought to support it out of self-interest. Moral good was previously identified with universal human pleasure and happiness by Spencer. If the evolutionary process directs us towards this universal pleasure, we have an egoistic reason for being moral, namely that we want universal happiness. However, to equate development with moral progress for the better was a major value judgement which cannot be held without further evidence, and most evolutionary theorists have given up on the claim (Ruse, 1995: 233; Woolcock, 1999: 299). It also is subject to more conceptual objections, namely deriving “ought” from “is,” and committing the naturalistic fallacy.

c. The Is-Ought Problem

The first philosopher who persistently argued that normative rules cannot be derived from empirical facts was David Hume (1711-1776) (1978: 469):

In every system of morality, which I have hitherto met with, I have always remark’d, that the author proceeds for some time in the ordinary way of reasoning, and establishes the being of a God or makes observations concerning human affairs; when of a sudden I am surpriz’d to find, that instead of the usual copulations of propositions, is, and is not, I meet with no proposition that is not connected with an ought, or an ought not. This change is imperceptible; but is, however, of the last consequence.

It is this unexplained, imperceptible change from “is” to “ought” which Hume deplores in moral systems. To say what is the case and to say what ought to be the case are two unrelated matters, according to him. On the one hand, empirical facts do not contain normative statements, otherwise they would not be purely empirical. On the other hand, if there are no normative elements in the facts, they cannot suddenly surface in the conclusions because a conclusion is only deductively valid if all necessary information is present in the premises.

How do Darwin and Spencer derive “ought” from “is”? Let us look at Darwin first, using an example which he could have supported.

  1. Child A is dying from starvation.
  2. The parents of child A are not in a position to feed their child.
  3. The parents of child A are very unhappy that their child is dying from starvation.
  4. Therefore, fellow humans ought morally to provide food for child A.

Darwin (1930: 234) writes that “happiness is an essential part of the general good.” Therefore, those who want to be moral ought to promote happiness, and hence, in the above case, provide food. However, the imperceptible move from “is” to “ought” which Hume found in moral systems, is also present in this example. Thus, Darwin derives ought from is when he moves from the empirical fact of unhappiness to the normative claim of a duty to relieve unhappiness.

The same can be said for Spencer whose above argument about the survival of the fittest could be represented as follows:

  1. Natural selection will ensure the survival of the fittest.
  2. Person B is dying from starvation because he is ill, old, and poor.
  3. Therefore, fellow humans ought to morally avoid helping person B so that the survival of the fittest is guaranteed.

Even if both premises were shown to be true, it does not follow that we ought to morally support the survival of the fittest. An additional normative claim equating survival skills with moral goodness would be required to make the argument tenable. Again, this normative part of the argument is not included in the premises. Hence, Spencer also derives “ought” from “is.” Thomas Huxley (1906: 80) objects to evolutionary ethics on these grounds when he writes:

The thief and the murderer follow nature just as much as the philantropist. Cosmic evolution may teach us how the good and the evil tendencies of man may have come about; but, in itself, it is incompetent to furnish any better reason why what we call good is preferable to what we call evil than we had before.

d. The Naturalistic Fallacy

But evolutionary ethics was not only attacked by those who supported Hume’s claim that normative statements cannot be derived from empirical facts. A related argument against evolutionary ethics was voiced by British philosopher G.E. Moore (1873-1958). In 1903, he published a ground-breaking book, Principia Ethica, which created one of the most challenging problems for evolutionary ethics: the “naturalistic fallacy.” According to Michael Ruse (1995), when dealing with evolutionary ethics, “it has been enough for the student to murmur the magical phrase ‘naturalistic fallacy,’ and then he or she can move on to the next question, confident of having gained full marks thus far on the exam” (p. 223). So, what is the naturalistic fallacy and why does it pose a problem for evolutionary ethics?

Moore was interested in the definition of “good” and particularly in whether the property good is simple or complex. Simple properties, according to Moore, are indefinable as they cannot be described further using more basic properties. Complex properties, on the other hand, can be defined by outlining their basic properties. Hence, “yellow” cannot be defined in terms of its constituent parts, whereas “colored” can be explained further as it consists of several individual colors.

“Good,” according to Moore, is a simple property which cannot be described using more basic properties. Committing the naturalistic fallacy is attempting to define “good” with reference to other natural, i.e. empirically verifiable, properties. This understanding of “good” creates serious problems for both Darwin and Spencer. Following Bentham and Mill, both identify moral goodness with “pleasure.” This means they commit the naturalistic fallacy as good and pleasant are not identical. In addition, Spencer identifies goodness with “highly evolved,” committing the naturalistic fallacy again. (Both Moore’s claim in itself as well as his criticism of evolutionary ethics can be attacked, but this would fall outside the scope of this entry.)

e. Sociobiology

Despite the continuing challenge of the naturalistic fallacy, evolutionary ethics has moved on with the advent of sociobiology. In 1948, at a conference in New York, scientists decided to initiate new interdisciplinary research between zoologists and sociologists. “Sociobiology” was the name given to the new discipline aiming to find universally valid regularities in the social behavior of animals and humans. Emphasis was put on the study of biological, i.e. non-cultural, behavior. The field did, however, not get off the ground until Edward Wilson published his Sociobiology: The New Synthesis in 1975. According to Wilson (1975: 4), “sociobiology is defined as the systematic study of the biological basis of all social behavior.”

In Wilson’s view, sociobiology makes philosophers, at least temporarily, redundant, when it comes to questions of ethics (see quote in introduction). He believes that ethics can be explained biologically when he writes (ibid. 3, emphasis added):

The hypothalamus and limbic system … flood our consciousness with all the emotions – hate, love, guilt, fear, and others – that are consulted by ethical philosophers who wish to intuit the standards of good and evil. What, we are then compelled to ask, made the hypothalamus and the limbic system? They evolved by natural selection. That simple biological statement must be pursued to explain ethics.

Ethics, following this understanding, evolved under the pressure of natural selection. Sociability, altruism, cooperation, mutual aid, etc. are all explicable in terms of the biological roots of human social behavior. Moral conduct aided the long-term survival of the morally inclined species of humans. According to Wilson (ibid. 175), the prevalence of egoistic individuals will make a community vulnerable and ultimately lead to the extinction of the whole group. Mary Midgley agrees. In her view, egoism pays very badly in genetic terms, and a “consistently egoistic species would be either solitary or extinct” (Midgley, 1980: 94).

Wilson avoids the naturalistic fallacy in Sociobiology by not equating goodness with another natural property such as pleasantness, as Darwin did. This means that he does not give an answer to our first essential question in ethics. What is good? However, like Darwin he gives an answer to question two. Why should we be moral? Because we are genetically inclined to be moral. It is a heritage of earlier times when less morally inclined and more morally inclined species came under pressure from natural selection. Hence, we do not need divine revelation or strong will to be good; we are simply genetically wired to be good. The emphasis in this answer is not on the should, as it is not our free will which makes us decide to be good but our genetic heritage.

One of the main problems evolutionary ethics faces is that ethics is not a single field with a single quest. Instead, it can be separated into various areas, and evolutionary ethics might not be able to contribute to all of them. Let us therefore look at a possible classification for evolutionary ethics, which maps it on the field of traditional ethics, before concluding with possible criticisms.

2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory

For philosophy students, ethics is usually divided into three areas: metaethics, normative ethical theory, and applied ethics. Metaethics looks for possible foundations of ethics. Are there any moral facts out there from which we can deduce our moral theories? Normative ethical theories suggest principles or sets of principles to distinguish morally good from morally bad actions. Applied ethics looks at particular moral issues, such as euthanasia or bribery.

However, this classification is not adequate to accommodate evolutionary ethics in its entirety. Instead, a different three-fold distinction of ethics seems appropriate: descriptive ethics, normative ethics, and metaethics. Descriptive ethics outlines ethical beliefs as held by various people and tries to explain why they are held. For instance, almost all human cultures believe that incest is morally wrong. This belief developed, it could be argued, because it provides a survival advantage to the group that entertains it. Normative ethical theories develop standards to judge which actions are good and which actions are bad. The standard as defended by evolutionary ethics would be something like “Actions that increase the long-term capacity of survival in evolutionary terms are good and actions that decrease this capacity are bad.” However, the field has not yet established itself credibly in normative ethics. Consequentialism, deontology, virtue ethics, and social contracts still dominate debates. This is partly due to the excesses of Social Darwinism but also due to the unintuitive nature of the above or similar standards. Evolutionary ethics has been more successful in providing interesting answers in metaethics. Michael Ruse (1995: 250), for instance, argues that morality is a “collective illusion of the genes, bringing us all in…. We need to believe in morality, and so, thanks to our biology, we do believe in morality. There is no foundation “out there” beyond human nature.”

Descriptive ethics seems, as yet, the most interesting area for evolutionary ethics, a topic particularly suitable for anthropological and sociological research. Which ethical beliefs do people hold and why? But in all three areas, challenges are to be faced.

3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics

The following are some lingering challenges for evolutionary ethics:

  • How can a trait that was developed under the pressure of natural selection explain moral actions that go far beyond reciprocal altruism or enlightened self-interest? How can, for instance, the action of Maximilian Kolbe be explained from a biological point of view? (Kolbe was a Polish priest who starved himself to death in a concentration camp to rescue a fellow prisoner.)
  • Could not human beings have moved beyond their biological roots and transcended their evolutionary origins, in which case they would be able to formulate goals in the pursuit of goodness, beauty, and truth that “have nothing to do directly with survival, and which may at times militate against survival?” (O’Hear, 1997: 203).
  • Morality is universal, whereas biologically useful altruism is particular favoring the family or the group over others. “Do not kill” does not only refer to one’s own son, but also to the son of strangers. How can evolutionary ethics cope with universality?
  • Normative ethics aims to be action-guiding. How could humans ever judge an action to be ensuring long-term survival? (This is a practical rather than conceptual problem for evolutionary ethics.)
  • Hume’s “is-ought” problem still remains a challenge for evolutionary ethics. How can one move from “is” (findings from the natural sciences, including biology and sociobiology) to “ought”?
  • Similarly, despite the length of time that has passed since the publication of Principia Ethica, the challenge of the “naturalistic fallacy” remains.

Evolutionary ethics is, on a philosopher’s time-scale, a very new approach to ethics. Though interdisciplinary approaches between scientists and philosophers have the potential to generate important new ideas, evolutionary ethics still has a long way to go.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Darwin, Charles (1871, 1930) The Descent of Man, Watts & Co., London.
  • Fieser, James (2001) Moral Philosophy through the Ages, Mayfield Publishing Company, Mountain View California), Chapter 12 “Evolutionary Ethics.”
  • Hume, David (1740, 1978) A Treatise of Human Nature, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Maxwell, Mary (1984) Human Evolution: A Philosophical Anthropology, Croom Helm, London.
  • Midgley, Mary (1980) Beast and Man: The Roots of Human Nature, Methuen, London.
  • O’Hear, Anthony (1997) Beyond Evolution: Human Nature and the Limits of Evolutionary Explanation, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Ruse, Michael (1995) Evolutionary Naturalism, Routledge, London.
  • Spencer, Herbert (1874) The Study of Sociology, Williams & Norgate, London.
  • Wilson, Edward O. (1975) Sociobiology: The New Synthesis, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Woolcock, Peter G. (1999) “The Case Against Evolutionary Ethics Today,” in: Maienschein, Jane and Ruse, Michael (eds) Biology and the Foundation of Ethics, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, pp. 276-306.

Author Information

Doris Schroeder
Lancaster University, United Kingdom




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