Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Evolutionary Psychology

In its broad sense, the term “evolutionary psychology” stands for any attempt to adopt an evolutionary perspective on human behavior by supplementing psychology with the central tenets of evolutionary biology. The underlying idea is that since our mind is the way it is at least in part because of our evolutionary past, evolutionary theory can aid our understanding not only of the human body, but also of the human mind. In this broad sense, evolutionary psychology is a general field of inquiry that includes such diverse approaches as human behavioral ecology, memetics, dual-inheritance theory, and Evolutionary Psychology in the narrow sense.

The latter is a narrowly circumscribed adaptationist research program which regards the human mind as an integrated collection of cognitive mechanisms that guide our behavior and form our universal human nature. These cognitive mechanisms are supposed to be adaptations—the result of evolution by natural selection, that is, heritable variation in fitness. Adaptations are traits present today because in the past they helped our ancestors to solve recurrent adaptive problems. In particular, Evolutionary Psychology is interested in those adaptations that have evolved in response to characteristically human adaptive problems that have shaped our ancestors’ lifestyle as hunter-gatherers during our evolutionary past in the Pleistocence, like choosing and securing a mate, recognizing emotional expressions, acquiring a language, distinguishing kin from non-kin, detecting cheaters or remembering the location of edible plants. The purpose of Evolutionary Psychology is to discover and explain these cognitive mechanisms that guide current human behavior because they have been selected for as solutions to the recurrent adaptive problems prevalent in the evolutionary environment of our ancestors.

Evolutionary Psychology thus rests on a couple of key arguments and ideas: (1) The claim that the cognitive mechanisms that are underlying our behavior are adaptations. (2) The idea that they cannot be studied directly, for example, through observation of the brain or our overt behavior, but have to be discovered by means of a method known as “functional analysis,” where one starts with hypotheses about the adaptive problems faced by our ancestors, and then tries to infer the cognitive adaptations that must have evolved to solve them. (3) The claim that these cognitive mechanisms are adaptations not for solving problems prevalent in our modern environment, but for solving recurrent adaptive problems in the evolutionary environment of our ancestors. (4) The idea that our mind is a complex set of such cognitive mechanisms, or domain-specific modules. (5) The claim that these modules define who we are, in the sense that they define our universal human nature and ultimately trump any individual, cultural or societal differences.

Table of Contents

  1. Historic and Systematic Roots
    1. The Computational Model of the Mind
    2. The Modularity of Mind
    3. Adaptationism
  2. Key Concepts and Arguments
    1. Adaptation and Adaptivity
    2. Functional Analysis
    3. The Environment of Evolutionary Adaptedness
    4. Domain-specificity and Modularity
    5. Human Nature
  3. Examples of Empirical Research
  4. Problems and Objections
    1. Genetic Determinism
    2. Moral and Societal Issues
    3. Untestability and Story Telling
    4. Psychological Inadequacy
  5. Evolutionary Approaches to Mind, Culture, and Behavior: Alternatives to Evolutionary Psychology
    1. Human Behavioral Ecology
    2. Memetics
    3. Gene-Culture Coevolution
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Suggested Further Reading
    2. Other Referenced Works

1. Historic and Systematic Roots

Modern Evolutionary Psychology has its roots in the late 1980s and early 1990s, when psychologist Leda Cosmides and anthropologist John Tooby from Harvard joined the anthropologist Donald Symons at The University of California, Santa Barbara (UCSB) where they currently co-direct the Center for Evolutionary Psychology. It gained wide attention in 1992 with the publication of the landmark volume The Adapted Mind by Jerome Barkow, Leda Cosmides and John Tooby, and since then numerous textbooks (for example, Buss 1999) and popular presentations (for example, Pinker 1997, 2002; Wright 1994) have appeared. These days, Evolutionary Psychology is a powerful research program that has generated some interesting research, but it has also sparked a heated debate about its aspirations and limitations (see, for example, Rose and Rose 2000).

Evolutionary Psychology is effectively a theory about How the Mind Works (Pinker 1997). The human mind is not an all-purpose problem solver relying on a limited number of general principles that are universally applied to all problems—a view that dominated early artificial intelligence (AI) and behaviorism (for example, Skinner 1938, 1957). (For the idea of an all-purpose problem solver see, for example, Newell and Simon 1972; for some of the earliest AI work related to this idea see, for example, Newell and Simon 1961, Newell et al. 1958.) Rather, the human mind is a collection of independent, task-specific cognitive mechanisms, a collection of instincts adapted for solving evolutionary significant problems. The human mind is sort of a Swiss Army knife (Pinker 1994). This conception of the mind is based on three important ideas adopted from other disciplines (Cosmides and Tooby 2003, 54; Samuels 1998, 577): the computational model of the mind, the assumption of modularity, and the thesis of adaptationism.

a. The Computational Model of the Mind

Following the development of modern logic (Boole 1847; Frege 1879) and the formalization of the notion of computation (Turing 1936), early AI construed logical operations as mechanically executable information processing routines. Eventually, this led to the idea that mental processes (for example, reasoning) and mental states (for example, beliefs and desires) may themselves also be analyzable in purely syntactic terms. The “Computational Theory of Mind,” developed by philosophers like Hilary Putnam (1963) and Jerry Fodor (1975, 1981), for instance, conceives of mental states as relations between a thinker and symbolic representations of the content of the states, and of mental processes as formal operations on the syntactic features of those representations.

Evolutionary Psychology endorses the computational model of the mind as an information processing system or a formal symbol manipulator and thus treats the mind as a collection of “computational machines” (Cosmides and Tooby 2003, 54) or “information-processing mechanisms” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990a, 21) that receive input from the environment and produce behavior or physiological changes as output. To this, it adds an evolutionary perspective: “The evolutionary function of the human brain is to process information in ways that lead to adaptive behavior; the mind is a description of the operation of a brain that maps informational input onto behavioral output” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 282). The brain is thus not just like a computer. “It is a computer—that is, a physical system that was designed to process information” (Tooby and Cosmides 2005, 16; italics added).

The Computational Model of the Mind: The human mind is an information processing system, physically realized in the brain, and can be described at a computational level as a device whose evolutionary function is to process information by mapping informational input onto behavioral output.

b. The Modularity of Mind

Early attempts at simulating human intelligence revealed that artificial cognitive systems that are not already equipped with a fair amount of “innate knowledge” about a particular problem domain are unable to solve even the easiest problems (see, for example, the idea of “scripts” in Schank and Abelson 1977). In the 1970s and 1980s, the work of scientists like Noam Chomsky, Jerry Fodor, or David Marr further undermined the idea of the mind as a “blank slate” which acquires knowledge about the world by means of only a couple of general learning mechanisms. Their findings suggested instead that the mind incorporates a number of cognitive subsystems that are triggered only by a certain kind of input. While Marr (1982) was working on the neuroscience of vision, Chomsky famously criticized the behaviorist idea that language acquisition is just an ordinary kind of learning that follows the stimulus-response model by proving the intractability of some learning algorithms (see, for example, his 1959 review of Skinner’s Verbal Behavior or Chomsky 1957; for a later statement of similar ideas see Chomsky 1975). According to his “Poverty of the Stimulus” argument, a child cannot learn her first language through observation because the available stimuli (that is, the utterances of adult speakers) neither enable her to produce grammatically correct nor prevent her from producing grammatically incorrect sentences. Instead, Chomsky argued, we possess a “language acquisition device” which, rather than extracting all information from the world through some general mechanism, comes already equipped with a certain amount of “innate knowledge.” Just as our body contains a number of innate, genetically predisposed organs that serve a specific function, our mind also contains a number of information processing systems (like the language acquisition device), so called mental organs or modules in Fodor’s (1983) terminology, that are designed to perform a particular cognitive function.

The model of the mind as a general learning mechanism that is indiscriminately applied to any problem domain was also disconfirmed in other areas of cognitive science. Garcia and Koelling (1966) showed that while rats can learn some associations by means of stimulus-response mechanisms, others, albeit structurally similar, cannot be learned at all, or only much slower: rats that are given food that makes them nauseous subsequently avoid that kind of food, but they are unable to learn an association between a sound or a light and feeling nauseous. Galef (1990) demonstrated that rats readily eat a new kind of food if they smell it at another rat’s mouth, but not if they smell it at another part of the body. Mineka and Cook (1988) showed that a laboratory raised monkey that initially did not show fear of snakes started to do so once he observed another monkey exhibiting fear of snakes; yet, he didn’t start to show fear of flowers when observing the other doing so. Comparable “learning biases” have been found for humans in various areas (for example, Cook et al. 1986; Marks and Nesse 1994; Seligman and Hagar 1972).

Evolutionary Psychologists conclude that the assumption that the human mind is composed mainly of a few content-free cognitive processes that are “thought to govern how one acquires a language and a gender identity, an aversion to incest and an appreciation for vistas, a desire for friends and a fear of spiders—indeed, nearly every thought and feeling of which humans are capable” (Ermer et al. 2007, 155) is inadequate. Such mechanisms would be “limited to knowing what can be validly derived by general processes from perceptual information” (Cosmides and Tooby 1994, 92) and thus incapable of efficiently solving adaptive problems (see section 2d). Instead, Evolutionary Psychologists claim, “our cognitive architecture resembles a confederation of hundreds or thousands of functionally dedicated computers” (Tooby and Cosmides 1995, xiii), the so-called “modules”:

Modularity: The mind consists of a (possibly large) number of domain-specific, innately specified cognitive subsystems, called “modules.”

c. Adaptationism

Since cognitive mechanisms are not directly observable, studying them requires some indirect way of discovering them (see section 2b). Evolutionary Psychologists adopt the kind of adaptationist reasoning well known from evolutionary biology that also characterizes many works in sociobiology (Wilson 1975). Ever since Charles Darwin (1859/1964) proposed his theory of evolution by natural selection, evolutionary biologists quite successfully offer adaptationist explanations of physiological features of living things that explain the presence of a trait by claiming that it is an adaptation, that is, a trait current organisms possess because it enhanced their ancestors’ fitness. During the 1970s, sociobiologists argued that “social behaviors [too] are shaped by natural selection” (Lumsden and Wilson 1981, 99; for the original manifesto of sociobiology see Wilson 1975) and started to seek adaptationist explanations for cognitive, cultural, and social traits, like the ability to behave altruistically, different mating preferences in males and females, or the frequently observed parent-offspring conflicts.

Evolutionary Psychologists have inherited sociobiology’s adaptationist program: “The core idea … is that many psychological characteristics are adaptations—just as many physical characteristics are—and that the principles of evolutionary biology that are used to explain our bodies are equally applicable to our minds” (Durrant and Ellis 2003, 5). Our mind, they argue, is a complex, functionally integrated collection of cognitive mechanisms, and since the only known natural process that can bring about such functional complexity is evolution by natural selection (Cosmides and Tooby 1991, 493; Symons 1987, 126; Tooby and Cosmides 1990b, 382), these cognitive mechanisms are likely to be adaptations to the adaptive problems of our ancestors. This, Evolutionary Psychologists hold, intimately links psychology with evolutionary theory: “Because the architecture of the human mind acquired its functional organization through the evolutionary process, theories of adaptive function are the logical foundation on which to build theories of the design of cognitive mechanisms” (Ermer et al. 2007, 153–4). While evolutionary theory is used to describe the relevant ancestral problems and to make educated guesses about the information processing cognitive mechanisms that have been shaped by natural selection in response, the task of psychology is to establish that current humans actually possess these mechanisms (see section 2b).

Adaptationism: The human mind, like any other complex feature, was shaped by a process of evolution through natural selection. Its subsystems, the modules, are adaptations for solving recurrent information processing problems that arose in our ancestors’ evolutionary environment.

2. Key Concepts and Arguments

According to Evolutionary Psychology, the human mind is a set of cognitive adaptations designed by natural selection. Since such design takes time, the adaptive problems that shaped our mind are not the ones we know from our life as industrialists during the past 200 years, or from our life as agriculturalists during the past 10,000 years, but those characteristic of our past life as hunter-gatherers. Since these problems varied considerably, the human mind contains many problem-specific adaptations. The task of Evolutionary Psychology is to discover these modules by means of what is called a “functional analysis,” where one starts with hypotheses about the adaptive problems faced by our ancestors, and then tries to infer the cognitive adaptations that must have evolved to solve them.

This theoretical framework of Evolutionary Psychology centers on a couple of key ideas which will be explained in this section: (1) The cognitive mechanisms that underlie our behavior are adaptations. (2) They have to be discovered by means of functional analysis. (3) They are adaptations for solving recurrent adaptive problems in the evolutionary environment of our ancestors. (4) Our mind is a complex set of such mechanisms, or domain-specific modules. (5) These modules define our universal human nature.

a. Adaptation and Adaptivity

That our evolutionary history influenced not only our bodies, but also our brains, and thus our minds, is not very controversial. But how exactly has evolution affected the way we are, mind-wise? How exactly can evolutionary theory elucidate the structure and function of the human mind?

It may seem that “behavioral traits are like any other class of characters” (Futuyama 1998, 579), so that they can be subject to natural selection in the same way as physiological traits. In that case, an evolutionary study of human behavior could then proceed by studying behavioral variants and see which of them are adaptive and which selectively neutral or detrimental. However, since natural selection is heritable variation in fitness, it can act only on entities that are transmitted between generations, and behavior as such is not directly transmitted between generations, but only via the genes that code for the proximal cognitive mechanisms that trigger it. Hence, “[t]o speak of natural selection as selecting for ‘behaviors’ is a convenient shorthand, but it is misleading usage. … Natural selection cannot select for behavior per se; it can only select for mechanisms that produce behavior” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 281).

Hence, an evolutionary approach to human psychology must proceed by studying the cognitive mechanisms that underlie our behavior: “In the rush to apply evolutionary insights to a science of human behavior, many researchers have made a conceptual ‘wrong turn,’ … [which] has consisted of attempting to apply evolutionary theory directly to the level of manifest behavior, rather than using it as a heuristic guide for the discovery of innate psychological mechanisms” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 278–9). By sharply distinguishing between adaptive behavior and the cognitive mechanisms that are adaptations for producing adaptive behavior, Evolutionary Psychologists provide “the missing link between evolutionary theory and manifest behavior” (Tooby and Cosmides 1989, 37). [The drawback is that things become more complicated since "it is less easy to sustain claims that a trait is a product of natural selection than claims that it confers reproductive benefits on individuals in contemporary populations" (Caro and Borgerhoff Mulder 1987, 66). Section 2b shows how Evolutionary Psychologists try to cope with this difficulty, and section 5a discusses a version of evolutionary psychology that focuses on adaptive behavior.]

We quite often do things detrimental to survival and reproduction (we use contraceptives, consume unhealthy doses of fatty food, and blow ourselves up in the middle of crowded market places). We also willfully refrain from doing things that would be conducive to survival (buy some healthy food, exercise) or boost our potential for reproduction (donate our sperm or eggs to cryobanks). If Evolutionary Psychology is right that our mind contains cognitive mechanisms that are adaptations for producing adaptive behavior, then why are we behaving maladaptively so often?

The claim that the brain is an adaptation for producing adaptive behavior does not entail that it is currently producing adaptive behavior. Adaptations are traits that are present today because of the selective advantage they offered in the past, and the past environment arguably differed notably from the current one. The modern metropolis in which we live in unprecedented large groups, consume fast food and use contraceptives is not even 100 years old, and even agriculture arose only some 10,000 years ago. Compared to this, our ancestors spent an unimaginably long time in Pleistocene conditions (roughly, the period spanning 1.8 million years ago to 10,000 years ago) living in small nomadic hunter-gatherer bands. The cognitive mechanisms produced by natural selection are adaptations for producing adaptive behavior in these circumstances, not for playing chess, passing logic exams, navigating through lower Manhattan, or keeping ideal weight in an environment full of fast food restaurants. [Which is why we are so bad at these things: "it is highly unlikely that the cognitive architecture of the human mind includes procedures that are dedicated to solving any of these problems: The ability to solve them would not have enhanced the survival or reproduction of the average Pleistocene hunter-gatherer" and hence "the performance of modern humans on such tasks is generally poor and uneven" (Cosmides and Tooby 1994, 95).]

Among the day-to-day problems of our ancestors that shaped the human mind are: “giving birth, winning social support from band members, remembering the locations of edible plants, hitting game animals with projectiles, …, recognizing emotional expressions, protecting family members, maintaining mating relationships, …, assessing the character of self and others, causing impregnation, acquiring language, maintaining friendships, thwarting antagonists, and so on” (Cosmides and Tooby 2003, 59). In these areas, we still behave the way we do because our behavior is guided by cognitive mechanisms that have been selected for because they produced behavior that was adaptive in our ancestors’ evolutionary environment. As Evolutionary Psychologists colorfully put it: “Our modern skulls house a Stone Age mind” (Cosmides and Tooby 1997, 85).

It is thus crucial to distinguish between a trait’s being an adaptation and its being adaptive. A trait is an adaptation if it was “designed” by natural selection to solve the specific problems posed by the regularities of the physical, chemical, ecological, informational, and social environments encountered by the ancestors of a species during the course of its evolution” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990b, 383), while a trait is adaptive if it currently enhances its bearer’s fitness. Since the environment in which a trait was selected for may differ from the current one, “[t]he hypothesis that a trait is an adaptation does not imply that the trait is currently adaptive” (Symons 1990, 430). But if cognitive adaptations can neither be discovered in the brain, nor by observing current human behavior, how can they be studied?

b. Functional Analysis

Verifying the claim that a trait is an adaptation is difficult because this is essentially a historical claim. A trait is an adaptation because it was adaptive in the past, and it is unclear what the past was like, let alone what would have been adaptive under past conditions. According to Evolutionary Psychology, however, it is possible to verify adaptationist claims:

Researchers can identify an aspect of an organism’s physical, developmental, or psychological structure … as an adaptation by showing that (1) it has many design features that are improbably well suited to solving an ancestral adaptive problem, (2) these phenotypic properties are unlikely to have arisen by chance alone, and (3) they are not better explained as the by-product of mechanisms designed to solve some alternative adaptive problem or some more inclusive class of adaptive problem. Finding that a reliably developing feature of the species’ architecture solves an adaptive problem with reliability, precision, efficiency, and economy is prima facie evidence that an adaptation has been located. (Tooby and Cosmides 2005, 28)

What Tooby and Cosmides suggest is a procedure known as functional analysis. One uses evolutionary reasoning to identify the adaptive problems our ancestors presumably awaited in their evolutionary environment, infers from this the cognitive mechanisms that one thinks must have evolved to solve these problems, conducts psychological experiments to show that they are actually found in current human beings, and rules out alternative explanations.

A bit more precisely, identifying adaptations by means of functional analysis proceeds in six steps (Tooby and Cosmides 1989, 40–1):

Step 1 uses evolutionary considerations to formulate a model of the past adaptive problems the human mind had to solve.

Step 2 generates hypotheses about exactly how these problems would have manifested themselves under the selection pressures present in the evolutionary environment of our ancestors.

Step 3 formulates a “computational theory” that specifies “a catalog of the specific information processing problems” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 289) that had to be solved to overcome the adaptive problems identified in step 2.

Step 4 uses the computational theory “as a heuristic for generating testable hypotheses about the structure of the cognitive programs that solve the adaptive problems in question” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 302).

Step 5 rules out alternative accounts of the cognitive mechanisms in question that do not treat them as the result of evolution by natural selection.

Step 6 tests the adaptationist hypotheses by checking whether modern Homo sapiens indeed possess the cognitive mechanisms postulated in step 4. If this test is successful, Evolutionary Psychologists contend, it is quite likely that the cognitive mechanisms are indeed adaptations for solving the problems identified in step 1. (For examples of empirical research that, by and large, follow this theoretical framework, see section 3.)

(One may add a seventh step which tries to discover the neural basis of the cognitive mechanisms, so that eventually theories of adaptive problems guide the search for the cognitive mechanisms that solve them, while knowing what cognitive mechanisms exist in turn guides the search for their neural basis.)

The procedure of functional analysis shows what sort of evidence would support the claim that a cognitive mechanism is an adaptation for solving a given adaptive problem. However, since functional analysis itself relies on hypotheses about the adaptive problems prevalent in our ancestors’ past, the obvious question is: How can we today know with any certainty which adaptive problems our ancestors faced?

c. The Environment of Evolutionary Adaptedness

Since the “description of ancestral conditions is one indispensable aspect of characterizing an adaptation” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990b, 387), discovering the mind’s modules requires knowing what exactly the environment that Bowlby (1969) calls the environment of evolutionary adaptedness (EEA) looked like. The human EEA consists in the set of environmental conditions encountered by human populations during the Pleistocene (from 1.8 million years ago to 10,000 years ago), when early hominids lived on the savannahs of eastern Africa as hunter-gatherers. Yet, the EEA “is not a place or a habitat, or even a time period. Rather, it is a statistical composite of the adaptation-relevant properties of the ancestral environments encountered by members of ancestral populations, weighted by their frequency and fitness consequences” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990b, 386–7). More specifically, it is a “composite of environmental properties of the most recent segment of a species’ evolution that encompasses the period during which its modern collection of adaptations assumed their present form” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990b, 388). Importantly, “different adaptations will have different EEAs. Some, like language, are firmly anchored in approximately the last two million years; others, such as infant attachment, reflect a much lengthier evolutionary history” (Durrant and Ellis 2003, 10). Speaking about the EEA is thus at least misleading, since strictly speaking one has to distinguish between the EEA of a species and the EEA of particular cognitive adaptations.

There are two crucial questions with regard to the EEA: First, why suppose that our cognitive mechanisms, even if they are adaptations, are adaptations to exactly the problems faced by our ancestors in the EEA? Second, how can we today determine the EEA of a particular adaptation in enough detail?

Evolutionary Psychologists offer two related arguments in response to the first question. The first draws attention to the large amount of time our ancestors spent in Pleistocene conditions compared to the brief stretch of time that has passed since the advent of agriculture or industrialization: “Our species spent over 99% of its evolutionary history as hunter-gatherers in Pleistocene environments. Human psychological mechanisms should be adapted to those environments, not necessarily to the twentieth-century industrialized world” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 280). The second argument maintains that since natural selection is a slow process, there just have not been enough generations for it to design new cognitive mechanisms that are well-adapted to our post-agricultural industrial life: “It is no more plausible to believe that whole new mental organs could evolve since the Pleistocene … than it is to believe that whole new physical organs such as eyes would evolve over brief spans. … [and] major and intricate changes in innately specified information-processing procedures present in human psychological mechanisms do not seem likely to have taken place over brief spans of historical time” (Tooby and Cosmides 1989, 34).

Both arguments seem to suffer from the same difficulty. The 10,000 years that have passed since the Pleistocene correspond to roughly 400 generations, and if the selection pressure and the heritability (roughly, a measure of the response to selection) are high enough, quite a lot can happen in 400 generations. In particular, no one needs to hold that “whole new mental organs could evolve since the Pleistocene.” In order to undermine the claim that we are walking fossils with Stone Age minds in our heads, it is sufficient to show that significant changes can occur within 400 generations. The same observation threatens the first argument: How much time our ancestors spent in one environment as compared to another is completely irrelevant, if the selection pressures in one differ radically from those in the other.

In response to the second question, Evolutionary Psychologists point out that, first, we can be relatively sure that the physical conditions were comparable to the ones today—”an enormous number of factors, from the properties of light to chemical laws to the existence of parasites, have stably endured” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990b, 390)—and, second, we can be relatively certain on paleontological grounds that a great deal of our ancestors spend a great deal of their time on African savannahs as hunter-gatherers. Yet, since it is in response to the social problems faced by our ancestors that our cognitive adaptations are said to have evolved, what matters is not so much the physical environment (which may have stayed constant, by and large) but the social environment, and the question is what we can know with any certainty about the social life of our ancestors, given that social traits do not fossilize.

Evolutionary Psychologists contend that with regard to the social environment little has changed, too: our ancestors arguably had to attract and retain mates, provide care for their children, understand the intentions and emotions of those with whom they engaged in social exchange, and so forth, just as we do. However, such general knowledge about the EEA seems to be of little use, for discovering cognitive adaptations requires formulating a computational theory that provides “a catalog of the specific information processing problems” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 289; italics added), and that goes significantly beyond being told that our ancestors had to find mates, care for children, find food and so forth (for more on this see section 4c).

d. Domain-specificity and Modularity

Empiricism in philosophy, behaviorism in psychology and the rules and representation approach to artificial cognitive systems characteristic of GOFAI (“good old fashioned artificial intelligence”), roughly speaking, shared the belief that our mind contains only a few domain-general cognitive mechanisms that account for everything we can learn, be it speaking and understanding a language, solving algebra equations, playing chess or driving a bike. In contrast, Evolutionary Psychologists insist that “[f]rom an evolutionary perspective, the human cognitive architecture is far more likely to resemble a confederation of hundreds or thousands of functionally dedicated computers … than it is to resemble a single general purpose computer equipped with a small number of domain-general procedures” (Tooby and Cosmides 2000, 1171).

Evolutionary Psychologists have advanced three arguments for this modularity, or massive modularity, hypothesis. In short, a domain-general psychological architecture cannot guide behavior in ways that promote fitness for at least three related reasons:

  1. What counts as fit behavior differs from domain to domain, so there is no domain-general criterion of success or failure that correlates with fitness.
  2. Adaptive courses of action can be neither deduced nor learned by general criteria, because they depend on statistical relationships between features of the environment, behavior, and fitness that emerge over many generations and are, therefore, not observable during a single lifetime.
  3. Combinatorial explosion paralyzes any truly domain-general system when encountering real-world complexity. (Cosmides and Tooby 1994, 91)

Simply put, the idea behind the first argument is that “[t]here is no such thing as a ‘general problem solver’ because there is no such thing as a general problem” (Symons 1992, 142). Our ancestors faced a host of different adaptive problems, and “different adaptive problems frequently have different optimal solutions” (Cosmides and Tooby 1991, 500): what counts as a successful solution to one, say choosing a mate, arguably differs from what counts as a successful solution to another, say choosing nutritious food. Hence, there is no domain-general criterion of success or failure: “A woman who used the same taste preference mechanisms in choosing a mate that she used to choose nutritious foods would choose a very strange mate indeed, and such a design would rapidly select itself out” (Cosmides and Tooby 1994, 90). Hence, because different solutions can be implemented only by different, functionally distinct mechanisms, there must be as many domain-specific subsystems as there are domains in which the definitions of successful behavior differ. “The human mind … is composed of many different programs for the same reason that a carpenter’s toolbox contains many different tools: Different problems require different solutions” (Tooby and Cosmides 2000, 1168). In response to this argument, the critics have pointed out that there is no reason why a cognitive system that relies on a few domain-general mechanisms that are fed with innate domain-specific information should not be as good as a modular cognitive architecture (see, for example, Samuels 1998, 587).

According to the second argument, a domain general decision rule such as “Do that which maximizes your inclusive fitness” cannot efficiently guide behavior because whether or not a behavior is fitness enhancing is something an individual often cannot find out within its own lifetime, given that the fitness impact of a design feature relative to alternative designs “is inherently unobservable at the time the design alternative actually impacts the world, and therefore cannot function as a cue for a decision rule” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990b, 417). As Buss has put it: “the relevant fitness information only becomes known generations later and hence is not accessible to individual actors” (Buss 1995, 10). For instance, whether one should prefer fatty food over vegetables, or whether one should decide to have children with potential partner A or with rival B are behavioral decisions whose impact on one’s fitness clearly cannot be learned empirically at the time these decisions have to be made. While in the former case, it may help to have a look at what others are doing, that strategy is of no avail in the latter case. And even in the former case the appeal to the possibility of learning from others only pushes the problem one step further because “[i]mitation is useless unless those imitated have themselves solved the problem of the adaptive regulation of behavior” (Cosmides and Tooby 1987, 295).

As Ermer et al. (2007) have put the point, the problem for domain-general cognitive architectures is that we are living in “clueless environments”:

Content-free architectures are limited to knowing what can be validly derived by general processes from perceptual information available during an individual’s lifetime. This sharply limits the range of problems they can solve: When the environment is clueless, the mechanism will be, too. Domain-specific mechanisms are not limited in this way. They can be constructed to embody clues that fill in the blanks when perceptual evidence is lacking or difficult to obtain (Ermer et al. 2007, 157).

At this point, a natural question to ask for the critic would be how natural selection is supposed to operate if “relevant fitness information” is indeed not available. As Buss puts it: would the result of a really “clueless environment” not be extinction, rather than adaptation?

Cosmides and Tooby’s third argument for the claim that domain-general systems could not live up to the tasks our mind regularly solves concerns the general computational problems faced by such systems. As they put it, a domain-general architecture “is defined by what it lacks: It lacks any content, either in the form of domain-specific knowledge or domain-specific procedures, that can guide it toward the solution of an adaptive problem” (Cosmides and Tooby 1994, 94). Therefore, they argue, a domain-general system must evaluate all alternatives it can define, and this raises an obvious problem: “Permutations being what they are, alternatives increase exponentially as the problem complexity increases. By the time you analyze any biological problem of routine complexity, a mechanism that contains no domain-specific rules of relevance, procedural knowledge, or privileged hypotheses could not solve the problem in the amount of time the organism has to solve it” (Cosmides and Tooby 1994, 94). Given that a specialization-free architecture contains no rules of relevance, or domain-specialized procedural knowledge, to restrict its search of a problem space, it could not solve any biological problem of routine complexity in time.

These theoretical considerations (see Samuels 1998 and Buller 2005, ch. 4 for criticism), together with the empirical support for the modularity hypothesis that comes from cognitive science (see section 1b), have led Evolutionary Psychologists to the conclusion that “the mind is organized into modules or mental organs, each with a specialized design that makes it an expert in one area of interaction with the world” (Pinker 1997, 21). The mind is a Swiss Army knife containing evolved, functionally specialized computational devices like, for example, “face recognition systems, a language acquisition device, mindreading systems, navigation specializations, animate motion recognition, cheater detection mechanisms, and mechanisms that govern sexual attraction” (Cosmides and Tooby 2003, 63).

Although there can be little doubt that the mind is modular to some extent, it is currently a hotly debated question exactly how modular it is. Is it really massively modular in the sense that it is a collection of hundreds or thousands of modules, or is it modular in a weaker sense (see, for example, the debate between Carruthers 2006, Prinz 2006, and Samuels 2006)? Interestingly, even the most ardent advocates of Evolutionary Psychology have recently acknowledged that “[t]he mind presumably does contain a number of functionally specialized programs that are relatively content-free and domain-general,” but they have insisted that “these can regulate behavior adaptively only if they work in tandem with a bevy of content-rich, domain-specialized ones …” (Ermer et al. 2007, 156; see also Tooby and Cosmides 1998, 200).

e. Human Nature

According to Evolutionary Psychologists, since the modules of which the human mind is made up have been constantly selected for during a vast stretch of time there is ample reason to think that “human universals … exist at the level of the functionally described psychological mechanism” (Tooby and Cosmides 1989, 36; italics added). That is, the modules discovered by functional analysis constitute “an array of psychological mechanisms that is universal among Homo sapiens” (Symons 1992, 139), they are “the psychological universals that constitute human nature” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990a, 19). As a consequence, Evolutionary Psychology has the potential to discover a “human nature [that] is everywhere the same” (Tooby and Cosmides 1992, 38).

Apart from the observation that enough time has passed with constant selection pressures for our cognitive modules virtually being driven to fixation, Cosmides and Tooby have offered two arguments for the universality of our psychological adaptations (see also Buller 2005, 73–4). The first argument is more or less a plausibility argument, according to which since our bodies and our minds are both the result of evolution by natural selection, and our bodies are universal, so should be our minds:

[T]he fact that any given page out of Gray’s Anatomy describes in precise anatomical detail individual humans from around the world demonstrates the pronounced monomorphism present in complex human physiological adaptations. Although we cannot directly ‘see’ psychological adaptations …, no less could be true of them. (Tooby and Cosmides 1992, 38)

The second argument first appeared in Tooby and Cosmides (1990a), has been repeated in Tooby and Cosmides (1992) and is treated by Evolutionary Psychologists as a definite proof of universal panhuman design. In a nutshell, the argument is that since in sexual reproduction a child’s genome is a mixture of its father’s and its mother’s genes, and since cognitive adaptations are complex and thus not coded for by a single gene but require hundreds or thousands of genes to work in concert for their development, “it is improbable that all of the genes necessary for a complex adaptation would be together in the same individual if the genes coding for the components of complex adaptations varied substantially between individuals” (Tooby and Cosmides 1992, 78–9).

If there is a complex series of interdependent adaptations required to produce a sex, a behavioral strategy, or a personality type, there is only one way to ensure the necessary coordination. All of the parts of the genetic programs necessary to build the integrated design must be present when needed in every individual of a given type. The only way that the 50 genes, or 100 genes, or 1,000 genes that may be required to assemble all of the features defining a given type can rely on each other’s mutual presence is that they are all present in every individual. (Tooby and Cosmides 1990a, 45)

Evolutionary Psychologists are thus not claiming that human behavior or culture is the same everywhere. Quite obviously, there is significant behavioral and cultural diversity throughout the world. What they claim is that the genes that are required for our cognitive adaptations to develop, and thus the cognitive adaptations themselves, must be the same all over the world, although, of course, the behavior that results from them may differ (for more on this, see section 4a).

3. Examples of Empirical Research

Evolutionary Psychology has sparked an enormous amount of empirical research covering nearly any imaginable topic, including issues as diverse as language, morality, emotions, parental investment, homicide, social coercion, rape, psychopathologies, landscape preferences, spatial abilities, or pregnancy sickness (see, for example, Buss 1999, 2005; Barkow et al. 1992 for an overview).

For instance, Margie Profet (1992) has argued that pregnancy sickness—a set of symptoms like food aversion, nausea, and vomiting that some women experience during the first three months of pregnancy—is an adaptation for protecting the embryo against maternal ingestion of toxins abundant in natural foods by lowering the typical human threshold of tolerance to toxins during the period of the embryo’s maximum susceptibility to toxins. Irwin Silverman and Marion Eals (1992) have argued that from an evolutionary point of view the male advantage in spatial abilities usually found in psychological experiments does not make sense. Although hunting, the primary task of our male ancestors, clearly required spatial abilities, no less is true of gathering plants, the primary task of our female ancestors. In order to be efficient foragers, our female ancestors must have been able to encode and remember the locations of thousands of different plants. When Silverman and Eals designed spatial tests that measured subjects’ ability to recall the location of items in a complex array or objects in a room, they found that women indeed consistently recalled more objects than men did, and recalled their location more accurately.

David Buss has argued that there are major differences between males and females regarding mate choice and jealousy that are evolved responses to different selection pressures (see, for example, Buss 1992, 1994, 2000; Buss and Schmitt 1993). For instance, he reasoned that because men need to guard against cuckoldry, while women need to guard against losing their mate’s economic resources, men should be concerned more by signs of sexual infidelity than about the loss of their partner’s emotional attachment, while women should be troubled more by cues that signal emotional infidelity than by signs of sexual infidelity. Buss et al. (1992) asked males and females from the USA, Europe and Asia whether they would be more distressed by sexual or emotional infidelity:

Please think of a serious committed romantic relationship that you have had in the past, that you currently have, or that you would like to have. Imagine that you discover that the person with whom you’ve been seriously involved became interested in someone else. What would distress or upset you more (please circle only one):

(A) Imagining your partner forming a deep emotional attachment to that person.

(B) Imagining your partner enjoying passionate sexual intercourse with that other person.

(Buss et al. 1992, 252)

Nowhere did women report sexual infidelity to be more upsetting than men, and on average, 51% of the men, but only 22% of the women chose option B above (for data and critical discussion, see Buller 2005, 316–45). These results have been taken to confirm Buss’ evolutionary hypothesis about sex differences with regard to jealousy (for a dissenting view see, for example, DeSteno and Salovey 1996; Harris and Christenfeld 1996).

The flagship example of Evolutionary Psychology is still Cosmides and Tooby’s work on cheater detection. In the 1960s, the Swedish psychologist Peter Wason devised the so-called “Wason Selection Task” in order to investigate how good subjects are at checking conditional rules (Wason 1966). He gave subjects a rule of the form “If P, then Q” (for example, “If a person goes to Boston, then that person takes the subway”), and showed them four cards. Two of the cards exemplified the P- and not-P-option, respectively (for example, “Boston” and “New York”), and two of them exemplified the Q and not-Q-option, respectively (for example, “subway” and “cab”). The subjects were told that the unseen sides of the P and not-P-cards could contain an instance of either Q or not-Q, and vice versa, and that they should indicate all and only the cards that would definitely have to be turned over in order to determine whether they violated the rule. Since a material conditional is false if and only if its antecedent is true and its consequent is false, the logically correct response would be to pick the P- and the not-Q-card. However, Wason discovered that most subjects choose either only the P-card or the P- and the Q-card, while few choose the P- and the not-Q-card. More importantly, subjects’ performance was apparently influenced by the content of the rules. While 48% correctly solved the Boston/transportation problem, successful performance dropped to less then 25% for the rule “If a person has a ‘D’ rating, then his documents must be marked code ’3′” (with the options ‘D’, ‘F’, ’3′, ’7′), and increased to nearly 75% for the rule “If a person is drinking beer, then he must be over 21 years old” (with the options “drinking beer,” “drinking coke,” “25 years old,” “16 years old”) (Cosmides and Tooby 1992, 182–3). By the 1980s, the psychological literature was full with reports of such “content effects,” but there was no satisfying theory to explain them.

Evolutionary biologists had long been puzzled by our ability to engage in altruistic behavior—behavior an individual A performs for the benefit of another individual B, associated with some significant cost for A (like warning calls, help in raising offspring, saving a drowning child, and so forth). How could a tendency to behave in a way that increases another individual’s fitness at some non-negligible cost to oneself be produced and retained by natural selection? Robert Trivers (1971) argued that altruistic behavior can evolve if it is reciprocal, that is, if A‘s act a has benefit bB for B and cost cA for A, B reciprocates with some act a* with benefit bA for A and cost cB for B, where bA outweighs cA and bB outweighs cB. Interactions that satisfy this cost-benefit structure constitute what is called a “social exchange.” Since in social exchanges both A and B incur a net-benefit, Trivers reasoned, altruistic behavior can evolve. Yet, the problem is that once a propensity for altruistic behavior has evolved, it is obviously better for an individual to cheat by accepting the benefit of an altruistic act without paying the cost of reciprocation. In the long run, this would lead to an increase in the number of cheaters until altruism was driven to extinction. In order for altruism to evolve, Trivers (1971, 48) concluded, natural selection must “favor more acute abilities to detect cheating.”

Cosmides and Tooby saw a connection between the need to detect cheaters in acts of social exchange and the content effect discovered by Wason (Cosmides 1989; Cosmides and Tooby 1989, 1992). Since the ability to test abstract logical rules would not have had any adaptive value in the EEA, we should not expect natural selection to have endowed the human mind with some general conditional reasoning capacity. Rather, natural selection should have designed a module that allows us to detect those who accept the benefit without reciprocating accordingly in situations of social exchange. Consequently, we should be better at testing social contract rules that say “If person A provides the requested benefit to or meets the requirement of person or group B, then B will provide the rationed benefit to A” (Cosmides and Tooby 2000, 1260) than at testing conditional rules that do not describe such conditions.

When Cosmides and Tooby categorized “content effects according to whether they conformed to social contracts, a striking pattern emerged. Robust and replicable content effects were found only for rules that related terms that are recognizable as benefits and cost/requirements in the format of a standard social contract” (Cosmides and Tooby 1992, 183). They argued that the content effect found in Wason Selection Tasks is due to the fact that some tasks involve a social contract rule.

In order to substantiate this hypothesis, they conducted a series of experiments designed to rule out alternative explanations of the content effects. One plausible explanation, for instance, would be that our cognitive system is able to deal better and more effectively with familiar problems (like the drinking/age problem) than with unfamiliar problems (like the letter/number problem). They therefore compared performance on unfamiliar social rules with performance on unfamiliar non-social rules. If familiarity is the issue, then subjects should perform equally bad on both unfamiliar rules. If, however, the increased performance in the drinking/age problem is due to the fact that here the subjects are dealing with a social contract rule, then performance should be better on the unfamiliar social than on the unfamiliar non-social rule.

Cosmides designed two unfamiliar Wason Selection Tasks. One rule read “If a man eats cassava root, then he must have a tattoo on his face” (with the options “eats cassava root,” “eats molo nuts,” “tattoo,” “no tattoo”). The other read “If you eat duiker meat, then you have found an ostrich eggshell” (with the options “duiker,” “weasel,” “ostrich eggshell,” “quail eggshell”). The first was accompanied by a story according to which the inhabitants of a Polynesian island have strict sexual mores that prohibit sex between unmarried people and thus mark married men with a facial tattoo and do not permit unmarried men to eat cassava root, which is a very powerful aphrodisiac. The second story said that anthropologists who notice that the natives frequently say that if someone eats duiker meat, then he has found an ostrich shell hypothesize that this is because duikers often feed on ostrich shells. Thus, the first rule clearly represents a social contract—having a tattoo is the requirement one has to meet if one is being permitted the benefit of eating cassava root—while the second is a non-social rule which simply expresses the hypothesis that duikers and ostrich eggs are frequently found in close proximity.

The results confirmed the cheater detection prediction (Cosmides and Tooby 1992, 186–7): 75% correctly answered the unfamiliar social problem, but only 21% the unfamiliar non-social problem.

Cosmides also hypothesized that if there is a cheater detection module, then subjects should pick the cards that represent cheating even if they correspond to the logically incorrect answer. She thus switched the logical role of the P/not-P- and the Q/not-Q-cards in both the cassava root/tattoo and the duiker meat/ostrich shell problem. The switched rules read “If a man has a tattoo on his face, then he eats cassava root” and “If you have found an ostrich eggshell, then you eat duiker meat.” Since the not-P- and the Q-card (“no tattoo” and “eats cassava root”) still represent accepting a benefit without meeting the requirement, the cheater detection hypothesis predicts that subjects should pick the logically incorrect cards in the first case, whereas performance in the ostrich shell/duiker meat case should be unaffected. Again, the prediction was confirmed (Cosmides and Tooby 1992, 188–9): 67% of the subjects chose the logically incorrect not-P- and Q-cards in response to the switched social problem, but only 4% did so for the switched non-social problem. (For a criticism of Cosmides and Tooby’s work on cheater detection and for further references see Buller 2005, 163–90.)

4. Problems and Objections

Evolutionary Psychology is a successful research program, but it has its problems. Some difficulties have already been mentioned in section 2 in connection with the theoretical underpinnings of Evolutionary Psychology (for a recent critique of Evolutionary Psychology at a methodological and conceptual level see Panksepp and Panksepp 2000). These and a couple of others will be briefly reviewed in this section.

a. Genetic Determinism

One of the most often heard criticisms is also one of the least convincing. The charge is that Evolutionary Psychology is committed to, or at least willfully embraces, a genetic determinism according to which our behavior is determined by our genetic make-up, which, since it is a human universal, cannot be influenced by means of social learning, education, and so forth, Dorothy Nelkin (2000, 27), for instance, claims that Evolutionary Psychology implies “genetic destiny,” and Robin Dunbar maintains that it seems “to be looking for genetically determined characters that are universally valid for all humans,” observing that this makes little sense because the “number of genuinely universal traits are … likely to run to single figures at most” (Dunbar 1988, 168).

It is true that Evolutionary Psychologists are looking for human universals, and it is also true that they think that if humans were not genetically very similar, there could be no cognitive adaptations (see section 2e). Yet, they are not committed to “a form of ‘genetic determinism,’ if by that one means the idea that genes determine everything, immune from an environmental influence” (Tooby and Cosmides 1990a, 19). Their claim is that the cognitive mechanisms underlying behavior are human universals, and that does not entail that our behavior is genetically determined, or the same all over the world. Quite the contrary: It is universally agreed among Evolutionary Psychologists that behavior, like any other human trait, is the result of the complex interplay between genetic and environmental factors. Genetic determinism is false because “every feature of every phenotype is fully and equally codetermined by the interaction of the organism’s genes … and its ontogenetic environments” (Tooby and Cosmides 1992, 83; italics added), as is nicely illustrated by the fact that not even genetic clones, monozygotic twins, are phenotypically identical. In fact, work in Evolutionary Psychology has emphasized the highly flexible and contingent nature of cognitive adaptations. For instance, Martin Daly and Margo Wilson’s often cited work on violence toward children by stepparents (for example, Daly and Wilson 1988a, 1988b) is in fact entirely concerned with contextual factors—the presence of a stepparent in a household, they argue, is one of the primary predictors of fatal violence toward children.

b. Moral and Societal Issues

A related charge is that Evolutionary Psychology is defending the status quo regarding sex, race, intelligence differences, and so forth, by arguing that, first, there is nothing we can do, given that these differences are the result of our hard-wired cognitive mechanisms, and, second, there is no need to do something, because these differences, being the result of natural selection, are optimal solutions to longstanding adaptive problems.

The first claim is just wrong. As seen in section 4a, it is not “all in our genes” because the environment heavily influences what behavior issues forth from cognitive mechanisms, even if the latter are evolutionarily hard-wired.

The second claim is an instance of what many scholars would regard as the fallacious inference from “is” to “ought” (see Naturalistic Fallacy). As Robert Kurzban (2002) has pointed out, Evolutionary Psychologists are well aware that it is illegitimate to move from the first to the second, that there is a difference “between science, which can help us to understand what is, and morality, which concerns questions about what ought to be.” Regarding cognitive adaptations, one cannot infer “ought” from “is” because (1) there is no guarantee that natural selection always finds an optimal solution, (2) since the environment has changed, something that was good for our ancestors may no longer be good for us, and (3) the sense in which it was “good” for our ancestors that, say, they possessed a cognitive mechanism that pre-disposed them to kill children of their mating partners that were not their own (“good” in the sense of “fitness increasing”) is definitely not the sense of “good” that is relevant to ethical discourse (“good” in the sense of “morally praiseworthy/obligatory”).

c. Untestability and Story Telling

One of the key problems for Evolutionary Psychologists is to show that the adaptationist explanations they offer are indeed explanations properly so called and not mere “just-so-stories” that feature plausible scenarios without its being certain that they are historical fact. Stephen Jay Gould, for instance, who famously criticized evolutionary biology for its unreflected and widespread adaptationism that tends to ignore other plausible evolutionary explanations (Gould and Lewontin 1979), has argued that the sole task of Evolutionary Psychology has become “a speculative search for reasons why a behavior that harms us now must once have originated for adaptive purposes” (Gould 2000, 119).

There is something to this charge, but things are more difficult. Evolutionary Psychologists stress that “[i]t is difficult to reconcile such claims with the actual practice of EP, since in evolutionary psychology the evolutionary model or prediction typically precedes and causes the discovery of new facts, rather than being constructed post hoc to fit some known fact” (Sell et al. 2003, 52). The discussion of functional analysis in section 2b has shown that there is a clear sense in which adaptationist hypotheses can be tested: functional analysis predicts the existence of yet unknown cognitive mechanisms on the grounds of evolutionary reasoning about potential adaptive problems in the EEA, and these predictions are then empirically tested. The hypotheses Evolutionary Psychologists derive from their computational theory thus allow them “to devise experiments that make possible the detection and mapping of mechanisms that no one would otherwise have thought to test for in the absence of such theories” (Sell et al. 2003, 48). It is therefore not true that “claims about an EEA usually cannot be tested in principle but only subjected to speculation” (Gould 1997, 51) because if the purported cognitive mechanisms fail to show up in psychological experiments, the adapationist explanation is falsified.

First, however, this holds only for research that conforms to Cosmides and Tooby’s theoretical model (arguably, Cosmides and Tooby’s work on cheater detection, Buss’ work on sex differences with regard to jealousy, and Silverman and Eals’ work on differences in spatial abilities belong to this category). It does not apply to research that does not generate a prediction based on a putative problem, but tries to infer the historical function of an organism’s traits from its current structure. Profet’s work on pregnancy sickness would be a case in point: here, one already knows the trait (pregnancy sickness) and merely speculates about its historic function, in contrast to the other cases, where the existence of the trait (an ability to detect cheaters, sex specific responses to jealousy, or sex specific spatial abilities) is inferred from evolutionary considerations about the problems prevalent in the EEA.

Second, the controversial claim is not that our psychological faculties have evolved. It is that they are adaptations, and, more specifically, adaptations for solving particular adaptive problems. Successful psychological tests that show that current Homo sapiens indeed possesses the hypothesized cognitive mechanisms establish that these traits have evolved, but they fail to establish that they are adaptations, let alone adaptations for, say, detecting cheaters or remembering the location of edible plants. For all these tests tell us, the traits in question could still be exaptations, or even spandrels. In order to show that they are indeed adaptations, a point that is forcefully made by Richardson (2008), additional information would be needed, and it is not clear that this additional information can be had (for a sketch of Richardson’s argument see Walter 2009).

Third, there seems to be a sense in which adaptationist explanations are still “just-so-stories.” Functional analysis relies on claims about the nature of the EEA which cannot be directly verified because there is very little we can know with any confidence about the conditions that obtained in the EEA. As Evolutionary Psychologists like to point out, there are some things which have arguably stayed constant since the EEA:

[R]esearchers know with certainty of high confidence thousands of important things about our ancestors, many of which can be used to derive falsifiable predictions about our psychological architecture: our ancestors had two sexes; contracted infections by contact, collected plant foods; inhabited a world where the motions of objects conformed to the principles of kinematic geometry; had color vision; were predated upon; had faces; lived in a biotic environment with a hierarchical taxonomic structure, and so forth (Sell et al. 2003, 52–3).

The problem is that knowing that our ancestors inhabited a world with two sexes where the motions of objects conformed to the principles of kinematic geometry does not enable us to formulate the adaptive problems our ancestors putatively faced in enough detail. Both our male and female ancestors lived in such a world (as, by the way, did the ancestors of apes, spiders and flies), and yet they evolved different mating strategies, different responses to emotional versus sexual infidelity, different spatial abilities, and so forth. The descriptions of the past adaptive problems that Evolutionary Psychologists rely on in order to explain these differences are much more specific than the platitudes of which we can be relatively certain, and it is unclear how we could ever be confident that we got the specific details right. As Stephen Jay Gould puts it vividly:

But how can we possibly know in detail what small bands of hunter-gatherers did in Africa two million years ago? These ancestors left some tools and bones, and paleoanthropologists can make some ingenious inferences from such evidence. But how can we possibly obtain the key information that would be required to show the validity of adaptive tales about an EEA: relations of kinship, social structures and sizes of groups, different activities of males and females, the roles of religion, symbolizing, storytelling, and a hundred other central aspects of human life that cannot be traced in fossils? (Gould 1997, §31; see also Gould 2000, 120)

In the case of Buss’ research on the evolution of sex differences with regard to jealousy, for instance, we can only hypothesize about such things as group structure and size, mating structures, similarities between ancestral and current group structures, or the alleged differences in mating behavior in ancestral groups that are appealed to or presupposed in the formulation of the adaptive problem (again, a point made convincingly by Richardson 2008).

Of course, as Sell et al. (2003) point out, if our assumptions about our ancestors’ problems are wrong, our computational theory is wrong, too, and should thus predict the existence of cognitive mechanisms that will not be found when checked for empirically. Yet, even if this is so, the two qualifications above apply to this move mutatis mutandis. (For more on the role of historical evidence in the search for adaptations and the kinds of problems that may arise, see Kaplan 2002.)

d. Psychological Inadequacy

In Adapting Minds: Evolutionary Psychology and the Persistent Quest for Human Nature, David Buller argues “not only that the theoretical and methodological doctrines of Evolutionary Psychology are problematic, but that Evolutionary Psychology has not, in fact, produced any solid empirical results” (Buller 2005, 15). What is wrong with Evolutionary Psychology is that the psychological experiments used to establish the existence of the hypothesized cognitive mechanisms in current Homo sapiens are flawed because the data are exiguous, inconclusive and do not support the claims made by Evolutionary Psychologists, as Buller tries to show in detail for the classical studies of Cosmides and Tooby, Buss, and Daly and Wilson on cheater detection, mating strategies, jealousy, and discriminative parenthood. Whereas Richardson (2008) claims that Evolutionary Psychology is problematic as Evolutionary Psychology, Buller challenges the psychological credentials of evolutionary psychology, arguing that Evolutionary Psychology fails as Evolutionary Psychology.

5. Evolutionary Approaches to Mind, Culture, and Behavior: Alternatives to Evolutionary Psychology

In its broad sense, evolutionary psychology attempts to adopt “an evolutionary perspective on human behavior and psychology” (Barrett et al. 2002, 1) by applying Darwinian reasoning to behavioral, cognitive, social, or cultural characteristics of humans. Evolutionary Psychology is one strand of evolutionary psychology, but there are others, and the literature is full of different labels: “sociobiology,” “evolutionary anthropology,” “human behavioral ecology,” “Darwinian psychology,” “gene-culture coevolution,” to name just a few. These approaches share the idea that evolutionary reasoning can enhance our understanding of mind, culture, and society, but they disagree about exactly how Darwinian thinking ought to enter the picture. This is not the place to go into the details, but a brief survey of the theoretical landscape (see Laland and Brown 2002 for a book-length overview) may help to understand the difference between evolutionary psychology as a general field of inquiry and Evolutionary Psychology as a narrowly circumscribed research paradigm.

a. Human Behavioral Ecology

Evolutionary Psychologists insist that an evolutionary approach to human psychology must ask whether a trait is an adaptation, not whether it is currently adaptive. They thereby separate themselves sharply from an approach Symons (1989) dubbed “Darwinian anthropology” that instead focuses on the current adaptiveness of our behavior (for a more reconciliatory approach see, for example, Downes 2001). Human behavioral ecology, as it is nowadays called (Borgerhoff Mulder 1991), originated in the late 1970s when, after the upheaval caused by Wilson’s Sociobiology, some anthropologists decided to go out and test the controversial hypotheses of Wilson and others by means of real data from hunter-gatherer populations (Chagnon and Irons 1979; Hinde 1974). Using quantitative ethnographic information and optimality models, human behavioral ecologists investigate whether and how the current adaptiveness of an individual’s behavior is influenced by its ecological and cultural environment and in which way the different behaviors individuals develop to cope with environmental challenges lead to and account for cultural differences between them.

Natural selection, human behavioral ecologists argue, has created an extraordinary flexibility—known as phenotypic plasticity—that allows our “behavior to assume the form that maximizes inclusive fitness” (Irons 1979, 33) across a wide variety of widely diverse habitats. Since there has been selection for a general phenotypic plasticity, we are not so much “adaptation executers” as rather “fitness maximizers”: “Modern Darwinian theory predicts that human behavior will be … designed to promote maximum reproductive success” (Turke and Betzig 1985, 79; italics added). As a consequence, human behavioral ecologists are less interested in discovering proximal cognitive mechanisms than in checking whether the behavior they trigger is actually adaptive (a strategy known as phenotypic gambit).

b. Memetics

A rather different approach is adopted by memetics (Blackmore 1999; Distin 2005). Memetics tries to explain cultural characteristics and processes and the way they influence our behavior by postulating a process of cultural evolution that is analogous to the process of biological evolution, but largely independent of it. Dawkins (1976) introduced the idea that evolution by natural selection is a substrate neutral process that can act on what he called a “replicator,” that is, any heritable entity for which there is variation in a population and that is associated with different degrees of fitness. The gene, Dawkins said, is the replicator in biological evolution, but the cultural realm also has a replicator, which he famously dubbed a meme: a meme is “a unit of cultural inheritance, hypothesized as analogous to the particulate gene, and as naturally selected in virtue of its phenotypic consequences on its own survival and replication in the cultural environment” (Dawkins 1982, 290). Memes form the substrate of cultural evolution, a process in which different memes are differentially transmitted from individual to individual. One of the key challenges for memetics is to spell out exactly what memes are, and although suggestions abound, there is no agreed consensus [for instance, according to Dawkins "examples of memes are tunes, ideas, catch-phrases, clothes fashions, ways of making pots or of building arches" (Dawkins 1976, 206), while Dennett (1995, 347–8) cites the ideas of the wheel, of wearing clothes, the vendetta, the right triangle, the alphabet, chess, perspective drawing, Impressionism, Greensleeves, and deconstructionism as examples]. Importantly, whatever memes are, they must be sufficiently similar to genes to warrant the claim that cultural evolution is more or less analogous to biological evolution, and critics of memetics argue that this constraint is unlikely to be met (for example, Boyd and Richerson 2000; for a more optimistic view, see Blackmore 1999, ch. 5).

c. Gene-Culture Coevolution

Defenders of what is known as “gene-culture coevolution” or “dual inheritance theory” (Boyd and Richerson 1985, 2005a, 2005b; Cavalli-Sforza and Feldmann 1981; Durham 1991) agree with memetics that transmitted cultural information is too important a factor to be ignored by an evolutionary approach to human culture and behavior. After all, one of the most striking facts about humans is that there are important and persistent differences between human groups that are due to culturally transmitted ideas, and not to genetic, biological, or ecological factors. Yet, although culture is a Darwinian force in its own right, they argue, there is no substantial analogy between cultural and biological evolution. In both processes information is transmitted between individuals and both create patterns of heritable variation, but the differences are much more salient: culture is not based on direct replication but upon teaching, imitation, and other forms of social learning, the transmission of culture is temporally extended and not restricted to parents and their offspring, cultural evolution is not necessarily particulate, and not necessarily random (Boyd and Richerson 2000).

Culture is part of human biology, gene-culture coevolutionists argue, but accounts concerned solely with genetic factors are inadequate because they ignore the fact that culture itself shapes the adaptive environment in which biological evolution takes place by creating a culturally constructed environment in which human genes must evolve. Conversely, accounts aimed solely at explaining cultural replication are also inadequate because they ignore the fact that genes affect cultural evolution, for instance by forming psychological predispositions that bias what people imitate, teach, or are able to learn. Hence, a truly evolutionary approach to culture must acknowledge that genesand culture coevolve, and try to investigate the circumstances under which the cultural habits adopted by individuals are influenced by their genes, and how the natural selection pressures that guide biological evolution may be generated by culture.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Suggested Further Reading

  • Barkow, Jerome, Leda Cosmides, and John Tooby, eds. (1992). The Adapted Mind: Evolutionary Psychology and the Generation of Culture. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • The manifesto of Evolutionary Psychology.
  • Barrett, Louise, Robin Dunbar, and John Lycett, eds. (2002). Human Evolutionary Psychology. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • A very useful textbook of evolutionary psychology in the broad sense, covering both Evolutionary Psychology and Human Behavioral Ecology.
  • Buller, David (2005). Adapting Minds: Evolutionary Psychology and the Persistent Quest for Human Nature. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • A philosophical critique of Evolutionary Psychology, arguing that the empirical tests Evolutionary Psychologists rely on to establish that current Homo sapiens possesses the postulated cognitive adaptations in the areas of cheater detection, mating, marriage, and parenthood are flawed.
  • Buss, David (1999). Evolutionary Psychology: The New Science of the Mind. Boston: Allyn and Bacon.
    • The textbook of Evolutionary Psychology, written by one of its most ardent advocates.
  • Cosmides, Leda, and John Tooby (1992). “Cognitive Adaptations for Social Exchange.” In: The Adapted Mind: Evolutionary Psychology and the Generation of Culture. Eds. Jerome Barkow, Leda Cosmides, and John Tooby. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 163–228.
    • The classic paper on cheater detection.
  • Dawkins, Richard (1976). The Selfish Gene. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A must-read for anyone interested in evolutionary biology in general, in which Dawkins introduces the concept of the meme and defends his theory of evolution from the gene’s eye point of view (also known as the “selfish gene theory”) according to which the ultimate beneficiary of the evolutionary process is neither the species, nor the individual, nor a particular trait, but the gene.
  • Laland, Kevin, and Gillian Brown (2002). Sense or Nonsense: Evolutionary Perspectives on Human Behavior. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A highly laudable introduction to sociobiology, Evolutionary Psychology, human behavioral ecology, memetics, and gene-culture coevolution.
  • Pinker, Steven (1997). How the Mind Works. New York: Norton.
    • A very accessible introduction to Evolutionary Psychology and to the kinds of issues discussed in cognitive science in general.
  • Pinker, Steven (2002). The Blank Slate: The Modern Denial of Human Nature. New York: Penguin.
    • Another very accessible introduction to the ideas of Evolutionary Psychology, written by one of the most gifted writers in academia.
  • Richardson, Robert (2008). Evolutionary Psychology as Maladapted Psychology. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • A philosophical critique of Evolutionary Psychology from the perspective of evolutionary biology.
  • Samuels, Richard (1998). “Evolutionary Psychology and the Massive Modularity Hypothesis.” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 49, 575–602.
    • Criticizes Evolutionary Psychology’s insistence on the domain-specificity of cognitive mechanisms, arguing that a domain-general architecture that uses domain-specific information would be equally good.
  • Tooby, John, and Leda Cosmides (1990a). “On the Universality of Human Nature and the Uniqueness of the Individual: The Role of Genetics and Adaptation.” Journal of Personality, 58, 17–67.
    • Contains Cosmides and Tooby’s genetic argument (discussed in section 2e) for the claim that our cognitive adaptations are human universals.
  • Tooby, John, and Leda Cosmides (2005). “Conceptual Foundations of Evolutionary Psychology.” In: The Handbook of Evolutionary Psychology. Ed. David Buss. Hoboken, NJ: Wiley, 5–67.
    • A brief, but very valuable overview over the theoretical background of Evolutionary Psychology.
  • Wright, Robert (1994). The Moral Animal. The New Science of Evolutionary Psychology. New York: Pantheon Books.
    • A simplifying introduction to Evolutionary Psychology, written for a general audience, included here under “Suggested Readings” only to stress that it is not to be recommended at all for anyone with a serious interest in Evolutionary Psychology.

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Author Information

Author Information

Sven Walter
University of Osnabrueck

Last updated: April 13, 2009 | Originally published: