Existentialism is a catch-all term for those philosophers who consider the nature of the human condition as a key philosophical problem and who share the view that this problem is best addressed through ontology. This very broad definition will be clarified by discussing seven key themes that existentialist thinkers address. Those philosophers considered existentialists are mostly from the continent of Europe, and date from the 19th and 20th centuries. Outside philosophy, the existentialist movement is probably the most well-known philosophical movement, and at least two of its members are among the most famous philosophical personalities and widely read philosophical authors. It has certainly had considerable influence outside philosophy, for example on psychological theory and on the arts. Within philosophy, though, it is safe to say that this loose movement considered as a whole has not had a great impact, although individuals or ideas counted within it remain important. Moreover, most of the philosophers conventionally grouped under this heading either never used, or actively disavowed, the term ‘existentialist’. Even Sartre himself once said: “Existentialism? I don’t know what that is.” So, there is a case to be made that the term – insofar as it leads us to ignore what is distinctive about philosophical positions and to conflate together significantly different ideas – does more harm than good.
In this article, however, it is assumed that something sensible can be said about existentialism as a loosely defined movement. The article has three sections. First, we outline a set of themes that define, albeit very broadly, existentialist concerns. This is done with reference to the historical context of existentialism, which will help us to understand why certain philosophical problems and methods were considered so important. Second, we discuss individually six philosophers who are arguably its central figures, stressing in these discussions the ways in which these philosophers approached existentialist themes in distinctive ways. These figures, and many of the others we mention, have full length articles of their own within the Encyclopedia. Finally, we look very briefly at the influence of existentialism, especially outside philosophy.
Although a highly diverse tradition of thought, seven themes can be identified that provide some sense of overall unity. Here, these themes will be briefly introduced; they can then provide us with an intellectual framework within which to discuss exemplary figures within the history of existentialism.
Philosophy should not be thought of primarily either as an attempt to investigate and understand the self or the world, or as a special occupation that concerns only a few. Rather, philosophy must be thought of as fully integrated within life. To be sure, there may need to be professional philosophers, who develop an elaborate set of methods and concepts (Sartre makes this point frequently) but life can be lived philosophically without a technical knowledge of philosophy. Existentialist thinkers tended to identify two historical antecedents for this notion. First, the ancient Greeks, and particularly the figure of Socrates but also the Stoics and Epicureans. Socrates was not only non-professional, but in his pursuit of the good life he tended to eschew the formation of a ‘system’ or ‘theory’, and his teachings took place often in public spaces. In this, the existentialists were hardly unusual. In the 19th and 20th centuries, the rapid expansion of industrialisation and advance in technology were often seen in terms of an alienation of the human from nature or from a properly natural way of living (for example, thinkers of German and English romanticism).
The second influence on thinking of philosophy as a way of life was German Idealism after Kant. Partly as a response to the 18th century Enlightenment, and under the influence of the Neoplatonists, Schelling and Hegel both thought of philosophy as an activity that is an integral part of the history of human beings, rather than outside of life and the world, looking on. Later in the 19th century, Marx famously criticised previous philosophy by saying that the point of philosophy is not to know things – even to know things about activity – but to change them. The concept of philosophy as a way of life manifests itself in existentialist thought in a number of ways. Let us give several examples, to which we will return in the sections that follow. First, the existentialists often undertook a critique of modern life in terms of the specialisation of both manual and intellectual labour. Specialisation included philosophy. One consequence of this is that many existentialist thinkers experimented with different styles or genres of writing in order to escape the effects of this specialisation. Second, a notion that we can call ‘immanence’: philosophy studies life from the inside. For Kierkegaard, for example, the fundamental truths of my existence are not representations – not, that is, ideas, propositions or symbols the meaning of which can be separated from their origin. Rather, the truths of existence are immediately lived, felt and acted. Likewise, for Nietzsche and Heidegger, it is essential to recognise that the philosopher investigating human existence is, him or herself, an existing human. Third, the nature of life itself is a perennial existentialist concern and, more famously (in Heidegger and in Camus), also the significance of death.
A key idea here is that human existence is in some way ‘on its own’; anxiety (or anguish) is the recognition of this fact. Anxiety here has two important implications. First, most generally, many existentialists tended to stress the significance of emotions or feelings, in so far as they were presumed to have a less culturally or intellectually mediated relation to one’s individual and separate existence. This idea is found in Kierkegaard, as we mentioned above, and in Heidegger’s discussion of ‘mood’; it is also one reason why existentialism had an influence on psychology. Second, anxiety also stands for a form of existence that is recognition of being on its own. What is meant by ‘being on its own’ varies among philosophers. For example, it might mean the irrelevance (or even negative influence) of rational thought, moral values, or empirical evidence, when it comes to making fundamental decisions concerning one’s existence. As we shall see, Kierkegaard sees Hegel’s account of religion in terms of the history of absolute spirit as an exemplary confusion of faith and reason. Alternatively, it might be a more specifically theological claim: the existence of a transcendent deity is not relevant to (or is positively detrimental to) such decisions (a view broadly shared by Nietzsche and Sartre). Finally, being on its own might signify the uniqueness of human existence, and thus the fact that it cannot understand itself in terms of other kinds of existence (Heidegger and Sartre).
Related to anxiety is the concept of authenticity, which is let us say the existentialist spin on the Greek notion of ‘the good life’. As we shall see, the authentic being would be able to recognise and affirm the nature of existence (we shall shortly specify some of the aspects of this, such as absurdity and freedom). Not, though, recognise the nature of existence as an intellectual fact, disengaged from life; but rather, the authentic being lives in accordance with this nature. The notion of authenticity is sometimes seen as connected to individualism. This is only reinforced by the contrast with a theme we will discuss below, that of the ‘crowd’. Certainly, if authenticity involves ‘being on one’s own’, then there would seem to be some kind of value in celebrating and sustaining one’s difference and independence from others. However, many existentialists see individualism as a historical and cultural trend (for example Nietzsche), or dubious political value (Camus), rather than a necessary component of authentic existence. Individualism tends to obscure the particular types of collectivity that various existentialists deem important.
For many existentialists, the conditions of the modern world make authenticity especially difficult. For example, many existentialists would join other philosophers (such as the Frankfurt School) in condemning an instrumentalist conception of reason and value. The utilitarianism of Mill measured moral value and justice also in terms of the consequences of actions. Later liberalism would seek to absorb nearly all functions of political and social life under the heading of economic performance. Evaluating solely in terms of the measurable outcomes of production was seen as reinforcing the secularisation of the institutions of political, social or economic life; and reinforcing also the abandonment of any broader sense of the spiritual dimension (such an idea is found acutely in Emerson, and is akin to the concerns of Kierkegaard). Existentialists such as Martin Heidegger, Hanna Arendt or Gabriel Marcel viewed these social movements in terms of a narrowing of the possibilities of human thought to the instrumental or technological. This narrowing involved thinking of the world in terms of resources, and thinking of all human action as a making, or indeed as a machine-like ‘function’.
The next key theme is freedom. Freedom can usefully be linked to the concept of anguish, because my freedom is in part defined by the isolation of my decisions from any determination by a deity, or by previously existent values or knowledge. Many existentialists identified the 19th and 20th centuries as experiencing a crisis of values. This might be traced back to familiar reasons such as an increasingly secular society, or the rise of scientific or philosophical movements that questioned traditional accounts of value (for example Marxism or Darwinism), or the shattering experience of two world wars and the phenomenon of mass genocide. It is important to note, however, that for existentialism these historical conditions do not create the problem of anguish in the face of freedom, but merely cast it into higher relief. Likewise, freedom entails something like responsibility, for myself and for my actions. Given that my situation is one of being on its own – recognised in anxiety – then both my freedom and my responsibility are absolute. The isolation that we discussed above means that there is nothing else that acts through me, or that shoulders my responsibility. Likewise, unless human existence is to be understood as arbitrarily changing moment to moment, this freedom and responsibility must stretch across time. Thus, when I exist as an authentically free being, I assume responsibility for my whole life, for a ‘project’ or a ‘commitment’. We should note here that many of the existentialists take on a broadly Kantian notion of freedom: freedom as autonomy. This means that freedom, rather than being randomness or arbitrariness, consists in the binding of oneself to a law, but a law that is given by the self in recognition of its responsibilities. This borrowing from Kant, however, is heavily qualified by the next theme.
The next common theme we shall call ‘situatedness’. Although my freedom is absolute, it always takes place in a particular context. My body and its characteristics, my circumstances in a historical world, and my past, all weigh upon freedom. This is what makes freedom meaningful. Suppose I tried to exist as free, while pretending to be in abstraction from the situation. In that case I will have no idea what possibilities are open to me and what choices need to be made, here and now. In such a case, my freedom will be naïve or illusory. This concrete notion of freedom has its philosophical genesis in Hegel, and is generally contrasted to the pure rational freedom described by Kant. Situatedness is related to a notion we discussed above under the heading of philosophy as a way of life: the necessity of viewing or understanding life and existence from the ‘inside’. For example, many 19th century intellectuals were interested in ancient Greece, Rome, the Medieval period, or the orient, as alternative models of a less spoiled, more integrated form of life. Nietzsche, to be sure, shared these interests, but he did so not uncritically: because the human condition is characterised by being historically situated, it cannot simply turn back the clock or decide all at once to be other than it is (Sartre especially shares this view). Heidegger expresses a related point in this way: human existence cannot be abstracted from its world because being-in-the-world is part of the ontological structure of that existence. Many existentialists take my concretely individual body, and the specific type of life that my body lives, as a primary fact about me (for example, Nietzsche, Scheler or Merleau-Ponty). I must also be situated socially: each of my acts says something about how I view others but, reciprocally, each of their acts is a view about what I am. My freedom is always situated with respect to the judgements of others. This particular notion comes from Hegel’s analysis of ‘recognition’, and is found especially in Sartre, de Beauvoir and Jaspers. Situatedness in general also has an important philosophical antecedent in Marx: economic and political conditions are not contingent features with respect to universal human nature, but condition that nature from the ground up.
Although, of course, existentialism takes its name from the philosophical theme of ‘existence’, this does not entail that there is homogeneity in the manner existence is to be understood. One point on which there is agreement, though, is that the existence with which we should be concerned here is not just any existent thing, but human existence. There is thus an important difference between distinctively human existence and anything else, and human existence is not to be understood on the model of things, that is, as objects of knowledge. One might think that this is an old idea, rooted in Plato’s distinction between matter and soul, or Descartes’ between extended and thinking things. But these distinctions appear to be just differences between two types of things. Descartes in particular, however, is often criticised by the existentialists for subsuming both under the heading ‘substance’, and thus treating what is distinctive in human existence as indeed a thing or object, albeit one with different properties. (Whether the existentialist characterisation of Plato or Descartes is accurate is a different question.) The existentialists thus countered the Platonic or Cartesian conception with a model that resembles more the Aristotelian as developed in the Nichomachean Ethics. The latter idea arrives in existentialist thought filtered through Leibniz and Spinoza and the notion of a striving for existence. Equally important is the elevation of the practical above the theoretical in German Idealists. Particularly in Kant, who stressed the primacy of the ‘practical’, and then in Fichte and early Schelling, we find the notion that human existence is action. Accordingly, in Nietzsche and Sartre we find the notion that the human being is all and only what that being does. My existence consists of forever bringing myself into being – and, correlatively, fleeing from the dead, inert thing that is the totality of my past actions. Although my acts are free, I am not free not to act; thus existence is characterised also by ‘exigency’ (Marcel). For many existentialists, authentic existence involves a certain tension be recognised and lived through, but not resolved: this tension might be between the animal and the rational (important in Nietzsche) or between facticity and transcendence (Sartre and de Beauvoir).
In the 19th and 20th centuries, the human sciences (such as psychology, sociology or economics) were coming to be recognised as powerful and legitimate sciences. To some extend at least their assumptions and methods seemed to be borrowed from the natural sciences. While philosophers such as Dilthey and later Gadamer were concerned to show that the human sciences had to have a distinctive method, the existentialists were inclined to go further. The free, situated human being is not an object of knowledge in the sense the human always exists as the possibility of transcending any knowledge of it. There is a clear relation between such an idea and the notion of the ‘transcendence of the other’ found in the ethical phenomenology of Emmanuel Levinas.
Among the most famous ideas associated with existentialism is that of ‘absurdity’. Human existence might be described as ‘absurd’ in one of the following senses. First, many existentialists argued that nature as a whole has no design, no reason for existing. Although the natural world can apparently be understood by physical science or metaphysics, this might be better thought of as ‘description’ than either understanding or explanation. Thus, the achievements of the natural sciences also empty nature of value and meaning. Unlike a created cosmos, for example, we cannot expect the scientifically described cosmos to answer our questions concerning value or meaning. Moreover, such description comes at the cost of a profound falsification of nature: namely, the positing of ideal entities such as ‘laws of nature’, or the conflation of all reality under a single model of being. Human beings can and should become profoundly aware of this lack of reason and the impossibility of an immanent understanding of it. Camus, for example, argues that the basic scene of human existence is its confrontation with this mute irrationality. A second meaning of the absurd is this: my freedom will not only be undetermined by knowledge or reason, but from the point of view of the latter my freedom will even appear absurd. Absurdity is thus closely related to the theme of ‘being on its own’, which we discussed above under the heading of anxiety. Even if I choose to follow a law that I have given myself, my choice of law will appear absurd, and likewise will my continuously reaffirmed choice to follow it. Third, human existence as action is doomed to always destroy itself. A free action, once done, is no longer free; it has become an aspect of the world, a thing. The absurdity of human existence then seems to lie in the fact that in becoming myself (a free existence) I must be what I am not (a thing). If I do not face up to this absurdity, and choose to be or pretend to be thing-like, I exist inauthentically (the terms in this formulation are Sartre’s).
Existentialism generally also carries a social or political dimension. Insofar as he or she is authentic, the freedom of the human being will show a certain ‘resolution’ or ‘commitment’, and this will involve also the being – and particularly the authentic being – of others. For example, Nietzsche thus speaks of his (or Zarathustra’s) work in aiding the transformation of the human, and there is also in Nietzsche a striking analysis of the concept of friendship; for Heidegger, there must be an authentic mode of being-with others, although he does not develop this idea at length; the social and political aspect of authentic commitment is much more clear in Sartre, de Beauvoir and Camus.
That is the positive side of the social or political dimension. However, leading up to this positive side, there is a description of the typical forms that inauthentic social or political existence takes. Many existentialists employ terms such as ‘crowd’, ‘horde’ (Scheler) or the ‘masses’ (José Ortega y Gasset). Nietzsche’s deliberately provocative expression, ‘the herd’, portrays the bulk of humanity not only as animal, but as docile and domesticated animals. Notice that these are all collective terms: inauthenticity manifests itself as de-individuated or faceless. Instead of being formed authentically in freedom and anxiety, values are just accepted from others because ‘that is what everybody does’. These terms often carry a definite historical resonance, embodying a critique of specifically modern modes of human existence. All of the following might be seen as either causes or symptoms of a world that is ‘fallen’ or ‘broken’ (Marcel): the technology of mass communication (Nietzsche is particularly scathing about newspapers and journalists; in Two Ages, Kierkegaard says something very similar), empty religious observances, the specialisation of labour and social roles, urbanisation and industrialisation. The theme of the crowd poses a question also to the positive social or political dimension of existentialism: how could a collective form of existence ever be anything other than inauthentic? The 19th and 20th century presented a number of mass political ideologies which might be seen as posing a particularly challenging environment for authentic and free existence. For example, nationalism came in for criticism particularly by Nietzsche. Socialism and communism: after WWII, Sartre was certainly a communist, but even then unafraid to criticise both the French communist party and the Soviet Union for rigid or inadequately revolutionary thinking. Democracy: Aristotle in book 5 of his Politics distinguishes between democracy and ochlocracy, which latter essentially means rule by those incapable of ruling even themselves. Many existentialists would identify the latter with the American and especially French concept of ‘democracy’. Nietzsche and Ortega y Gasset both espoused a broadly aristocratic criterion for social and political leadership.
Kierkegaard was many things: philosopher, religious writer, satirist, psychologist, journalist, literary critic and generally considered the ‘father’ of existentialism. Being born (in Copenhagen) to a wealthy family enabled him to devote his life to the pursuits of his intellectual interests as well as to distancing himself from the ‘everyday man’ of his times.
Kierkegaard’s most important works are pseudonymous, written under fictional names, often very obviously fictional. The issue of pseudonymity has been variously interpreted as a literary device, a personal quirk or as an illustration of the constant tension between the philosophical truth and existential or personal truth. We have already seen that for the existentialists it is of equal importance what one says and the way in which something is said. This forms part of the attempt to return to a more authentic way of philosophising, firstly exemplified by the Greeks. In a work like Either/Or (primarily a treatise against the Hegelians) theoretical reflections are followed by reflections on how to seduce girls. The point is to stress the distance between the anonymously and logically produced truths of the logicians and the personal truths of existing individuals. Every pseudonymous author is a symbol for an existing individual and at times his very name is the key to the mysteries of his existence (like in the case of Johanes de Silentio, fictional author of Fear and Trembling, where the mystery of Abraham’s actions cannot be told, being a product of and belonging to silence).
Kierkegaard has been associated with a notion of truth as subjective (or personal); but what does this mean? The issue is linked with his notorious confrontation with the Danish Church and the academic environment of his days. Kierkegaard’s work takes place against the background of an academia dominated by Hegelian dialectics and a society which reduces the communication with the divine to the everyday observance of the ritualistic side of an institutionalized Christianity. Hegel is for Kierkegaard his arch-enemy not only because of what he writes but also what he represents. Hegel is guilty for Kierkegaard because he reduced the living truth of Christianity (the fact that God suffered and died on the Cross) to just another moment, which necessarily will be overcome, in the dialectical development of the Spirit. While Hegel treats “God” as a Begriff (a concept), for Kierkegaard the truth of Christianity signifies the very paradoxicality of faith: that is, that it is possible for the individual to go beyond the ‘ethical’ and nevertheless or rather because of this very act of disobedience to be loved by ‘God’. Famously, for Hegel ‘all that is real is rational’ – where rationality means the historically articulated, dialectical progression of Spirit – whereas for Kierkegaard the suspension of rationality is the very secret of Christianity. Against the cold logic of the Hegelian system Kierkegaard seeks “a truth which is truth for me” (Kierkegaard 1996:32). Christianity in particular represents the attempt to offer one’s life to the service of the divine. This cannot be argued, it can only be lived. While a theologian will try to argue for the validity of his positions by arguing and counter-arguing, a true Christian will try to live his life the way Jesus lived it. This evidently marks the continuation of the Hellenic idea of philosophy as a way of life, exemplified in the person of Socrates who did not write treatises, but who died for his ideas. Before the logical concepts of the theologians (in the words of Martin Heidegger who was hugely influenced by Kierkegaard) “man can neither fall to his knees in awe nor can he play music and dance before this god” (Heidegger 2002:42). The idea of ‘subjective truth’ will have serious consequences to the philosophical understanding of man. Traditionally defined as animale rationale (the rational animal) by Aristotle and for a long time worshiped as such by generations of philosophical minds, Kierkegaard comes now to redefine the human as the ‘passionate animal’. What counts in man is the intensity of his emotions and his willingness to believe (contra the once all powerful reason) in that which cannot be understood. The opening up by Kierkegaard of this terra incognita of man’s inner life will come to play a major role for later existentialists (most importantly for Nietzsche) and will bring to light the failings and the weaknesses of an over-optimistic (because modelled after the Natural sciences) model of philosophy which was taught to talk a lot concerning the ‘truth’ of the human, when all it understood about the human was a mutilated version.
In the Garden of Eden, Adam and Eve lived in a state of innocence in communication with God and in harmony with their physical environment. The expulsion from the Garden opened up a wide range of new possibilities for them and thus the problem of anxiety arose. Adam (the Hebrew word for man) is now free to determine through his actions the route of things. Naturally, there is a tension here. The human, created in God’s image, is an infinite being. Like God he also can choose and act according to his will. Simultaneously, though, he is a finite being since he is restricted by his body, particular socioeconomic conditions and so forth. This tension between the finite and infinite is the source of anxiety. But unlike a Hegelian analysis, Kierkegaard does not look for a way out from anxiety; on the contrary he stresses its positive role in the flourishing of the human. As he characteristically puts it: “Because he is a synthesis, he can be in anxiety; and the more profoundly he is in anxiety, the greater is the man” (Kierkegaard 1980:154). The prioritization of anxiety as a fundamental trait of the human being is a typical existentialist move, eager to assert the positive role of emotions for human life.
Perhaps the most famous work of Kierkegaard was Fear and Trembling, a short book which exhibits many of the issues raised by him throughout his career. Fear and Trembling retells the story of the attempted sacrifice of Isaac by his father Abraham. God tells Abraham that in order to prove his faith he has to sacrifice his only son. Abraham obeys, but at the last moment God intervenes and saves Isaac. What is the moral of the story? According to our moral beliefs, shouldn’t Abraham refuse to execute God’s vicious plan? Isn’t one of the fundamental beliefs of Christianity the respect to the life of other? The answer is naturally affirmative. Abraham should refuse God, and he should respect the ethical law. Then Abraham would be in a good relation with the Law itself as in the expression ‘a law abiding citizen’. On the contrary what Abraham tries to achieve is a personal relation with the author of the moral law. This author is neither a symbolic figure nor an abstract idea; he is someone with a name. The name of ’God’ is the unpronounceable Tetragrammaton (YHVE), the unpronounceability indicates the simultaneous closeness and distance of the great Other. The Christian God then, the author of the moral law at his will suspends the law and demands his unlawful wish be obeyed. Jacques Derrida notes that the temptation is now for Abraham the ethical law itself (Derrida 1998:162): he must resist ethics, this is the mad logic of God. The story naturally raises many problems. Is not such a subjectivist model of truth and religion plainly dangerous? What if someone was to support his acts of violence as a command of God? Kierkegaard’s response would be to suggest that it is only because Abraham loved Isaac with all his heart that the sacrifice could take place. “He must love Isaac with his whole soul….only then can he sacrifice him” (Kierkegaard 1983:74). Abraham’s faith is proved by the strength of his love for his son. However, this doesn’t fully answer the question of legitimacy, even if we agree that Abraham believed that God loved him so that he would somehow spare him. Kierkegaard also differentiates between the act of Abraham and the act of a tragic hero (like Agamemnon sacrificing his daughter Iphigenia). The tragic hero’s act is a product of calculation. What is better to do? What would be more beneficial? Abraham stands away from all sorts of calculations, he stands alone, that is, free in front of the horror religiosus, the price and the reward of faith.
“I know my lot. Some day my name will be linked to the memory of something monstrous, of a crisis as yet unprecedented on earth…” (Nietzsche 2007:88). Remarkably, what in 1888 sounded like megalomania came some years later to be realized. The name ‘Nietzsche’ has been linked with an array of historical events, philosophical concepts and widespread popular legends. Above all, Nietzsche has managed somehow to associate his name with the turmoil of a crisis. For a while this crisis was linked to the events of WWII. The exploitation of his teaching by the Nazi ideologues (notably Alfred Rosenberg and Alfred Baeumler), although utterly misdirected, arguably had its source in Nietzsche’s own “aristocratic radicalism”. More generally, the crisis refers to the prospect of a future lacking of any meaning. This is a common theme for all the existentialists to be sure. The prospect of millennia of nihilism (the devaluation of the highest values) inaugurates for Nietzsche the era in which the human itself, for the first time in its history, is called to give meaning both to its own existence and to the existence of the world. This is an event of a cataclysmic magnitude, from now on there are neither guidelines to be followed, lighthouses to direct us, and no right answers but only experiments to be conducted with unknown results.
Many existentialists, in their attempt to differentiate the value of individual existence from the alienating effects of the masses, formed an uneasy relation with the value of the ‘everyday man’. The ‘common’ man was thought to be lacking in will, taste in matter of aesthetics, and individuality in the sense that the assertion of his existence comes exclusively from his participation in larger groups and from the ‘herd’ mentality with which these groups infuse their members. Nietzsche believed that men in society are divided and ordered according to their willingness and capacity to participate in a life of spiritual and cultural transformation. Certainly not everyone wishes this participation and Nietzsche’s condemnation of those unwilling to challenge their fundamental beliefs is harsh; however it would be a mistake to suggest that Nietzsche thought their presence dispensable. In various aphorisms he stresses the importance of the ‘common’ as a necessary prerequisite for both the growth and the value of the ‘exceptional’. Such an idea clashes with our ‘modern’ sensitivities (themselves a product of a particular training). However, one has to recognize that there are no philosophers without presuppositions, and that Nietzsche’s insistence on the value of the exceptional marks his own beginning and his own understanding of the mission of thought.
Despite the dubious politics that the crisis of meaning gave rise to, the crisis itself is only an after-effect of a larger and deeper challenge that Nietzsche’s work identifies and poses. For Nietzsche the crisis of meaning is inextricably linked to the crisis of religious consciousness in the West. Whereas for Kierkegaard the problem of meaning was to be resolved through the individual’s relation to the Divine, for Nietzsche the militantly anti-Christian, the problem of meaning is rendered possible at all because of the demise of the Divine. As he explains in The Genealogy of Morality, it is only after the cultivation of truth as a value by the priest that truth comes to question its own value and function. What truth discovers is that at the ground of all truth lies an unquestionable faith in the value of truth. Christianity is destroyed when it is pushed to tell the truth about itself, when the illusions of the old ideals are revealed. What is called ‘The death of God’ is also then the death of truth (though not of the value of truthfulness); this is an event of immense consequences for the future.
But one has to be careful here. Generations of readers, by concentrating on the event of the actual announcement of the ‘death of God’, have completely missed madman’s woeful mourning which follows the announcement. “‘Where is God?’ he cried; ‘I‘ll tell you! We have killed him – you and I! We are all his murderers. But how did we do this? How were we able to drink up the sea? Who gave us the sponge to wipe away the entire horizon? What were we doing when we unchained this earth from its sun? Where is it moving? Where are we moving to? Away from all suns?” (Nietzsche 2001:125). The above sentences are very far from constituting a cheerful declaration: no one is happy here! Nietzsche’s atheism has nothing to do with the naive atheism of others (for example Sartre) who rush to affirm their freedom as if their petty individuality were able to fill the vast empty space left by the absence of God. Nietzsche is not naive and because he is not naive he is rather pessimistic. What the death of God really announces is the demise of the human as we know it. One has to think of this break in the history of the human in Kantian terms. Kant famously described Enlightenment as “man’s emergence from his self-incurred immaturity” (Kant 1991:54). Similarly Nietzsche believes that the demise of the divine could be the opportunity for the emergence of a being which derives the meaning of its existence from within itself and not from some authority external to it. If the meaning of the human derived from God then, with the universe empty, man cannot take the place of the absent God. This empty space can only be filled by something greater and fuller, which in the Nietzschean jargon means the greatest unity of contradictory forces. That is the Übermensch (Overhuman) which for Nietzsche signifies the attempt towards the cultural production of a human being which will be aware of his dual descent – from animality and from rationality – without prioritizing either one, but keeping them in an agonistic balance so that through struggle new and exciting forms of human existence can be born.
Nietzsche was by training a Klassische Philologe (the rough equivalent Anglosaxon would be an expert in classics – the texts of the ancient Greek and Roman authors). Perhaps because of his close acquaintance with the ancient writers, he became sensitive to a quite different understanding of philosophical thinking to that of his contemporaries. For the Greeks, philosophical questioning takes place within the perspective of a certain choice of life. There is no ‘life’ and then quite separately the theoretical (theoria: from thea – view, and horan – to see) or ‘from a distance’ contemplation of phenomena. Philosophical speculation is the result of a certain way of life and the attempted justification of this life. Interestingly Kant encapsulates this attitude in the following passage: “When will you finally begin to live virtuously?’ said Plato to an old man who told him he was attending classes on virtue. The point is not always to speculate, but also ultimately to think about applying our knowledge. Today, however, he who lives in conformity with what he teaches is taken for a dreamer” (Kant in Hadot 2002:xiii). We have to understand Nietzsche’s relation to philosophy within this context not only because it illustrates a stylistically different contemplation but because it demonstrates an altogether different way of philosophizing. Thus in Twilight of the Idols Nietzsche accuses philosophers for their ‘Egyptism’, the fact that they turn everything into a concept under evaluation. “All that philosophers have been handling for thousands of years is conceptual mummies; nothing real has ever left their hands alive” (Nietzsche 1998:16). Philosophical concepts are valuable insofar as they serve a flourishing life, not as academic exercises. Under the new model of philosophy the old metaphysical and moral questions are to be replaced by new questions concerning history, genealogy, environmental conditions and so forth. Let us take a characteristic passage from 1888: “I am interested in a question on which the ‘salvation of humanity’ depends more than on any curio of the theologians: the question of nutrition. For ease of use, one can put it in the following terms: ‘how do you personally have to nourish yourself in order to attain your maximum of strength, of virtù in the Renaissance style, of moraline-free virtue?” (Nietzsche 2007:19).
What is Nietzsche telling us here? Two things: firstly that, following the tradition of Spinoza, the movement from transcendence to immanence passes through the rehabilitation of the body. To say that, however, does not imply a simple-minded materialism. When Spinoza tells “nobody as yet has determined the limits of the body’s capabilities” (Spinoza 2002: 280) he is not writing about something like bodily strength but to the possibility of an emergence of a body liberated from the sedimentation of culture and memory. This archetypical body is indeed as yet unknown and we stand in ignorance of its abilities. The second thing that Nietzsche is telling us in the above passage is that this new immanent philosophy necessarily requires a new ethics. One has to be clear here because of the many misunderstandings of Nietzschean ethics. Nietzsche is primarily a philosopher of ethics but ethics here refers to the possible justification of a way of life, which way of life in turn justifies human existence on earth. For Nietzsche, ethics does not refer to moral codes and guidelines on how to live one’s life. Morality, which Nietzsche rejects, refers to the obsessive need (a need or an instinct can also be learned according to Nietzsche) of the human to preserve its own species and to regard its species as higher than the other animals. In short morality is arrogant. A Nietzschean ethics is an ethics of modesty. It places the human back where it belongs, among the other animals. However to say that is not to equate the human with the animal. Unlike non-human animals men are products of history that is to say products of memory. That is their burden and their responsibility.
In the Genealogy of Morality Nietzsche explains morality as a system aiming at the taming of the human animal. Morality’s aim is the elimination of the creative power of animal instincts and the establishment of a life protected within the cocoon of ascetic ideals. These ‘ideals’ are all those values and ideologies made to protect man against the danger of nihilism, the state in which man finds no answer to the question of his existence. Morality clings to the preservation of the species ‘man’; morality stubbornly denies the very possibility of an open-ended future for humans. If we could summarize Nietzsche’s philosophical anthropology in a few words, we would say that for Nietzsche it is necessary to attempt (there are no guarantees here) to think of the human not as an end-in-itself but only as a means to something “…perfect, completely finished, happy, powerful, triumphant, that still leaves something to fear!” (Nietzsche 2007:25).
Heidegger exercised an unparalleled influence on modern thought. Without knowledge of his work recent developments in modern European philosophy (Sartre, Gadamer, Arendt, Marcuse, Derrida, Foucault et al.) simply do not make sense. He remains notorious for his involvement with National Socialism in the 1930s. Outside European philosophy, Heidegger is only occasionally taken seriously, and is sometimes actually ridiculed (famously the Oxford philosopher A.J. Ayer called him a ‘charlatan’).
In 1945 in Paris Jean-Paul Sartre gave a public lecture with the title ‘Existentialism is a Humanism’ where he defended the priority of action and the position that it is a man’s actions which define his humanity. In 1946, Jean Beaufret in a letter to Heidegger poses a number of questions concerning the link between humanism and the recent developments of existentialist philosophy in France. Heidegger’s response is a letter to Beaufret which in 1947 is published in a book form with the title ‘Letter on Humanism’. There he repudiates any possible connection of his philosophy with the existentialism of Sartre. The question for us here is the following: Is it possible, given Heidegger’s own repudiation of existentialism, still to characterise Heidegger’s philosophy as ‘existentialist’? The answer here is that Heidegger can be classified as an existentialist thinker despite all his differences from Sartre. Our strategy is to stress Heidegger’s connection with some key existentialist concerns, which we introduced above under the labels ‘Existence’, ‘Anxiety’ and the ‘Crowd’.
We have seen above that a principle concern of all existentialists was to affirm the priority of individual existence and to stress that human existence is to be investigated with methods other than those of the natural sciences. This is also one of Heidegger’s principle concerns. His magnum opus Being and Time is an investigation into the meaning of Being as that manifests itself through the human being, Dasein. The sciences have repeatedly asked ‘What is a man?’ ‘What is a car?’ ‘What is an emotion?’ they have nevertheless failed – and because of the nature of science, had to fail – to ask the question which grounds all those other questions. This question is what is the meaning of (that) Being which is not an entity (like other beings, for example a chair, a car, a rock) and yet through it entities have meaning at all? Investigating the question of the meaning of Being we discover that it arises only because it is made possible by the human being which poses the question. Dasein has already a (pre-conceptual) understanding of Being because it is the place where Being manifests itself. Unlike the traditional understanding of the human as a hypokeimenon (Aristotle) – what through the filtering of Greek thought by the Romans becomes substantia, that which supports all entities and qualities as their base and their ground – Dasein refers to the way which human beings are. ”The essence of Dasein lies in its existence” (Heidegger 1962: 67) and the existence of Dasein is not fixed like the existence of a substance is. This is why human beings locate a place which nevertheless remains unstable and unfixed. The virtual place that Dasein occupies is not empty. It is filled with beings which ontologically structure the very possibility of Dasein. Dasein exists as in-the-world. World is not something separate from Dasein; rather, Dasein cannot be understood outside the referential totality which constitutes it. Heidegger repeats here a familiar existentialist pattern regarding the situatedness of experience.
Sartre, by contrast, comes from the tradition of Descartes and to this tradition remains faithful. From Heidegger’s perspective, Sartre’s strategy of affirming the priority of existence over essence is a by-product of the tradition of Renaissance humanism which wishes to assert the importance of man as the highest and most splendid of finite beings. Sartrean existence refers to the fact that a human is whereas Heidegger’s ek-sistence refers to the way with which Dasein is thrown into a world of referential relations and as such Dasein is claimed by Being to guard its truth. Sartre, following Descartes, thinks of the human as a substance producing or sustaining entities, Heidegger on the contrary thinks of the human as a passivity which accepts the call of Being. “Man is not the lord of beings. Man is the shepherd of Being” (Heidegger 1993:245). The Heideggerian priority then is Being, and Dasein’s importance lies in its receptiveness to the call of Being.
For Kierkegaard anxiety defines the possibility of responsibility, the exodus of man from the innocence of Eden and his participation to history. But the birthplace of anxiety is the experience of nothingness, the state in which every entity is experienced as withdrawn from its functionality. “Nothing … gives birth to anxiety” (Kierkegaard 1980:41). In anxiety we do not fear something in particular but we experience the terror of a vacuum in which is existence is thrown. Existentialist thinkers are interested in anxiety because anxiety individualizes one (it is when I feel Angst more than everything that I come face to face with my own individual existence as distinct from all other entities around me). Heidegger thinks that one of the fundamental ways with which Dasein understands itself in the world is through an array of ‘moods’. Dasein always ‘finds itself’ (befinden sich) in a certain mood. Man is not a thinking thing de-associated from the world, as in Cartesian metaphysics, but a being which finds itself in various moods such as anxiety or boredom. For the Existentialists, primarily and for the most part I don’t exist because I think (recall Descartes’ famous formula) but because my moods reveal to me fundamental truths of my existence. Like Kierkegaard, Heidegger also believes that anxiety is born out of the terror of nothingness. “The obstinacy of the ‘nothing and nowhere within-the-world’ means as a phenomenon that the world as such is that in the face of which one has anxiety” (Heidegger 1962:231). For Kierkegaard the possibility of anxiety reveals man’s dual nature and because of this duality man can be saved. “If a human being were a beast or an angel, he could not be in anxiety. Because he is a synthesis, he can be in anxiety; and the more profoundly he is in anxiety, the greater is the man” (Kierkegaard 1980:155). Equally for Heidegger anxiety manifests Dasein’s possibility to live an authentic existence since it realizes that the crowd of ‘others’ (what Heidegger calls the ‘They’) cannot offer any consolation to the drama of existence.
In this article we have discussed the ambiguous or at times downright critical attitude of many existentialists toward the uncritical and unreflecting masses of people who, in a wholly anti-Kantian and thus also anti-Enlightenment move, locate the meaning of their existence in an external authority. They thus give up their (purported) autonomy as rational beings. For Heidegger, Dasein for the most part lives inauthentically in that Dasein is absorbed in a way of life produced by others, not by Dasein itself. “We take pleasure and enjoy ourselves as they [man] take pleasure; we read, see and judge about literature and art as they see and judge…” (Heidegger 1962:164). To be sure this mode of existence, the ‘They’ (Das Man) is one of the existentialia, it is an a priori condition of possibility of the Dasein which means that inauthenticity is inscribed into the mode of being of Dasein, it does not come from the outside as a bad influence which could be erased. Heidegger’s language is ambiguous on the problem of inauthenticity and the reader has to make his mind on the status of the ‘They’. A lot has been said on the possible connections of Heidegger’s philosophy with his political engagements. Although it is always a risky business to read the works of great philosophers as political manifestos, it seems prima facie evident that Heidegger’s thought in this area deserves the close investigation it has received.
Heidegger was a highly original thinker. His project was nothing less than the overcoming of Western metaphysics through the positing of the forgotten question of being. He stands in a critical relation to past philosophers but simultaneously he is heavily indebted to them, much more than he would like to admit. This is not to question his originality, it is to recognize that thought is not an ex nihilo production; it comes as a response to things past, and aims towards what is made possible through that past.
In the public consciousness, at least, Sartre must surely be the central figure of existentialism. All the themes that we introduced above come together in his work. With the possible exception of Nietzsche, his writings are the most widely anthologised (especially the lovely, if oversimplifying, lecture ‘Existentialism and Humanism’) and his literary works are widely read (especially the novel Nausea) or performed. Although uncomfortable in the limelight, he was nevertheless the very model of a public intellectual, writing hundreds of short pieces for public dissemination and taking resolutely independent and often controversial stands on major political events. His writings that are most clearly existentialist in character date from Sartre’s early and middle period, primarily the 1930s and 1940s. From the 1950s onwards, Sartre moved his existentialism towards a philosophy the purpose of which was to understand the possibility of a genuinely revolutionary politics.
Sartre was in his late 20s when he first encountered phenomenology, specifically the philosophical ideas of Edmund Husserl. (We should point out that Heidegger was also deeply influenced by Husserl, but it is less obvious in the language he employs because he drops the language of consciousness and acts.) Of particular importance, Sartre thought, was Husserl’s notion of intentionality. In Sartre’s interpretation of this idea, consciousness is not to be identified with a thing (for example a mind, soul or brain), that is to say some kind of a repository of ideas and images of things. Rather, consciousness is nothing but a directedness towards things. Sartre found a nice way to sum up the notion of the intentional object: If I love her, I love her because she is lovable (Sartre 1970:4-5). Within my experience, her lovableness is not an aspect of my image of her, rather it is a feature of her (and ultimately a part of the world) towards which my consciousness directs itself. The things I notice about her (her smile, her laugh) are not originally neutral, and then I interpret the idea of them as ‘lovely’, they are aspects of her as lovable. The notion that consciousness is not a thing is vital to Sartre. Indeed, consciousness is primarily to be characterised as nothing: it is first and foremost not that which it is conscious of. (Sartre calls human existence the ‘for-itself’, and the being of things the ‘in-itself’.) Because it is not a thing, it is not subject to the laws of things; specifically, it is not part of a chain of causes and its identity is not akin to that of a substance. Above we suggested that a concern with the nature of existence, and more particularly a concern with the distinctive nature of human existence, are defining existentialist themes.
Moreover, qua consciousness, and not a thing that is part of the causal chain, I am free. From moment to moment, my every action is mine alone to choose. I will of course have a past ‘me’ that cannot be dispensed with; this is part of my ‘situation’. However, again, I am first and foremost not my situation. Thus, at every moment I choose whether to continue on that life path, or to be something else. Thus, my existence (the mere fact that I am) is prior to my essence (what I make of myself through my free choices). I am thus utterly responsible for myself. If my act is not simply whatever happens to come to mind, then my action may embody a more general principle of action. This principle too is one that I must have freely chosen and committed myself to. It is an image of the type of life that I believe has value. (In these ways, Sartre intersects with the broadly Kantian account of freedom which we introduced above in our thematic section.) As situated, I also find myself surrounded by such images – from religion, culture, politics or morality – but none compels my freedom. (All these forces that seek to appropriate my freedom by objectifying me form Sartre’s version of the crowd theme.) I exist as freedom, primarily characterised as not determined, so my continuing existence requires the ever renewed exercise of freedom (thus, in our thematic discussion above, the notion from Spinoza and Leibniz of existence as a striving-to-exist). Thus also, my non-existence, and the non-existence of everything I believe in, is only a free choice away. I (in the sense of an authentic human existence) am not what I ‘am’ (the past I have accumulated, the things that surround me, or the way that others view me). I am alone in my responsibility; my existence, relative to everything external that might give it meaning, is absurd. Face to face with such responsibility, I feel ‘anxiety’. Notice that although Sartre’s account of situatedness owes much to Nietzsche and Heidegger, he sees it primarily in terms of what gives human freedom its meaning and its burden. Nietzsche and Heidegger, in contrast, view such a conception of freedom as naively metaphysical.
Suppose, however, that at some point I am conscious of myself in a thing-like way. For example, I say ‘I am a student’ (treating myself as having a fixed, thing-like identity) or ‘I had no choice’ (treating myself as belonging to the causal chain). I am ascribing a fixed identity or set of qualities to myself, much as I would say ‘that is a piece of granite’. In that case I am existing in denial of my distinctively human mode of existence; I am fleeing from my freedom. This is inauthenticity or ‘bad faith’. As we shall see, inauthenticity is not just an occasional pitfall of human life, but essential to it. Human existence is a constant falling away from an authentic recognition of its freedom. Sartre here thus echoes the notion in Heidegger than inauthenticity is a condition of possibility of human existence.
Intentionality manifests itself in another important way. Rarely if ever am I simply observing the world; instead I am involved in wanting to do something, I have a goal or purpose. Here, intentional consciousness is not a static directedness towards things, but is rather an active projection towards the future. Suppose that I undertake as my project marrying my beloved. This is an intentional relation to a future state of affairs. As free, I commit myself to this project and must reaffirm that commitment at every moment. It is part of my life project, the image of human life that I offer to myself and to others as something of value. Notice, however, that my project involves inauthenticity. I project myself into the future where I will be married to her – that is, I define myself as ‘married’, as if I were a fixed being. Thus there is an essential tension to all projection. On the one hand, the mere fact that I project myself into the future is emblematic of my freedom; only a radically free consciousness can project itself. I exist as projecting towards the future which, again, I am not. Thus, I am (in the sense of an authentic self) what I am not (because my projecting is always underway towards the future). On the other hand, in projecting I am projecting myself as something, that is, as a thing that no longer projects, has no future, is not free. Every action, then, is both an expression of freedom and also a snare of freedom. Projection is absurd: I seek to become the impossible object, for-itself-in-itself, a thing that is both free and a mere thing. Born of this tension is a recognition of freedom, what it entails, and its essential fragility. Thus, once again, we encounter existential anxiety. (In this article, we have not stressed the importance of the concept of time for existentialism, but it should not be overlooked: witness one of Nietzsche’s most famous concepts (eternal recurrence) and the title of Heidegger’s major early work (Being and Time).)
In my intentional directedness towards my beloved I find her ‘loveable’. This too, though, is an objectification. Within my intentional gaze, she is loveable in much the same way that granite is hard or heavy. Insofar as I am in love, then, I seek to deny her freedom. Insofar, however, as I wish to be loved by her, then she must be free to choose me as her beloved. If she is free, she escapes my love; if not, she cannot love. It is in these terms that Sartre analyses love in Part Three of Being and Nothingness. Love here is a case study in the basic forms of social relation. Sartre is thus moving from an entirely individualistic frame of reference (my self, my freedom and my projects) towards a consideration of the self in concrete relations with others. Sartre is working through – in a way he would shortly see as being inadequate – the issues presented by the Hegelian dialectic of recognition, which we mentioned above. This ‘hell’ of endlessly circling acts of freedom and objectification is brilliantly dramatised in Sartre’s play No Exit.
A few years later at the end of the 1940s, Sartre wrote what has been published as Notebooks for an Ethics. Sartre (influenced in the meantime by the criticisms of Merleau-Ponty and de Beauvoir, and by his increasing commitment to collectivist politics) elaborated greatly his existentialist account of relations with others, taking the Hegelian idea more seriously. He no longer thinks of concrete relations so pessimistically. While Nietzsche and Heidegger both suggest the possibility of an authentic being with others, both leave it seriously under-developed. For our purposes, there are two key ideas in the Notebooks. The first is that my projects can be realised only with the cooperation of others; however, that cooperation presupposes their freedom (I cannot make her love me), and their judgements about me must concern me. Therefore permitting and nurturing the freedom of others must be a central part of all my projects. Sartre thus commits himself against any political, social or economic forms of subjugation. Second, there is the possibility of a form of social organisation and action in which each individual freely gives him or herself over to a joint project: a ‘city of ends’ (this is a reworking of Kant’s idea of the ‘kingdom of ends’, found in the Grounding for the Metaphysics of Morals). An authentic existence, for Sartre, therefore means two things. First, it is something like a ‘style’ of existing – one that at every moment is anxious, and that means fully aware of the absurdity and fragility of its freedom. Second, though, there is some minimal level of content to any authentic project: whatever else my project is, it must also be a project of freedom, for myself and for others.
Simone de Beauvoir was the youngest student ever to pass the demanding agrégation at the prestigious École Normale Supérieure. Subsequently a star Normalienne, she was a writer, philosopher, feminist, lifelong partner of Jean-Paul Sartre, notorious for her anti-bourgeois way of living and her free sexual relationships which included among others a passionate affair with the American writer Nelson Algren. Much ink has been spilled debating whether de Beauvoir’s work constitutes a body of independent philosophical work, or is a reformulation of Sartre’s work. The debate rests of course upon the fundamental misconception that wants a body of work to exist and develop independently of (or uninfluenced by) its intellectual environment. Such ‘objectivity’ is not only impossible but also undesirable: such a body of work would be ultimately irrelevant since it would be non-communicable. So the question of de Beauvoir’s ‘independence’ could be dismissed here as irrelevant to the philosophical questions that her work raises.
In 1943 Being and Nothingness, the groundwork of the Existentialist movement in France was published. There Sartre gave an account of freedom as ontological constitutive of the subject. One cannot but be free: this is the kernel of the Sartrean conception of freedom. In 1945 Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of Perception is published. There, as well as in an essay from the same year titled ‘The war has taken place’, Merleau-Ponty heavily criticizes the Sartrean stand, criticising it as a reformulation of basic Stoic tenets. One cannot assume freedom in isolation from the freedom of others. Action is participatory: “…my freedom is interwoven with that of others by way of the world” (Merleau-Ponty in Stewart 1995:315). Moreover action takes place within a certain historical context. For Merleau-Ponty the subjective free-will is always in a dialectical relationship with its historical context. In 1947 Simone de Beauvoir’s Ethics of Ambiguity is published. The book is an introduction to existentialism but also a subtle critique of Sartre’s position on freedom, and a partial extension of existentialism towards the social. Although de Beauvoir will echo Merleau-Ponty’s criticism regarding the essential interrelation of the subjects, nevertheless she will leave unstressed the importance that the social context plays in the explication of moral problems. Like Sartre it is only later in her life that this will be acknowledged. In any case, de Beauvoir’s book precipitates in turn a major rethink on Sartre’s part, and the result is the Notebooks for an Ethics.
In Ethics of Ambiguity de Beauvoir offers a picture of the human subject as constantly oscillating between facticity and transcendence. Whereas the human is always already restricted by the brute facts of his existence, nevertheless it always aspires to overcome its situation, to choose its freedom and thus to create itself. This tension must be considered positive, and not restrictive of action. It is exactly because the ontology of the human is a battleground of antithetical movements (a view consistent with de Beauvoir’s Hegelianism) that the subject must produce an ethics which will be continuous with its ontological core. The term for this tension is ambiguity. Ambiguity is not a quality of the human as substance, but a characterisation of human existence. We are ambiguous beings destined to throw ourselves into the future while simultaneously it is our very own existence that throws us back into facticity. That is to say, back to the brute fact that we are in a sense always already destined to fail – not in this or that particular project but to fail as pure and sustained transcendence. It is exactly because of (and through) this fundamental failure that we realize that our ethical relation to the world cannot be self-referential but must pass through the realization of the common destiny of the human as a failed and interrelated being.
De Beauvoir, unlike Sartre, was a scholarly reader of Hegel. Her position on an existential ethics is thus more heavily influenced by Hegel’s view in the Phenomenology of Spirit concerning the moment of recognition (Hegel 1977:111). There Hegel describes the movement in which self-consciousness produces itself by positing another would be self-consciousness, not as a mute object (Gegen-stand) but as itself self-consciousness. The Hegelian movement remains one of the most fascinating moments in the history of philosophy since it is for the first time that the constitution of the self does not take place from within the self (as happens with Descartes, for whom the only truth is the truth of my existence; or Leibniz, for whom the monads are ‘windowless’; or Fichte, for whom the ‘I’ is absolutely self-constitutive) but from the outside. It is, Hegel tells us, only because someone else recognizes me as a subject that I can be constituted as such. Outside the moment of recognition there is no self-consciousness. De Beauvoir takes to heart the Hegelian lesson and tries to formulate an ethics from it.
What would this ethics be? As in Nietzsche, ethics refers to a way of life (a βίος), as opposed to morality which concerns approved or condemned behaviour. Thus there are no recipes for ethics. Drawn from Hegel’s moment of recognition, de Beauvoir acknowledges that the possibility of human flourishing is based firstly upon the recognition of the existence of the other (“Man can find a justification of his own existence only in the existence of the other men” (Beauvoir 1976:72) and secondly on the recognition that my own flourishing (or my ability to pose projects, in the language of existentialists) passes through the possibility of a common flourishing. “Only the freedom of others keeps each one of us from hardening in the absurdity of facticity,” (Beauvoir 1976:71) de Beauvoir writes; or again “To will oneself free is also to will others free” (Beauvoir 1976:73). The Ethics of Ambiguity ends by declaring the necessity of assuming one’s freedom and the assertion that it is only through action that freedom makes itself possible. This is not a point to be taken light-heartedly. It constitutes a movement of opposition against a long tradition of philosophy understanding itself as theoria: the disinterested contemplation on the nature of the human and the world. De Beauvoir, in common with most existentialists, understands philosophy as praxis: involved action in the world and participation in the course of history. It is out of this understanding that The Second Sex is born.
In 1949 Le Deuxième Sexe is published in France. In English in 1953 it appeared as The Second Sex in an abridged translation. The book immediately became a best seller and later a founding text of Second Wave Feminism (the feminist movement from the early 60’s to the 70’s inspired by the civil rights movement and focusing at the theoretical examination of the concepts of equality, inequality, the role of family, justice and so forth). More than anything, The Second Sex constitutes a study in applied existentialism where the abstract concept ‘Woman’ gives way to the examination of the lives of everyday persons struggling against oppression and humiliation. When de Beauvoir says that there is no such thing as a ‘Woman’ we have to hear the echo of the Kierkegaardian assertion of the single individual against the abstractions of Hegelian philosophy, or similarly Sartre’s insistence on the necessity of the prioritization of the personal lives of self-creating people (what Sartre calls ‘existence’) as opposed to a pre-established ideal of what humans should be like (what Sartre calls ‘essence’). The Second Sex is an exemplary text showing how a philosophical movement can have real, tangible effects on the lives of many people, and is a magnificent exercise in what philosophy could be.
“I hesitated a long time before writing a book on woman. The subject is irritating, especially for women…” (Beauvoir 2009:3). The Second Sex begins with the most obvious (but rarely posed) question: What is woman? De Beauvoir finds that at present there is no answer to that question. The reason is that tradition has always thought of woman as the other of man. It is only man that constitutes himself as a subject (as the Absolute de Beauvoir says), and woman defines herself only through him. “She determines and differentiates herself in relation to man, and he does not in relation to her; she is the inessential in front of the essential…” (Beauvoir 2009:6). But why is it that woman has initially accepted or tolerated this process whereby she becomes the other of man? De Beauvoir does not give a consoling answer; on the contrary, by turning to Sartre’s notion of bad faith (which refers to the human being’s anxiety in front of the responsibility entailed by the realization of its radical freedom) she thinks that women at times are complicit to their situation. It is indeed easier for one – anyone – to assume the role of an object (for example a housewife ‘kept’ by her husband) than to take responsibility for creating him or herself and creating the possibilities of freedom for others. Naturally the condition of bad faith is not always the case. Often women found themselves in a sociocultural environment which denied them the very possibility of personal flourishing (as happens with most of the major religious communities). A further problem that women face is that of understanding themselves as a unity which would enable them to assume the role of their choosing. “Proletarians say ‘we’. So do blacks” (Beauvoir 2009:8). By saying ‘we’ they assume the role of the subject and turn everyone else into ‘other’. Women are unable to utter this ‘we’. “They live dispersed among men, tied by homes, work, economic interests and social conditions to certain men – fathers or husbands – more closely than to other women. As bourgeois women, they are in solidarity with bourgeois men and not with women proletarians; as white women, they are in solidarity with white men and not with black women” (Beauvoir 2009:9). Women primarily align themselves to their class or race and not to other women. The female identity is “very much bound up with the identity of the men around them…” (Reynolds 2006:145).
One of the most celebrated moments in The Second Sex is the much quoted phrase: “One is not born, but rather becomes, woman” (Beauvoir 2009:293). She explains: “No biological, physical or economic destiny defines the figure that the human female takes on in society; it is civilization as a whole that elaborates this intermediary product between the male and the eunuch that is called feminine” (Beauvoir 2009:293). For some feminists this clearly inaugurates the problematic of the sex-gender distinction (where sex denotes the biological identity of the person and gender the cultural attribution of properties to the sexed body). Simply put, there is absolutely nothing that determines the ‘assumed’ femininity of the woman (how a woman acts, feels, behaves) – everything that we have come to think as ‘feminine’ is a social construction not a natural given. Later feminists like Monique Wittig and Judith Butler will argue that ‘sex’ is already ‘gender’ in the sense that a sexed body exists always already within a cultural nexus that defines it. Thus the sex assignment (a doctor pronouncing the sex of the baby) is a naturalized (but not at all natural) normative claim which delivers the human into a world of power relations.
Albert Camus was a French intellectual, writer and journalist. His multifaceted work as well as his ambivalent relation to both philosophy and existentialism makes every attempt to classify him a rather risky operation. A recipient of the 1957 Nobel Prize for Literature primarily for his novels, he is also known as a philosopher due to his non-literary work and his relation with Jean-Paul Sartre. And yet his response was clear: “I am not a philosopher, because I don’t believe in reason enough to believe in a system. What interests me is knowing how we must behave, and more precisely, how to behave when one does not believe in God or reason” (Camus in Sherman 2009: 1). The issue is not just about the label ‘existentialist’. It rather points to a deep tension within the current of thought of all thinkers associated with existentialism. The question is: With how many voices can thought speak? As we have already seen, the thinkers of existentialism often deployed more than one. Almost all of them share a deep suspicion to a philosophy operating within reason as conceived of by the Enlightenment. Camus shares this suspicion and his so called philosophy of the absurd intends to set limits to the overambitions of Western rationality. Reason is absurd in that it believes that it can explain the totality of the human experience whereas it is exactly its inability for explanation that, for example, a moment of fall designates. Thus in his novel “The Fall” the protagonist’s tumultuous narrative reveals the overtaking of a life of superficial regularity by the forces of darkness and irrationality. “A bourgeois hell, inhabited of course by bad dreams” (Camus 2006:10). In a similar fashion Camus has also repudiated his connection with existentialism. “Non, je ne suis pas existentialist” is the title of a famous interview that he gave for the magazine Les Nouvelles Littéraires on the 15 of November, 1945. The truth of the matter is that Camus’ rejection of existentialism is directed more toward Sartre’s version of it rather than toward a dismissal of the main problems that the existential thinkers faced. Particularly, Camus was worried that Sartre’s deification of history (Sartre’s proclaimed Marxism) would be incompatible with the affirmation of personal freedom. Camus accuses Hegel (subsequently Marx himself) of reducing man to history and thus denying man the possibility of creating his own history, that is, affirming his freedom.
Philosophically, Camus is known for his conception of the absurd. Perhaps we should clarify from the very beginning what the absurd is not. The absurd is not nihilism. For Camus the acceptance of the absurd does not lead to nihilism (according to Nietzsche nihilism denotes the state in which the highest values devalue themselves) or to inertia, but rather to their opposite: to action and participation. The notion of the absurd signifies the space which opens up between, on the one hand, man’s need for intelligibility and, on the other hand, ‘the unreasonable silence of the world’ as he beautifully puts it. In a world devoid of God, eternal truths or any other guiding principle, how could man bear the responsibility of a meaning-giving activity? The absurd man, like an astronaut looking at the earth from above, wonders whether a philosophical system, a religion or a political ideology is able to make the world respond to the questioning of man, or rather whether all human constructions are nothing but the excessive face-paint of a clown which is there to cover his sadness. This terrible suspicion haunts the absurd man. In one of the most memorable openings of a non-fictional book he states: “There is but one truly serious philosophical problem and that is suicide. Judging whether life is or is not worth living amounts to answering the fundamental question of philosophy. All the rest – whether or not the world has three dimensions, whether the mind has nine or twelve categories – comes afterwards. These are games; one must first answer” (Camus 2000:11). The problem of suicide (a deeply personal problem) manifests the exigency of a meaning-giving response. Indeed for Camus a suicidal response to the problem of meaning would be the confirmation that the absurd has taken over man’s inner life. It would mean that man is not any more an animal going after answers, in accordance with some inner drive that leads him to act in order to endow the world with meaning. The suicide has become but a passive recipient of the muteness of the world. “…The absurd … is simultaneously awareness and rejection of death” (Camus 2000:54). One has to be aware of death – because it is precisely the realization of man’s mortality that pushes someone to strive for answers – and one has ultimately to reject death – that is, reject suicide as well as the living death of inertia and inaction. At the end one has to keep the absurd alive, as Camus says. But what does it that mean?
In The Myth of Sisyphus Camus tells the story of the mythical Sisyphus who was condemned by the Gods to ceaselessly roll a rock to the top of a mountain and then have to let it fall back again of its own weight. “Sisyphus, proletarian of the gods, powerless and rebellious, knows the whole extent of his wretched condition: it is what he thinks of during his descent. The lucidity that was to constitute his torture at the same time crowns his victory. There is no fate that cannot be surmounted by scorn” (Camus 2000:109). One must imagine then Sisyphus victorious: fate and absurdity have been overcome by a joyful contempt. Scorn is the appropriate response in the face of the absurd; another name for this ‘scorn’ though would be artistic creation. When Camus says: “One does not discover the absurd without being tempted to write a manual of happiness” (Camus 2000:110) he writes about a moment of exhilarated madness, which is the moment of the genesis of the artistic work. Madness, but nevertheless profound – think of the function of the Fool in Shakespeare’s King Lear as the one who reveals to the king the most profound truths through play, mimicry and songs. Such madness can overcome the absurd without cancelling it altogether.
Almost ten years after the publication of The Myth of Sisyphus Camus publishes his second major philosophical work, The Rebel (1951). Camus continues the problematic which had begun with The Myth of Sisyphus. Previously, revolt or creation had been considered the necessary response to the absurdity of existence. Here, Camus goes on to examine the nature of rebellion and its multiple manifestations in history. In The Myth of Sisyphus, in truly Nietzschean fashion, Camus had said: “There is but one useful action, that of remaking man and the earth” (Camus 2000:31). However, in The Rebel, reminiscent of Orwell’s Animal Farm, one of the first points he makes is the following: “The slave starts by begging for justice and ends by wanting to wear a crown. He too wants to dominate” (Camus 2000b:31). The problem is that while man genuinely rebels against both unfair social conditions and, as Camus says, against the whole of creation, nevertheless in the practical administration of such revolution, man comes to deny the humanity of the other in an attempt to impose his own individuality. Take for example the case of the infamous Marquis de Sade which Camus explores. In Sade, contradictory forces are at work (see The 120 Days of Sodom). On the one hand, Sade wishes the establishment of a (certainly mad) community with desire as the ultimate master, and on the other hand this very desire consumes itself and all the subjects who stand in its way.
Camus goes on to examine historical manifestations of rebellion, the most prominent case being that of the French Revolution. Camus argues that the revolution ended up taking the place of the transcendent values which it sought to abolish. An all-powerful notion of justice now takes the place formerly inhabited by God. Rousseau’s infamous suggestion that under the rule of ‘general will’ everyone would be ‘forced to be free’ (Rousseau in Foley 2008:61) opens the way to the crimes committed after the revolution. Camus fears that all revolutions end with the re-establishment of the State. “…Seventeen eighty-nine brings Napoleon; 1848 Napoleon III; 1917 Stalin; the Italian disturbances of the twenties, Mussolini; the Weimar Republic, Hitler” (Camus 2000b:146). Camus is led to examine the Marxist view of history as a possible response to the failed attempts at the establishment of a true revolutionary regime. Camus examines the similarities between the Christian and the Marxist conception of history. They both exhibit a bourgeois preoccupation with progress. In the name of the future everything can be justified: “the future is the only kind of property that the masters willingly concede to the slaves” (Camus 2000b:162). History according to both views is the linear progress from a set beginning to a definite end (the metaphysical salvation of man or the materialistic salvation of him in the future Communist society). Influenced by Kojève’s reading of Hegel, Camus interprets this future, classless society as the ‘end of history’. The ‘end of history’ suggests that when all contradictions cease then history itself will come to an end. This is, Camus argues, essentially nihilistic: history, in effect, accepts that meaning creation is no longer possible and commits suicide. Because historical revolutions are for the most part nihilistic movements, Camus suggests that it is the making-absolute of the values of the revolution that necessarily lead to their negation. On the contrary a relative conception of these values will be able to sustain a community of free individuals who have not forgotten that every historical rebellion has begun by affirming a proto-value (that of human solidarity) upon which every other value can be based.
In the field of visual arts existentialism exercised an enormous influence, most obviously on the movement of Expressionism. Expressionism began in Germany at the beginning of the 20th century. With its emphasis on subjective experience, Angst and intense emotionality, German expressionism sought to go beyond the naiveté of realist representation and to deal with the anguish of the modern man (exemplified in the terrible experiences of WWI). Many of the artists of Expressionism read Nietzsche intensively and following Nietzsche’s suggestion for a transvaluation of values experimented with alternative lifestyles. Erich Heckel’s woodcut “Friedrich Nietzsche” from 1905 is a powerful reminder of the movement’s connection to Existentialist thought. Abstract expressionism (which included artists such as de Kooning and Pollock, and theorists such as Rosenberg) continued with some of the same themes in the United States from the 1940s and tended to embrace existentialism as one of its intellectual guides, especially after Sartre’s US lecture tour in 1946 and a production of No Exit in New York.
German Expressionism was particularly important during the birth of the new art of cinema. Perhaps the closest cinematic work to Existentialist concerns remains F.W. Murnau’s The Last Laugh (1924) in which the constantly moving camera (which prefigures the ‘rule’ of the hand-held camera of the Danish Dogma 95) attempts to arrest the spiritual anguish of a man who suddenly finds himself in a meaningless world. Expressionism became a world-wide style within cinema, especially as film directors like Lang fled Germany and ended up in Hollywood. Jean Genet’s Un chant d’amour (1950) is a moving poetic exploration of desire. In the sordid, claustrophobic cells of a prison the inmates’ craving for intimacy takes place against the background of an unavoidable despair for existence itself. European directors such as Bergman and Godard are often associated with existentialist themes. Godard’s Vivre sa vie (My Life to Live, 1962) is explicit in its exploration of the nature of freedom under conditions of extreme social and personal pressure. In the late 20th and early 21st centuries existentialist ideas became common in mainstream cinema, pervading the work of writers and directors such as Woody Allen, Richard Linklater, Charlie Kaufman and Christopher Nolan.
Given that Sartre and Camus were both prominent novelists and playwrights, the influence of existentialism on literature is not surprising. However, the influence was also the other way. Novelists such as Dostoevsky or Kafka, and the dramatist Ibsen, were often cited by mid-century existentialists as important precedents, right along with Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Dostoevsky creates a character Ivan Karamazov (in The Brothers Karamazov, 1880) who holds the view that if God is dead, then everything is permitted; both Nietzsche and Sartre discuss Dostoevsky with enthusiasm. Within drama, the theatre of the absurd and most obviously Beckett were influenced by existentialist ideas; later playwrights such as Albee, Pinter and Stoppard continue this tradition.
One of the key figures of 20th century psychology, Sigmund Freud, was indebted to Nietzsche especially for his analysis of the role of psychology within culture and history, and for his view of cultural artefacts such as drama or music as ‘unconscious’ documentations of psychological tensions. But a more explicit taking up of existentialist themes is found in the broad ‘existentialist psychotherapy’ movement. A common theme within this otherwise very diverse group is that previous psychology misunderstood the fundamental nature of the human and especially its relation to others and to acts of meaning-giving; thus also, previous psychology had misunderstood what a ‘healthy’ attitude to self, others and meaning might be. Key figures here include Swiss psychologists Ludwig Binswanger and later Menard Boss, both of who were enthusiastic readers of Heidegger; the Austrian Frankl, who invented the method of logotherapy; in England, Laing and Cooper, who were explicitly influenced by Sartre; and in the United States, Rollo May, who stresses the ineradicable importance of anxiety.
As a whole, existentialism has had relatively little direct influence within philosophy. In Germany, existentialism (and especially Heidegger) was criticised for being obscure, abstract or even mystical in nature. This criticism was made especially by Adorno in The Jargon of Authenticity, and in Dog Years, novelist Gunter Grass gives a Voltaire-like, savage satire of Heidegger. The criticism was echoed by many in the analytic tradition. Heidegger and the existentialist were also taken to task for paying insufficient attention to social and political structures or values, with dangerous results. In France, philosophers like Sartre were criticised by those newly under the influence of structuralism for paying insufficient attention to the nature of language and to impersonal structures of meaning. In short, philosophy moved on, and in different directions. Individual philosophers remain influential, however: Nietzsche and Heidegger in particular are very much ‘live’ topics in philosophy, even in the 21st century.
However, there are some less direct influences that remain important. Let us raise three examples. Both the issue of freedom in relation to situation, and that of the philosophical significance of what otherwise might appear to be extraneous contextual factors, remain key, albeit in dramatically altered formulation, within the work of Michel Foucault or Alain Badiou, two figures central to late 20th century European thought. Likewise, the philosophical importance that the existentialists placed upon emotion has been influential, legitimising a whole domain of philosophical research even by philosophers who have no interest in existentialism. Similarly, existentialism was a philosophy that insisted philosophy could and should deal very directly with ‘real world’ topics such as sex, death or crime, topics that had most frequently been approached abstractly within the philosophical tradition. Mary Warnock wrote on existentialism and especially Sartre, for example, while also having an incredibly important and public role within recent applied ethics.
Last updated: September 17, 2011 | Originally published: