Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Theories of Explanation

Within the philosophy of science there have been competing ideas about what an explanation is. Historically, explanation has been associated with causation: to explain an event or phenomenon is to identify its cause. But with the growth and development of philosophy of science in the 20th century, the concept of explanation began to receive more rigorous and specific analysis. Of particular concern were theories that posited the existence of unobservable entities and processes (atoms, fields, genes, and so forth). These posed a dilemma: on the one hand, the staunch empiricist had to reject unobservable entities as a matter of principle; on the other, theories that appealed to unobservable entities were clearly producing revolutionary results. Thus philosophers of science sought some way to characterize the obvious value of these theories without abandoning the empiricist principles deemed central to scientific rationality.

A theory of explanation might treat explanations in either a realist or an epistemic (that is, anti-realist) sense. A realist interpretation of explanation holds that the entities or processes an explanation posits actually exist--the explanation is a literal description of external reality. An epistemic interpretation, on the contrary, holds that such entities or processes do not necessarily exist in any literal sense but are simply useful for organizing human experience and the results of scientific experiments--the point of an explanation is only to facilitate the construction of a consistent empirical model, not to furnish a literal description of reality. Thus Hempel's epistemic theory of explanation deals only in logical form, making no mention of any actual physical connection between the phenomenon to be explained and the facts purported to explain it, whereas Salmon's realist account emphasizes that real processes and entities are conceptually necessary for understanding exactly why an explanation works.

In contrast to these theoretical and primarily scientific approaches, some philosophers have favored a theory of explanation grounded in the way people actually perform explanation. Ordinary Language Philosophy stresses the communicative or linguistic aspect of an explanation, its utility in answering questions and furthering understanding between two individuals, while an approach based in cognitive science maintains that explaining is a purely cognitive activity and that an explanation is a certain kind of mental representation that results from or aids in this activity. It is a matter of contention within cognitive science whether explanation is properly conceived as the process and results of belief revision or as the activation of patterns within a neural network.

This article focuses on the way thinking about explanation within the philosophy of science has changed since 1950. It begins by discussing the philosophical concerns that gave rise to the first theory of explanation, the deductive-nomological model. Discussions of this theory and standard criticisms of it are followed by an examination of attempts to amend, extend or replace this first model. There is particular emphasis on the most general aspects of explanation and on the extent to which later developments reflect the priorities and presuppositions of different philosophical traditions. There are many important aspects of explanation not covered, most notably the relation between the different types of explanation such as teleological, functional, reductive, psychological, and historical explanation -- that are employed in various branches of human inquiry.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Hempel's Theory of Explanation
  3. Standard Criticisms of Hempel's Theory of Explanation
  4. Contemporary Developments in the Theory of Explanation
    1. Explanation and Causal Realism
    2. Explanation and Constructive Empiricism
    3. Explanation and Ordinary Language Philosophy
    4. Explanation and Cognitive Science
    5. Explanation, Naturalism and Scientific Realism
  5. The Current State of the Theory of Explanation
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Most people, philosophers included, think of explanation in terms of causation. Very roughly, to explain an event or phenomenon is to identify its cause. The nature of causation is one of the perennial problems of philosophy, so on the basis of this connection one might reasonably attempt to trace thinking about the nature of explanation to antiquity. (Among the ancients, for example, Aristotle's theory of causation is plausibly regarded as a theory of explanation.) But the idea that the concept of explanation warrants independent analysis really did not begin to take hold until the 20th century. Generally, this change occurred as the result of the linguistic turn in philosophy. More specifically, it was the result of philosophers of science attempting to understand the nature of modern theoretical science.

Of particular concern were theories that posited the existence of unobservable entities and processes (for example, atoms, fields, genes, etc.). These posed a dilemma. On the one hand, the staunch empiricist had to reject unobservable entities as a matter of principle; on the other hand, theories that appealed to unobservables were clearly producing revolutionary results. A way was needed to characterize the obvious value of these theories without abandoning the empiricist principles deemed central to scientific rationality.

In this context it became common to distinguish between the literal truth of a theory and its power to explain observable phenomena. Although the distinction between truth and explanatory power is important, it is susceptible to multiple interpretations, and this remains a source of confusion even today. The problem is this: In philosophy the terms "truth" and "explanation" have both realist and epistemic interpretations. On a realist interpretation the truth and explanatory power of a theory are matters of the correspondence of language with an external reality. A theory that is both true and explanatory gives us insight into the causal structure of the world. On an epistemic interpretation, however, these terms express only the power of a theory to order our experience. A true and explanatory theory orders our experience to a greater degree than a false non-explanatory one. Hence, someone who denies that scientific theories are explanatory in the realist sense of the term may or may not be denying that they are explanatory in the epistemic sense. Conversely, someone who asserts that scientific theories are explanatory in the epistemic sense may or may not be claiming that they are explanatory in the realist sense. The failure to distinguish these senses of "explanation" can and does foster disagreements that are purely semantic in nature.

One common way of employing the distinction between truth and explanation is to say that theories that refer to unobservable entities may explain the phenomena, but they are not literally true. A second way is to say that these theories are true, but they do not really explain the phenomena. Although these statements are superficially contradictory, they can both be made in support of the same basic view of the nature of scientific theories. This, it is now easy to see, is because the terms 'truth' and 'explanation' are being used differently in each statement. In the first, 'explanation' is being used epistemically and 'truth' realistically; in the second, 'explanation' is being used realistically and 'truth' epistemically. But both statements are saying roughly the same thing, namely, that a scientific theory may be accepted as having a certain epistemic value without necessarily accepting that the unobservable entities it refers to actually exist. (This view is known as anti-realism.) One early 20th century philosopher scientist, Pierre Duhem, expressed himself according to the latter interpretation when he claimed:

A physical theory is not an explanation. It is a system of mathematical propositions, deduced from a small number of principles, which aim to represent as simply, as completely, and as exactly as possible a set of experimental laws. ([1906] 1962: p7)

Duhem claimed that:

To explain is to strip the reality of the appearances covering it like a veil, in order to see the bare reality itself. (op.cit.: p19)

Explanation was the task of metaphysics, not science. Science, according to Duhem, does not comprehend reality, but only gives order to appearance. However, the subsequent rise of analytic philosophy and, in particular, logical positivism made Duhem's acceptance of classical metaphysics unpopular. The conviction grew that, far from being explanatory, metaphysics was meaningless insofar as it issued claims that had no implications for experience. By the time Carl Hempel (who, as a logical positivist, was still fundamentally an anti-realist about unobservable entities) articulated the first real theory of explanation (1948) the explanatory power of science could be stipulated.

To explain the phenomena in the world of our experience, to answer the question "Why?" rather than only the question "What?", is one of the foremost objectives of all rational inquiry; and especially scientific research, in its various branches strives to go beyond a mere description of its subject matter by providing an explanation of the phenomena it investigates. (Hempel and Oppenheim 1948: p8)

For Hempel, answering the question "Why?" did not, as for Duhem, involve an appeal to a reality beyond all experience. Hempel employs the epistemic sense of explanation. For him the question "Why?" was an expression of the need to gain predictive control over our future experiences, and the value of a scientific theory was to be measured in terms of its capacity to produce this result.

2. Hempel's Theory of Explanation

According to Hempel, an explanation is:

...an argument to the effect that the phenomenon to be explained ...was to be expected in virtue of certain explanatory facts. (1965 p. 336)

Hempel claimed that there are two types of explanation, what he called 'deductive-nomological' (DN) and 'inductive-statistical' (IS) respectively." Both IS and DN arguments have the same structure. Their premises each contain statements of two types: (1) initial conditions C, and (2) law-like generalizations L. In each, the conclusion is the event E to be explained:

C1, C2, C3,...Cn

L1, L2, L3,...Ln

------------------------

E

The only difference between the two is that the laws in a DN explanation are universal generalizations, whereas the laws in IS explanations have the form of statistical generalizations. An example of a DN explanation containing one initial condition and one law-like generalization is:

C. The infant's cells have three copies of chromosome 21.

L. Any infant whose cells have three copies of chromosome 21 has Down's Syndrome.

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E. The infant has Down's Syndrome.

An example of an IS explanation is:

C. The man's brain was deprived of oxygen for five continuous minutes.

L. Almost anyone whose brain is deprived of oxygen for five continuous minutes will sustain brain damage.

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E. The man has brain damage.

For Hempel, DN explanations were always to be preferred to IS explanations. There were two reasons for this.

First, the deductive relationship between premises and conclusion maximized the predictive value of the explanation. Hempel accepted IS arguments as explanatory just to the extent that they approximated DN explanations by conferring a high probability on the event to be explained.

Second, Hempel understood the concept of explanation as something that should be understood fundamentally in terms of logical form. True premises are, of course, essential to something being a good DN explanation, but to qualify as a DN explanation (what he sometimes called a potential DN explanation) an argument need only exhibit the deductive-nomological structure. (This requirement placed Hempel squarely within the logical positivist tradition, which was committed to analyzing all of the epistemically significant concepts of science in logical terms.) There is, however, no corresponding concept of a potential IS explanation. Unlike DN explanations, the inductive character of IS explanations means that the relation between premises and conclusion can always be undermined by the addition of new information. (For example, the probability of brain damage, given that a man is deprived of oxygen for 7 minutes, is lowered somewhat by the information that the man spent this time at the bottom of a very cold lake.) Consequently, it is always possible that a proposed IS explanation, even if the premises are true, would fail to predict the fact in question, and thus have no explanatory significance for the case at hand.

3. Standard Criticisms of Hempel's Theory of Explanation

Hempel's dissatisfaction with statistical explanation was at odds with modern science, for which the explanatory use of statistics had become indispensable. Moreover, Hempel's requirement that IS explanations approximate the predictive power of DN explanations has the counterintuitive implication that for inherently low probability events no explanations are possible. For example, since smoking two packs of cigarettes a day for 40 years does not actually make it probable that a person will contract lung cancer, it follows from Hempel's theory that a statistical law about smoking will not be involved in an IS explanation of the occurrence of lung cancer. Hempel's view might be defended here by claiming that when our theories do not allow us to predict a phenomenon with a high degree of accuracy, it is because we have incomplete knowledge of the initial conditions. However, this seems to require us to base a theory of explanation on the now dubious metaphysical position that all events have determinate causes.

Another important criticism of Hempel's theory is that many DN arguments with true premises do not appear to be explanatory. Wesley Salmon raised the problem of relevance with the following example:

C1. Butch takes birth control pills.

C2: Butch is a man.

L: No man who takes birth control pills becomes pregnant.

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E: Butch has not become pregnant.

Unfortunately, this reasoning qualifies as explanatory on Hempel's theory despite the fact that the premises seem to be explanatorily irrelevant to the conclusion.

Sylvain Bromberger raised the problem of asymmetry by pointing out that, while on Hempel's model one can explain the period of a pendulum in terms of the length of the pendulum together with the law of simple periodic motion, one can just as easily explain the length of a pendulum in terms of its period in accord with the same law. Our intuitions tell us that the first is explanatory, but the second is not. The same point is made by the following example:

C: The barometer is falling rapidly.

L: Whenever the barometer falls rapidly, a storm is approaching.

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E: A storm is approaching.

While the falling barometer is a trustworthy indicator of an approaching storm, it is counterintuitive to say that the barometer explains the occurrence of the storm. Rather, it is the approaching storm that explains the falling barometer.

These two problems, relevance and asymmetry, expose the difficulty of developing a theory of explanation that makes no reference to causal relations. Reference to causal relations is not an option for Hempel, however, since causation heads the anti-realist's list of metaphysically suspect concepts. It would also undermine his view that explanation should be understood as an epistemic rather than a metaphysical relationship. Hempel's response to these problems was that they raise purely pragmatic issues. His model countenances many explanations that prove to be useless, but whether an explanation has any practical value is not, in Hempel's view, something that can be determined by philosophical analysis. This is a perfectly cogent reply, but it has not generally been regarded as an adequate one. Virtually all subsequent attempts to improve upon Hempel's theory accept the above criticisms as legitimate.

As noted above, Hempel's model requires that an explanation make use of at least one law-like generalization. This presents another sort of problem for the DN model. Hempel was careful to distinguish law-like generalizations from accidental generalizations. The latter are generalizations that may be true, but not in virtue of any law of nature. (for example, "All of my shirts are stained with coffee" may be true, but it is- I hope- just an accidental fact, not a law of nature.) Although the idea that explanation consists in subsuming events under natural laws has wide appeal in the philosophy of science, it is doubtful whether this requirement can be made consistent with Hempel's epistemic view of explanation. The reason is simply that no one has ever articulated an epistemically sound criterion for distinguishing between law-like generalizations and accidental generalizations. This is essentially just Hume's problem of induction, namely, that no finite number of observations can justify the claim that a regularity in nature is due to an natural necessity. In the absence of such a criterion, Hempel's model seems to violate the spirit of the epistemic view of explanation, as well as the idea that explanation can be understood in purely logical terms.

4. Contemporary Developments in the Theory of Explanation

Contemporary developments in the theory of explanation in many ways reflect the fragmented state of analytic philosophy since the decline of logical positivism. In this article we will look briefly at examples of how explanation has been conceived within the following five traditions: (1) Causal Realism, (2) Constructive Empiricism, (3) Ordinary Language Philosophy, (4) Cognitive Science and (5) Naturalism and Scientific Realism.

a. Explanation and Causal Realism

With the decline of logical positivism and the gathering success of modern theoretical science, philosophers began to regard continued skepticism about the reality of unobservable entities and processes as pointless. Different varieties of realism were articulated and against this background several different causal theories of explanation were developed. The idea behind them is the ordinary intuition noted at the beginning of this essay: to explain is to attribute a cause. Michael Scriven argued this point with notable force:

Let us take a case where we can be sure beyond any reasonable doubt that we have a correct explanation. As you reach for the dictionary, your knee catches the edge of the table and thus turns over the ink bottle, the contents of which proceed to run over the table's edge and ruin the carpet. If you are subsequently asked to explain how the carpet was damaged you have a complete explanation. You did it by knocking over the ink. The certainty of this explanation is primeval...This capacity for identifying causes is learnt, is better developed in some people than in others, can be tested, and is the basis for what we call judgments. (1959: p. 456)

Wesley Salmon's causal theory of explanation is perhaps the most influential developed within the realist tradition. Salmon had earlier developed a fundamentally epistemic view according to which an explanation is a list of statistically relevant factors. However he later rejected this, and any epistemic theory, as inadequate. His reason was that all epistemic theories are incapable of showing how explanations produce scientific understanding. This is because scientific understanding is not only a matter of having justified beliefs about the future. Salmon now insists that even a Laplacean Demon whose knowledge of the laws and initial conditions of the universe were so precise and complete as to issue in perfect predictive knowledge would lack scientific understanding. Specifically, he would lack the concepts of causal relevance and causal asymmetry and he could not distinguish between true causal processes and pseudo-processes. (As an example of the latter, consider the beam of a search light as it describes an arc through the sky. The movement of the beam is a pseudo-process since earlier stages of the beam do not cause later stages. By contrast, the electrical generation of the light itself, and the movement of the lamp housing are true causal processes.)

Salmon defends his causal realism by rejecting the Humean conception of causation as linked chains of events, and by attempting to articulate an epistemologically sound theory of continuous causal processes and causal interactions to replace it. The theory itself is detailed and does not lend itself to compression. It reads not so much as an analysis of the term 'explanation' as a set of instructions for producing an explanation of a particular phenomenon or event. One begins by compiling a list of statistically relevant factors and analyzing the list by a variety of methods. The procedure terminates in the creation of causal models of these statistical relationships and empirical testing to determine which of these models is best supported by the evidence.

Insofar as Salmon's theory insists that an adequate explanation has not been achieved until the fundamental causal mechanisms of a phenomenon have been articulated, it is deeply reductionistic. It is not clear, for example, how Salmon's model of explanation could ever generate meaningful explanations of mental events, which supervene on, but do not seem to be reducible to a unique set of causal relationships. Salmon's theory is also similar to Hempel's in at least one sense, and that is that both champion ideal forms of explanation, rather than anything that scientists or ordinary people are likely to achieve in the workaday world. This type of theorizing clearly has its place, but it has also been criticized by those who see explanation primarily as a form of communication between individuals. On this view, simplicity and ease of communication are not merely pragmatic, but essential to the creation of human understanding.

b. Explanation and Constructive Empiricism

In his book The Scientific Image (1980) Bas van Fraassen produced an influential defense of anti-realism. Terming his view "constructive empiricism" van Fraassen claimed that theoretical science was properly construed as a creative process of model construction rather than one of discovering truths about the unobservable world. While avoiding the fatal excesses of logical positivism he argued strongly against the realistic interpretation of theoretical terms, claiming that contemporary scientific realism is predicated on a dire misunderstanding of the nature of explanation. (See "Naturalism and Scientific Realism" below). In support of his constructive empiricism van Fraassen produced an epistemic theory of explanation that draws on the logic of why-questions and draws on a Bayesian interpretation of probability.

Like Hempel, van Fraassen seeks to explicate explanation as a purely logical concept. However, the logical relation is not that of premises to conclusion, but one of question to answer. Following Bromberger, van Fraassen characterizes explanation as an answer to a why-question. Why-questions, for him, are essentially contrastive. That is, they always, implicitly or explicitly, ask: Why Pk, rather than some set of alternatives X= ? Why-questions also implicitly stipulate a relevance relation R, which is the explanatory relation (for example, causation) any answer must bear to the ordered pair .

Van Fraassen follows Hempel in addressing explanatory asymmetry and explanatory relevance as pragmatic issues. However, van Fraassen's question-answering model makes this view a bit more intuitive. The relevance relation is defined by the interests of the person posing the question. For example, an individual who asks for an explanation of an airline accident in terms of the human decisions that led to it can not be forced to accept an explanation solely in terms of the weather. van Fraassen deals with the problem of explanatory asymmetry by showing that this, too, is a function of context. For example, most people would say that bad weather explains plane crashes, but plane crashes don't explain bad weather. However, there are conditions (for example, unstable atmospheric conditions, an airplane carrying highly explosive cargo) that could combine to supply the latter explanation with an appropriate context.

Van Fraassen's model also avoids Hempel's problematic requirement of high probability for IS explanation. For van Fraassen, an answer will be potentially explanatory if it "favors" Pk over all the other members of the contrast class. This means roughly that the answer must confer greater probability on Pk than on any other Pi. It does not require that Pk actually be probable, or even that the probability of Pk be raised as a result of the answer, since favoring can actually result from an answer that lowers the probability of all other Pi relative to Pk. For van Fraassen, the essential tool for calculating the explanatory value of a theory is Bayes' Rule, which allows one to calculate the probability of a particular event relative to a set of background assumptions and some new information. From a Bayesian point of view, the rationality of a belief is relative to a set of background assumptions which are not themselves the subject of evaluation. Van Fraassen's theory of explanation is therefore deeply subjectivist: what counts as a good explanation for one person may not count as a good explanation for another, since their background assumptions may differ.

Van Fraassen's pragmatic account of explanation buttresses his anti-realist position, by showing that when properly analyzed there is nothing about the concept of explanation that demands a realistic interpretation of causal processes or unobservables. Van Fraassen does not make the positivist mistake of claiming that talk of such things is metaphysical nonsense. He claims only that a full appreciation of science does not depend on a realistic interpretation. His pragmatism also offers an alternative account of Salmon's Laplacean Demon. van Fraassen agrees with Salmon that an individual with perfect knowledge of the laws and initial conditions of the universe lacks something, but what he lacks is not objective knowledge of the difference between causal processes and pseudo processes. Rather, he simply lacks the human interests that make causation a useful concept.

c. Explanation and Ordinary Language Philosophy

Although van Fraassen's theory of explanation is based on the view that explanation is a process of communication, he still chooses to explicate the concept of explanation as a logical relationship between question and answer, rather than as a communicative relationship between two individuals. Ordinary Language Philosophy tends to emphasize this latter quality, rejecting traditional epistemology and metaphysics and focusing on the requirements of effective communication. For this school, philosophical problems do not arise because ordinary language is defective, but because we are in some way ignoring the communicative function of language. Consequently, the point of ordinary language analysis is not to improve upon ordinary usage by clarifying the meanings of terms for use in some ideal vocabulary, but rather to bring the full ordinary meanings of the terms to light.

Within this tradition Peter Achinstein (1983) developed an illocutionary theory of explanation. Like Salmon, Achinstein characterizes explanation as the pursuit of understanding. He defines the act of explanation as the attempt by one person to produce understanding in another by answering a certain kind of question in a certain kind of way. Achinstein rejects Salmon's narrow association of understanding with causation, as well as van Fraassen's analysis in terms of why-questions. For Achinstein there are many different kinds of questions that we ordinarily regard as attempts to gain understanding (for example, who-, what-, when-, and where-questions) and it follows that the act of answering any of these is properly regarded as an act of explanation.

According to Achinstein's theory S (a person) explains q (an interrogative expressing some question Q) by uttering u only if:

S utters u with the intention that his utterance of u render q understandable by producing the knowledge of the proposition expressed by u that it is a correct answer to Q. (1983: p.13)

Achinstein's approach is an interesting departure from the types of theory discussed above in that it draws freely both on the concept of intention as well as the irreducibly causal notion of "producing knowledge." This move clearly can not be countenanced by someone who sees explanation as a fundamentally logical concept. Even the causal realist who believes that explanations make essential reference to causes does not construe explanation itself in causal terms. Indeed, Achinstein's approach is so different from theories that we have discussed so far that it might be best construed as addressing a very different question. Whereas traditional theories have attempted to explicate the logic of explanation, Achinstein's theory may be best understood as an attempt to describe the process of explanation itself.

Like van Fraassen's theory, Achinstein's theory is deeply pragmatic. He stipulates that all explanations are given relative to a set of instructions (cf. van Fraassen's relevance relations) and indicates that these instructions are ultimately determined by the individual asking the question. So, for example, a person who ask for an explanation why the electrical power in the house has gone out implicitly instructs that the question be answered in a way that would be relevant to the goal of turning the electricity back on. An answer that explained the absence of an electrical current in scientific terms, say by reference to Maxwell's equations, would be inappropriate in this case.

Achinstein attempts to avoid van Fraassen's subjectivism, by identifying understanding with knowledge that a certain kind of proposition is true. These, he calls "content giving propositions" which are to be contrasted with propositions that have no real cognitive significance. For example, Achinstein would want to rule out as non-explanatory, answers to questions that are purely tautological, such as: Mr. Pheeper died because Mr. Pheeper ceased to live. Achinstein also counts as non explanatory the scientifically correct answer to a question like: What is the speed of light in a vacuum? For him 186,000 miles/ second is not explanatory because, as it stands, it is just an incomprehensibly large number offering no basis of comparison with velocities that are cognitively significant. This does not mean that speed of light in a vacuum can not be explained. For example, a more cognitively significant answer to the above question might be that light can travel 7 1/2 times around the earth in one second. (Thanks to Professor Norman Swartz for this example)

One of the main difficulties with Achinstein's theory is that the idea of a content-giving proposition remains too vague. His refusal to narrow the list of questions that qualify as requests for explanation makes it very difficult to identify any interesting property that an act of explanation must have in order to produce understanding. Moreover, Achinstein's theory suffers from epistemological problems of its own. His theory of explanation makes essential reference to the intention to produce a certain kind of knowledge-state, but it is unclear from what Achinstein says how a knowledge state can be the result of an illocutionary act simpliciter. Certainly, such acts can produce beliefs, but not all beliefs so produced will count as knowledge, and Achinstein's theory does not distinguish between the kinds of explanatory acts that are likely to result in such knowledge, and the kinds that will not.

d. Explanation and Cognitive Science

While explanation may be fruitfully regarded as an act of communication, still another departure from the standard relational analysis is to think of explaining as a purely cognitive activity, and an explanation as a certain kind of mental representation that results from or aids in this activity. Considered in this way, explaining (sometimes called 'abduction') is a universal phenomenon. It may be conscious, deliberative, and explicitly propositional in nature, but it may also be unconscious, instinctive, and involve no explicit propositional knowledge whatsoever. For example: a father, hearing a high-pitched wail coming from the next room, rushes to his daughter's aid. Whether he reacted instinctively, or on the basis of an explicit inference, we can say that the father's behavior was the result of his having explained the wailing sound as the cry of his daughter.

From this perspective the term 'explanation' is neither a meta-logical nor a metaphysical relation. Rather, the term has been given a theoretical status and an explanatory function of its own; that is, we explain a person's behavior by reference to the fact that he is in possession of an explanation. Put differently, 'explanation' has been subsumed into the theoretical vocabulary of science (with explanation itself being one of the problematic unobservables) an understanding of which was the very purpose of the theory of explanation in the first place.

Cognitive science is a diverse discipline and there are many different ways of approaching the concept of explanation within it. One major rift within the discipline concerns the question whether "folk psychology" with its reference to mental entities like intentions, beliefs and desires is fundamentally sound. Cognitive scientists in the artificial intelligence (AI) tradition argue that it is sound, and that the task of cognitive science is to develop a theory that preserves the basic integrity of belief-desire explanation. On this view, explaining is a process of belief revision, and explanatory understanding is understood by reference to the set of beliefs that result from that process. Cognitive scientists in the neuroscience tradition, in contrast, argue that folk psychology is not explanatory at all: in its completed state all reference to beliefs and desires will be eliminated from the vocabulary of cognitive science in favor of a vocabulary that allows us to explain behavior by reference to models of neural activity. On this view explaining is a fundamentally neurological process, and explanatory understanding is understood by reference to activation patterns within a neural network.

One popular approach that incorporates aspects of both traditional AI and neuroscience makes use of the idea of a mental model (cf. Holland et al. [1986]) Mental models are internal representations that occur as a result of the activation of some part of a network of condition-action (or if-then) type rules. These rules are clustered in such a way that when a certain number of conditions becomes active, some action results. For example, here is a small cluster of rules that a simple cognitive system might use to distinguish different types of small furry mammals in a backyard environment.

(i) If [large, scurries, meows] then [cat].

(ii) If [small, scurries, squeaks] then [rat].

(iii) If [small, hops, chirps] then [squirrel].

(iv) If [squirrel or rat] then [flees].

(v) If [cat] then [approaches].

A mental model of a squirrel, then, can be described as an activation of rule (iii).

A key concept within the mental models framework is that of a default hierarchy. A set of rules such as those above, state a standard set of default conditions. When these are met, a set of expectations is generated. For example, the activation of rule (iii) generates expectations of type (iv). However, a viable representational system must be able to revise prior rule activations when expectations are contradicted by future experience. In the mental models framework, this is achieved by incorporating a hierarchy of rules below the default condition with more specific conditions at lower levels of the model whose actions will defeat default expectations. For example, default rule (iii) might be defeated by another rule as follows:

3. Level 1: If [small, hops, chirps] then [squirrel].

Level 2: If [flies] then [bird].

In other words, a system that identifies a small, hopping chirping animal as a squirrel generates a set of expectations about its future behavior. If these expectations are contradicted by, for example, the putative squirrel flying, then the system will descend to a lower level of the hierarchy thereby allowing the system to reclassify the object as a bird.

Although this is just a cursory characterization of the mental models framework it is enough to show how explanation can be handled within it. In this context it is natural to think of explanation as a process that is triggered by a predictive failure. Essentially, when the expectations activated at Level 1 of the default hierarchy fail, the system searches lower levels of the hierarchy to find out why. If the above example were formulated in explicitly propositional terms, we would say that the failure of Level 1 expectations generated the question: Why did the animal, which I previously identified as a squirrel, fly? The answer supplied at level 2 is: Because the animal is not a squirrel, but a bird. Of course, Level 2 rules produce their own set of expectations, which must themselves be corroborated with future experience or defeated by future explanations. Clearly, the above example is a rudimentary form of explanation. Any viable system must incorporate learning algorithms which allow it to modify both the content and structure of the default hierarchy when its expectations are repeatedly undermined by experience. This will necessarily involve the ability to generalize over past experiences and activate entirely new rules at every level of the default hierarchy.

One can reasonably doubt whether philosophical questions about the nature of explanation are addressed by defining and ultimately engineering systems capable of explanatory cognition. To the extent that these questions are understood in purely normative terms, they obviously arise in regard to systems built by humans with at least as much force as they arise for humans themselves. In defense of the cognitive science approach, however, one might assert that the simple philosophical question "What is explanation?" is not well-formed. If we accept some form of epistemic relativity, the proper form of such a question is always "What is explanation in cognitive system S?" Hence, doubts about the significance of explanatory cognition in some system S are best expressed as doubts about whether system S-type explanation models human cognition accurately enough to have any real significance for human beings.

e. Explanation, Naturalism and Scientific Realism

Historically, naturalism is associated with the inclination to reject any kind of explanation of natural phenomena that makes essential reference to unnatural phenomena. Insofar as this view is understood simply as the rejection of supernatural phenomena (for example the actions of gods, irreducibly spiritual substances, etc.) it is uncontroversial within the philosophy of science. However, when it is understood to entail the rejection of irreducibly non-natural properties, (that is, the normative properties of 'rightness' and 'wrongness' that we appeal to in making evaluative judgments about human thought and behavior), it is deeply problematic. The problem is just that the aim of the philosophy of science has always been to establish an a priori basis for making precisely these evaluative judgments about scientific inquiry itself. If they can not be made, then it follows that the goals of philosophical inquiry have been badly misconceived.

Most contemporary naturalists do not regard this as an insurmountable problem. Rather, they just reject the idea that philosophical inquiry can occur from a vantage point outside of science, and they deny that evaluative judgments we make about scientific reasoning and scientific concepts have any a priori status. Put differently, they think philosophical inquiry should be seen as a very abstract form of scientific inquiry, and they see the normative aspirations of philosophers as something that must be achieved by using the very tools and methods that philosophers have traditionally sought to justify.

The relevance of naturalism to the theory of explanation can be understood briefly as follows. Naturalism undermines the idea that knowledge is prior to understanding. If it is true that there will never be an inductive logic that can provide an a priori basis for calling an observed regularity a natural law, then there is, in fact, no independent way of establishing what is the case prior to understanding why it is the case. Because of this, some naturalists (for example, Sellars) have suggested a different way of thinking about the epistemic significance of explanation. The idea, basically, is that explanation is not something that occurs on the basis of pre-confirmed truths. Rather, successful explanation is actually part of the process of confirmation itself:

Our aim [is] to manipulate the three basic components of a world picture: (a) observed objects and events, (b) unobserved objects and events, (c) nomological connections, so as to achieve a maximum of "explanatory coherence." In this reshuffle no item is sacred. (Sellars, 1962: p356)

Many naturalists have since embraced this idea of "inference to the best explanation" (IBE) as a fundamental principle of scientific reasoning. Moreover, they have put this principle to work as an argument for realism. Briefly, the idea is that if we treat the claim that unobservable entities exist as a scientific hypothesis, then it can be seen as providing an explanation of the success of theories that employ them: namely, the theories are successful because they are (approximately) true. Anti-realism, by contrast, can provide no such explanation; on this view theories that make reference to unobservables are not literally true and so the success of scientific theories remains mysterious. It should be noted here that scientific realism has a very different flavor from the more foundational form of realism discussed above. Traditional realists do not think of realism as a scientific hypothesis, but as an independent metaphysical thesis.

Although IBE has won many converts in recent years it is deeply problematic precisely because of the way it employs the concept of explanation. While most people find IBE to be intuitively plausible, the fact remains that no theory of explanation discussed above can make sense of the idea that we accept a claim on the basis of its explanatory power. Rather, every such view stipulates as a condition of having explanatory power at all that a statement must be true or well-confirmed. Moreover, van Fraassen has argued that even if we can make sense of IBE, it remains a highly dubious principle of inductive inference. The reason is that "inference to the best explanation" really can only mean "inference to the best explanation given to date." We are unable to compare proposed explanations to others that no one has yet thought of, and for this reason the property of being the best explanation can not be an objective measure of the likelihood that it is true.

One way of responding to these criticisms is to observe that Sellars' concept of explanatory coherence is based on a view about the nature of understanding that simply eludes the standard models of explanation. According to this view an explanation increases our understanding, not simply by being the correct answer to a particular question, but by increasing the coherence of our entire belief system. This view has been developed in the context of traditional epistemology (Harman, Lehrer) as well as the philosophy of science (Thagard, Kitcher). In the latter context, the terms "explanatory unification" and "consilience" have been introduced to promote the idea that good explanations necessarily tend to produce a more unified body of knowledge. Although traditionalists will insist that there is no a priori basis for thinking that a unified or coherent set of beliefs is more likely to be true, (counterexamples are, in fact, easy to produce) this misses the point that most naturalists reject the possibility of establishing IBE, or any other inductive principle, on purely a priori grounds.

For critiques of naturalism, see theĀ Social Science article.

5. The Current State of the Theory of Explanation

This brief summary may leave the reader with the impression that philosophers are hopelessly divided on the nature of explanation, but this is not really the case. Most philosophers of science would agree that our understanding of explanation is far better now than it was in 1948 when Hempel and Oppenheim published "Studies in the Logic of Explanation." While it serves expository purposes to represent the DN model and each of its successors as fatally flawed, this should not obscure the fact that these theories have brought real advances in understanding which succeeding models are required to preserve. At this point, fundamental disagreements on the nature of explanation fall into one of two categories. First, there are metaphysical disagreements. Realists and anti-realists continue to differ over what sort of ontological commitments one makes in accepting an explanation. Second, there are meta-philosophical disagreements. Naturalists and non-naturalists remain at odds concerning the relevance of scientific inquiry ( namely, inquiry into the way scientists, ordinary people and computers actually think) to a philosophical theory of explanation. These disputes are unlikely to be resolved anytime soon. Fortunately, however, the significance of further research into the logical and cognitive structure of explanation does not depend on their outcome.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Achinstein, Peter (1983) The Nature of Explanation. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Belnap and Steele (1976) The Logic of Questions and Answers. New Haven: Yale University
  • Bromberger, Sylvain (1966) "Why-Questions," In Baruch A. Brody, ed., Readings in the Philosophy of Science, 66-84. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall, Inc..
  • Brody, Baruch A. (1970) Readings in the Philosophy of Science. Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice Hall
  • Duhem, Pierre (1962) The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory. New York:
  • Friedman, Michael (1974 ) "Explanation and Scientific Understanding." Journal of Philosophy 71: 5-19.
  • Harman, Gilbert (1965) "The Inference to the Best Explanation." Philosophical Review, 74: 88-95.
  • Hempel, Carl G. and Oppenheim, Paul (1948) "Studies in the Logic of Explanation." In Brody p. 8-38.
  • Hempel, Carl G. (1965) Aspects of Scientific Explanation and other Essays in the Philosophy of Science. New York: Free Press.
  • Holland, John; Holyoak, Keith; Nisbett, Richard; Thagard, Paul (1986) Induction: Processes of Inference, Learning, and Discovery. Cambridge: MIT Press
  • Hume, David (1977) An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Indianapolis: Hackett
  • Kitcher, Philip (1981) "Explanatory Unification." Philosophy of Science 48:507-531.
  • Lehrer, Keith (1990) Theory of Knowledge. Boulder: West View Press.
  • Pitt, Joseph C. (1988) Theories of Explanation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. (1969) "Epistemology Naturalized." In Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press: 69-90.
  • Salmon, Wesley (1984) Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Salmon, Wesley (1990) Four Decades of Scientific Explanation. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Scriven, M (1959) "Truisms as the Grounds for Historical Explanations." In P. Gardiner (Ed.), Theories of History: Readings from Classical and Contemporary Sources, New York: Free Press, pp. 443-475.
  • Sellars, Wilfred (1962) Science, Perception, and Reality. New York: Humanities Press.
  • Stich, Stephen (1983) From Folk Psychology to Cognitive Science. Cambridge: The MIT Press.
  • Thagard, Paul (1988) Computational Philosophy of Science. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • van Fraassen, Bas C. (1980) The Scientific Image. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • van Fraassen, Bas C. (1989) Laws and Symmetry. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Author Information

G. Randolph Mayes
Email: mayesgr@csus.edu
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.




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