Traditionally, faith and reason have each been considered to be sources of justification for religious belief. Because both can purportedly serve this same epistemic function, it has been a matter of much interest to philosophers and theologians how the two are related and thus how the rational agent should treat claims derived from either source. Some have held that there can be no conflict between the two—that reason properly employed and faith properly understood will never produce contradictory or competing claims—whereas others have maintained that faith and reason can (or even must) be in genuine contention over certain propositions or methodologies. Those who have taken the latter view disagree as to whether faith or reason ought to prevail when the two are in conflict. Kierkegaard, for instance, prioritizes faith even to the point that it becomes positively irrational, while Locke emphasizes the reasonableness of faith to such an extent that a religious doctrine’s irrationality—conflict with itself or with known facts—is a sign that it is unsound. Other thinkers have theorized that faith and reason each govern their own separate domains, such that cases of apparent conflict are resolved on the side of faith when the claim in question is, say, a religious or theological claim, but resolved on the side of reason when the disputed claim is, for example, empirical or logical. Some relatively recent philosophers, most notably the logical positivists, have denied that there is a domain of thought or human existence rightly governed by faith, asserting instead that all meaningful statements and ideas are accessible to thorough rational examination. This has presented a challenge to religious thinkers to explain how an admittedly nonrational or transrational form of language can hold meaningful cognitive content.
This article traces the historical development of thought on the interrelation of religious faith and reason, beginning with Classical Greek conceptions of mind and religious mythology and continuing through the medieval Christian theologians, the rise of science proper in the early modern period, and the reformulation of the issue as one of ‘science versus religion’ in the twentieth century.
Faith and reason are both sources of authority upon which beliefs can rest. Reason generally is understood as the principles for a methodological inquiry, whether intellectual, moral, aesthetic, or religious. Thus is it not simply the rules of logical inference or the embodied wisdom of a tradition or authority. Some kind of algorithmic demonstrability is ordinarily presupposed. Once demonstrated, a proposition or claim is ordinarily understood to be justified as true or authoritative. Faith, on the other hand, involves a stance toward some claim that is not, at least presently, demonstrable by reason. Thus faith is a kind of attitude of trust or assent. As such, it is ordinarily understood to involve an act of will or a commitment on the part of the believer. Religious faith involves a belief that makes some kind of either an implicit or explicit reference to a transcendent source. The basis for a person’s faith usually is understood to come from the authority of revelation. Revelation is either direct, through some kind of direct infusion, or indirect, usually from the testimony of an other. The religious beliefs that are the objects of faith can thus be divided into those what are in fact strictly demonstrable (scienta) and those that inform a believer’s virtuous practices (sapientia).
Religious faith is of two kinds: evidence-sensitive and evidence-insensitive. The former views faith as closely coordinated with demonstrable truths; the latter more strictly as an act of the will of the religious believer alone. The former includes evidence garnered from the testimony and works of other believers. It is, however, possible to hold a religious belief simply on the basis either of faith alone or of reason alone. Moreover, one can even lack faith in God or deny His existence, but still find solace in the practice of religion.
The basic impetus for the problem of faith and reason comes from the fact that the revelation or set of revelations on which most religions are based is usually described and interpreted in sacred pronouncements, either in an oral tradition or canonical writings, backed by some kind of divine authority. These writings or oral traditions are usually presented in the literary forms of narrative, parable, or discourse. As such, they are in some measure immune from rational critique and evaluation. In fact even the attempt to verify religious beliefs rationally can be seen as a kind of category mistake. Yet most religious traditions allow and even encourage some kind of rational examination of their beliefs.
The key philosophical issue regarding the problem of faith and reason is to work out how the authority of faith and the authority of reason interrelate in the process by which a religious belief is justified or established as true or justified. Four basic models of interaction are possible.
(a) The conflict model. Here the aims, objects, or methods of reason and faith seem to be very much the same. Thus when they seem to be saying different things, there is genuine rivalry. This model is thus assumed both by religious fundamentalists, who resolve the rivalry on the side of faith, and scientific naturalists, who resolve it on the side of reason.
(b) The incompatibilist model. Here the aims, objects, and methods of reason and faith are understood to be distinct. Compartmentalization of each is possible. Reason aims at empirical truth; religion aims at divine truths. Thus no rivalry exists between them. This model subdivides further into three subdivisions. First, one can hold faith is transrational, inasmuch as it is higher than reason. This latter strategy has been employed by some Christian existentialists. Reason can only reconstruct what is already implicit in faith or religious practice. Second, one can hold that religious belief is irrational, thus not subject to rational evaluation at all. This is the position taken ordinarily by those who adopt negative theology, the method that assumes that all speculation about God can only arrive at what God is not. The latter subdivision also includes those theories of belief that claim that religious language is only metaphorical in nature. This and other forms of irrationalism result in what is ordinarily considered fideism: the conviction that faith ought not to be subjected to any rational elucidation or justification.
(c) The weak compatibilist model. Here it is understood that dialogue is possible between reason and faith, though both maintain distinct realms of evaluation and cogency. For example, the substance of faith can be seen to involve miracles; that of reason to involve the scientific method of hypothesis testing. Much of the Reformed model of Christianity adopts this basic model.
(d) The strong compatibilist model. Here it is understood that faith and reason have an organic connection, and perhaps even parity. A typical form of strong compatibilism is termed natural theology. Articles of faith can be demonstrated by reason, either deductively (from widely shared theological premises) or inductively (from common experiences). It can take one of two forms: either it begins with justified scientific claims and supplements them with valid theological claims unavailable to science, or it starts with typical claims within a theological tradition and refines them by using scientific thinking. An example of the former would be the cosmological proof for God’s existence; an example of the latter would be the argument that science would not be possible unless God’s goodness ensured that the world is intelligible. Many, but certainly not all, Roman Catholic philosophers and theologians hold to the possibility of natural theology. Some natural theologians have attempted to unite faith and reason into a comprehensive metaphysical system. The strong compatibilist model, however, must explain why God chose to reveal Himself at all since we have such access to him through reason alone.
The interplay between reason and faith is an important topic in the philosophy of religion. It is closely related to, but distinct from, several other issues in the philosophy of religion: namely, the existence of God, divine attributes, the problem of evil, divine action in the world, religion and ethics, religious experience and religious language, and the problem of religious pluralism. Moreover, an analysis of the interplay between faith and reason also provides resources for philosophical arguments in other areas such as metaphysics, ontology, and epistemology.
While the issues the interplay between faith and reason addresses are endemic to almost any religious faith, this article will focus primarily on the faith claims found in the three great monotheistic world religions: Judaism, Islam, and particularly Christianity.
This rest of the article will trace out the history of the development of thinking about the relationship between faith and reason in Western philosophy from the classical period of the Greeks through the end of the twentieth century.
Greek religions, in contrast to Judaism, speculated primarily not on the human world but on the cosmos as a whole. They were often formulated as literary myths. Nonetheless these forms of religious speculation were generally practical in nature: they aimed to increase personal and social virtue in those who engaged in them. Most of these religions involved civic cultic practices.
Philosophers from the earliest times in Greece tried to distill metaphysical issues out of these mythological claims. Once these principles were located and excised, these philosophers purified them from the esoteric speculation and superstition of their religious origins. They also decried the proclivities to gnosticism and elitism found in the religious culture whence the religious myths developed. None of these philosophers, however, was particularly interested in the issue of willed assent to or faith in these religious beliefs as such.
Both Plato and Aristotle found a principle of intellectual organization in religious thinking that could function metaphysically as a halt to the regress of explanation. In Plato, this is found in the Forms, particularly the Form of the Good. The Form of Good is that by which all things gain their intelligibility. Aristotle rejected the Form of the Good as unable to account for the variety of good things, appealing instead to the unmoved mover as an unchangeable cosmic entity. This primary substance also has intelligence as nous: it is “thought thinking itself.” From this mind emerges exemplars for existent things.
Both thinkers also developed versions of natural theology by showing how religious beliefs emerge from rational reflections on concrete reality as such. An early form of religious apologetics – demonstrating the existence of the gods — can be found in Plato’s Laws. Aristotle’s Physics gave arguments demonstrating the existence of an unmoved mover as a timeless self-thinker from the evidence of motion in the world.
Both of these schools of thought derived certain theological kinds of thinking from physics and cosmology. The Stoics generally held a cosmological view of an eternal cycle of identical world-revolutions and world-destructions by a universal conflagration. Absolute necessity governs the cyclic process and is identified with divine reason (logos) and providence. This provident and benevolent God is immanent in the physical world. God orders the universe, though without an explicit purpose. Humans are microcosms; their souls are emanations of the fiery soul of the universe.
The Epicureans, on the other hand, were skeptical, materialistic, and anti-dogmatic. It is not clear they were theists at all, though at some points they seem to be. They did speak of the gods as living in a blissful state in intermundial regions, without any interest in the affairs of humans. There is no relation between the evils of human life and a divine guidance of the universe. At death all human perception ceases.
Plotinus, in the Enneads, held that all modes of being and value originate in an overflow of procession from a single ineffable power that he identified with the radical simplicity of the One of Parmenides or the Good of Plato’s Republic. Nous, the second hypostasis after the One, resembles Aristotle’s unmoved mover. The orders of the world soul and nature follow after Nous in a linear procession. Humans contain the potentialities of these creative principles, and can choose to make their lives an ascent towards and then a union with the intuitive intelligence. The One is not a being, but infinite being. It is the cause of beings. Thus Christian and Jewish philosophers who held to a creator God could affirm such a conception. Plotinus might have been the first negative theologian, arguing that God, as simple, is know more from what he is not, than from what he is.
Christianity, emerging from Judaism, imposed a set of revealed truths and practices on its adherents. Many of these beliefs and practices differed significantly from what the Greek religions and Judaism had held. For example, Christians held that God created the world ex nihilo, that God is three persons, and that Jesus Christ was the ultimate revelation of God. Nonetheless, from the earliest of times, Christians held to a significant degree of compatibility between faith and reason.
The writings attributed to St. Paul in the Christian Scriptures provide diverse interpretations of the relation between faith and reason. First, in the Acts of the Apostles, Paul himself engages in discussion with “certain Epicurean and Stoic philosophers” at the Aeropagus in Athens (Acts 17:18). Here he champions the unity of the Christian God as the creator of all. God is “not far from any one of us.” Much of Paul’s speech, in fact, seems to allude to Stoic beliefs. It reflects a sympathy with pagan customs, handles the subject of idol worship gently, and appeals for a new examination of divinity not from the standpoint of creation, but from practical engagement with the world. However, he claims that this same God will one day come to judge all mankind. But in his famous passage from Romans 1:20, Paul is less obliging to non-Christians. Here he champions a natural theology against those pagans who would claim that, even on Christian grounds, their previous lack of access to the Christian God would absolve them from guilt for their nonbelief. Paul argues that in fact anyone can attain to the truth of God’s existence merely from using his or her reason to reflect on the natural world. Thus this strong compatibilist interpretation entailed a reduced tolerance for atheists and agnostics. Yet in 1 Corinthians 1:23, Paul suggests a kind of incompatibilism, claiming that Christian revelation is folly the Gentiles (meaning Greeks). He points out that the world did not come to know God through wisdom; God chose to reveal Himself fully to those of simple faith.
These diverse Pauline interpretations of the relation between faith and reason were to continue to manifest themselves in various ways through the centuries that followed.
The early apologists were both compatibilists and incompatibilists. Tertullian took up the ideas of Paul in 1 Corinthians, proclaiming that Christianity is not merely incompatible with but offensive to natural reason. Jerusalem has nothing to do with Athens. He boldly claimed credo quia absurdum est (“I believe because it is absurd”). He claims that religious faith is both against and above reason. In his De Praescriptione Haereticorum, he proclaims, “when we believe, we desire to believe nothing further.”
On the other hand, Justin Martyr converted to Christianity, but continued to hold Greek philosophy in high esteem. In his Dialogue with Trypho he finds Christianity “the only sure and profitable philosophy.”
In a similar vein, Clement of Alexandria in his Stromata called the Gospel “the true philosophy.” Philosophy acted as a “schoolmaster” to bring the Greeks to Christ, just as the law brought the Jews. But he maintained that Greek philosophy is unnecessary for a defense of the faith, though it helps to disarm sophistry. He also worked to demonstrate in a rational way what is found in faith. He claimed that “I believe in order that I may know” (credo ut intelligam). This set Christianity on firmer intellectual foundations. Clement also worked to clarify the early creeds of Christianity, using philosophical notions of substance, being, and person, in order to combat heresies.
Augustine emerged in the late fourth century as a rigorous defender of the Christian faith. He responded forcefully to pagans’ allegations that Christian beliefs were not only superstitious but also barbaric. But he was, for the most part, a strong compatibilist. He felt that intellectual inquiry into the faith was to be understood as faith seeking understanding (fides quaerens intellectum). To believe is “to think with assent” (credere est assensione cogitare). It is an act of the intellect determined not by the reason, but by the will. Faith involves a commitment “to believe in a God,” “to believe God,” and “to believe in God.”
In On Christian Doctrine Augustine makes it clear that Christian teachers not only may, but ought, to use pagan thinking when interpreting Scripture. He points out that if a pagan science studies what is eternal and unchanging, it can be used to clarify and illuminate the Christian faith. Thus logic, history, and the natural sciences are extremely helpful in matters of interpreting ambiguous or unknown symbols in the Scriptures. However, Augustine is equally interested to avoid any pagan learning, such as that of crafts and superstition that is not targeted at unchangeable knowledge.
Augustine believed that Platonists were the best of philosophers, since they concentrated not merely on the causes of things and the method of acquiring knowledge, but also on the cause of the organized universe as such. One does not, then, have to be a Christian to have a conception of God. Yet, only a Christian can attain to this kind of knowledge without having to have recourse to philosophy.
Augustine argued further that the final authority for the determination of the use of reason in faith lies not with the individual, but with the Church itself. His battle with the Manichean heresy prompted him to realize that the Church is indeed the final arbiter of what cannot be demonstrated–or can be demonstrated but cannot be understood by all believers. Yet despite this appeal to ecclesiastical authority, he believe that one cannot genuinely understand God until one loves Him.
Pseudo Dionysius was heavily influenced by neo-Platonism. In letter IX of his Corpus Dionysiacum, he claimed that our language about God provides no information about God but only a way of protecting God’s otherness. His analysis gave rise to the unique form negative theology. It entailed a severe restriction in our access to and understanding of the nature of God. In his “Mystical Theology” Pseudo-Dionysius describes how the soul’s destiny is to be fully united with the ineffable and absolutely transcendent God.
Much of the importance of this period stems from its retrieval of Greek thinking, particularly that of Aristotle. At the beginning of the period Arab translators set to work translating and distributing many works of Greek philosophy, making them available to Jewish, Islamic, and Christian philosophers and theologians alike.
For the most part, medieval theologians adopted an epistemological distinction the Greeks had developed: between scienta (episteme), propositions established on the basis of principles, and opinio, propositions established on the basis of appeals to authority. An established claim in theology, confirmed by either scienta or opinio, demanded the believer’s assent. Yet despite this possibility of scientia in matters of faith, medieval philosophers and theologians believed that it could be realized only in a limited sense. They were all too aware of St. Paul’s caveat that faith is a matter of “seeing in a mirror dimly” (1 Cor 1:13).
Like Augustine, Anselm held that one must love God in order to have knowledge of Him. In the Proslogion, he argues that “the smoke of our wrongdoing” will prohibit us from this knowledge. Anselm is most noted, however, for his ontological argument, presented in his Proslogion. He claimed that it is possible for reason to affirm that God exists from inferences made from what the understanding can conceive within its own confines. As such he was a gifted natural theologian. Like Augustine, Anselm held that the natural theologian seeks not to understand in order to believe, but to believe in order to understand. This is the basis for his principle intellectus fidei. Under this conception, reason is not asked to pass judgment on the content of faith, but to find its meaning and to discover explanations that enable others to understand its content. But when reason confronts what is incomprehensible, it remains unshaken since it is guided by faith’s affirmation of the truth of its own incomprehensible claims.
Lombard was an important precursor to Aquinas. Following Augustine, he argued that pagans can know about much about truths of the one God simply by their possession of reason (e.g. that spirit is better than body, the mutable can exists only from a immutable principle, all beauty points to a beauty beyond compare). But in addition, pagans can affirm basic truths about the Trinity from these same affirmations, inasmuch as all things mirror three attributes associated with the Trinity: unity (the Father), form or beauty (the Son), and a position or order (the Holy Spirit).
Islamic philosophers in the tenth and eleventh centuries were also heavily influenced by the reintroduction of Aristotle into their intellectual culture.
Avicenna (Ibn Sina) held that as long as religion is properly construed it comprises an area of truth no different than that of philosophy. He built this theory of strong compatibilism on the basis of his philosophical study of Aristotle and Plotinus and his theological study of his native Islam. He held that philosophy reveals that Islam is the highest form of life. He defended the Islamic belief in the immortality of individual souls on the grounds that, although as Aristotle taught the agent intellect was one in all persons, the unique potential intellect of each person, illuminated by the agent intellect, survives death.
Averroes (Ibn Rushd), though also a scholar of Aristotle’s works, was less sympathetic to compatibilism than his predecessor Avicenna. But in his Incoherence of Incoherence, he attacked Algazel’s criticisms of rationalism in theology. For example, he developed a form of natural theology in which the task of proving the existence of God is possible. He held, however, that it could be proven only from the physical fact of motion. Nonetheless Averroes did not think that philosophy could prove all Islamic beliefs, such as that of individual immortality. Following Aristotle in De Anima, Averroes argued for a separation between the active and passive intellects, even though they enter into a temporary connection with individual humans. This position entails the conclusion that no individuated intellect survives death. Yet Averroes held firmly to the contrary opinion by faith alone.
Moses Maimonides, a Jewish philosopher, allowed for a significant role of reason in critically interpreting the Scriptures. But he is probably best known for his development of negative theology. Following Avicenna’s affirmation of a real distinction between essence and existence, Maimonides concluded that no positive essential attributes may be predicated of God. God does not possess anything superadded to his essence, and his essence includes all his perfections. The attributes we do have are derived from the Pentateuch and the Prophets. Yet even these positive attributes, such as wisdom and power, would imply defects in God if applied to Him in the same sense they are applied to us. Since God is simple, it is impossible that we should know one part, or predication, of Him and not another. He argues that when one proves the negation of a thing believed to exist in God, one becomes more perfect and closer to knowledge of God. He quotes Psalm 4:4′s approval of an attitude of silence towards God. Those who do otherwise commit profanity and blasphemy. It is not certain, however, whether Maimonides rejected the possibility of positive knowledge of the accidental attributes of God’s action.
Unlike Augustine, who made little distinction between explaining the meaning of a theological proposition and giving an argument for it, Aquinas worked out a highly articulated theory of theological reasoning. St. Bonaventure, an immediate precursor to Aquinas, had argued that no one could attain to truth unless he philosophizes in the light of faith. Thomas held that our faith in eternal salvation shows that we have theological truths that exceed human reason. But he also claimed that one could attain truths about religious claims without faith, though such truths are incomplete. In the Summa Contra Gentiles he called this a “a two fold truth” about religious claims, “one to which the inquiry of reason can reach, the other which surpasses the whole ability of the human reason.” No contradiction can stand between these two truths. However, something can be true for faith and false (or inconclusive) in philosophy, though not the other way around. This entails that a non-believer can attain to truth, though not to the higher truths of faith.
A puzzling question naturally arises: why are two truths needed? Isn’t one truth enough? Moreover, if God were indeed the object of rational inquiry in this supernatural way, why would faith be required at all? In De Veritate (14,9) Thomas responds to this question by claiming that one cannot believe by faith and know by rational demonstration the very same truth since this would make one or the other kind of knowledge superfluous.
On the basis of this two-fold theory of truth, Aquinas thus distinguished between revealed (dogmatic) theology and rational (philosophical) theology. The former is a genuine science, even though it is not based on natural experience and reason. Revealed theology is a single speculative science concerned with knowledge of God. Because of its greater certitude and higher dignity of subject matter, it is nobler than any other science. Philosophical theology, though, can make demonstrations using the articles of faith as its principles. Moreover, it can apologetically refute objections raised against the faith even if no articles of faith are presupposed. But unlike revealed theology, it can err.
Aquinas claimed that the act of faith consists essentially in knowledge. Faith is an intellectual act whose object is truth. Thus it has both a subjective and objective aspect. From the side of the subject, it is the mind’s assent to what is not seen: “Faith is the evidence of things that appear not” (Hebrews 11:1). Moreover, this assent, as an act of will, can be meritorious for the believer, even though it also always involves the assistance of God’s grace. Moreover, faith can be a virtue, since it is a good habit, productive of good works. However, when we assent to truth in faith, we do so on the accepted testimony of another. From the side of what is believed, the objective aspect, Aquinas clearly distinguished between “preambles of faith,” which can be established by philosophical principles, and “articles of faith” that rest on divine testimony alone. A proof of God’s existence is an example of a preamble of faith. Faith alone can grasp, on the other hand, the article of faith that the world was created in time (Summa Theologiae I, q. 46, a. 2). Aquinas argued that the world considered in itself offers no grounds for demonstrating that it was once all new. Demonstration is always about definitions, and definitions, as universal, abstract from “the here and now.” A temporal beginning, thus demonstrated, is ruled out tout court. Of course this would extend to any argument about origination of the first of any species in a chain of efficient causes. Here Thomas sounds a lot like Kant will in his antinomies. Yet by faith we believe he world had a beginning. However, one rational consideration that suggests, though not definitively, a beginning to the world is that the passage from one term to another includes only a limited number of intermediate points between them.
Aquinas thus characterizes the articles of faith as first truths that stand in a “mean between science and opinion.” They are like scientific claims since their objects are true; they are like mere opinions in that they have not been verified by natural experience. Though he agrees with Augustine that no created intellect can comprehend God as an object, the intellect can grasp his existence indirectly. The more a cause is grasped, the more of its effects can be seen in it; and since God is the ultimate cause of all other reality, the more perfectly an intellect understands God, the greater will be its knowledge of the things God does or can do. So although we cannot know the divine essence as an object, we can know whether He exists and on the basis of analogical knowledge what must necessarily belong to Him. Aquinas maintains, however, that some objects of faith, such as the Trinity or the Incarnation, lie entirely beyond our capacity to understand them in this life.
Aquinas also elucidates the relationship between faith and reason on the basis of a distinction between higher and lower orders of creation. Aquinas criticizes the form of naturalism that holds that the goodness of any reality “is whatever belongs to it in keeping with its own nature” without need for faith (II-IIae, q.2, a.3). Yet, from reason itself we know that every ordered pattern of nature has two factors that concur in its full development: one on the basis of its own operation; the other, on the basis of the operation of a higher nature. The example is water: in a lower pattern, it naturally flows toward the centre, but in virtue of a higher pattern, such as the pull of the moon, it flows around the center. In the realm of our concrete knowledge of things, a lower pattern grasps only particulars, while a higher pattern grasps universals.
Given this distinction of orders, Thomas shows how the lower can indeed point to the higher. His arguments for God’s existence indicate this possibility. From this conviction he develops a highly nuanced natural theology regarding the proofs of God’s existence. The first of his famous five ways is the argument from motion. Borrowing from Aristotle, Aquinas holds to the claim that, since every physical mover is a moved mover, the experience of any physical motion indicates a first unmoved mover. Otherwise one would have to affirm an infinite chain of movers, which he shows is not rationally possible. Aquinas then proceeds to arguments from the lower orders of efficient causation, contingency, imperfection, and teleology to affirm the existence of a unitary all-powerful being. He concludes that these conclusions compel belief in the Judeo-Christian God.
Conversely, it is also possible to move from the higher to the lower orders. Rational beings can know “the meaning of the good as such” since goodness has an immediate order to the higher pattern of the universal source of being (II-IIae q.2, a.3). The final good considered by the theologian differs, however, from that considered by the philosopher: the former is the bonum ultimum proportionate to human powers; the latter is the beatific vision. Both forms of the ultimate good have important ramifications, since they ground not only the moral distinction between natural and supernatural virtues, but also the political distinction between ecclesial and secular power.
Aquinas concludes that we come to know completely the truths of faith only through the virtue of wisdom (sapientia). Thomas says that “whatever its source, truth of is of the Holy Spirit” (Summa Theologiae, I-IIae q. 109, a. 1). The Spirit “enables judgment according to divine truth” (II-IIae 45, q. 1, ad 2). Moreover, faith and charity are prerequisites for the achievement of this wisdom.
Thomas’s two-fold theory of truth develops a strong compatibilism between faith and reason. But it can be argued that after his time what was intended as a mutual autonomy soon became an expanding separation.
Duns Scotus, like his successor William of Ockham, reacted in a characteristic Franciscan way to Thomas’s Dominican views. While the Dominicans tended to affirm the possibility of rational demonstrability of certain preambles of faith, the Franciscans tended more toward a more restricted theological science, based solely on empirical and logical analysis of beliefs.
Scotus first restricts the scope of Aquinas’s rational theology by refuting its ability to provide arguments that stop infinite regresses. In fact he is wary of the attempts of natural theology to prove anything about higher orders from lower orders. On this basis, he rejects the argument from motion to prove God’s existence. He admits that lower beings move and as such they require a first mover; but he maintains that one cannot prove something definitive about higher beings from even the most noble of lower beings. Instead, Scotus thinks that reason can be employed only to elucidate a concept. In the realm of theology, the key concept to elucidate is that of infinite being. So in his discussion of God’s existence, he takes a metaphysical view of efficiency, arguing that there must be not a first mover, but an actually self-existent being which makes all possibles possible. In moving towards this restricted form of conceptualist analysis, he thus gives renewed emphasis to negative theology.
Ockham then radicalized Scotus’s restrictions of our knowledge of God. He claimed that the Greek metaphysics of the 13th century, holding to the necessity of causal connections, contaminated the purity of the Christian faith. He argued instead that we cannot know God as a deduction from necessary principles. In fact, he rejected the possibility that any science can verify any necessity, since nothing in the world is necessary: if A and B are distinct, God could cause one to exist without the other. So science can demonstrate only the implications of terms, premises, and definitions. It keeps within the purely conceptual sphere. Like Scotus he argued held that any necessity in an empirical proposition comes from the divine order. He concluded that we know the existence of God, his attributes, the immortality of the soul, and freedom only by faith. His desire to preserve divine freedom and omnipotence thus led in the direction of a voluntaristic form of fideism.
Ockham’s denial of the necessity in the scope of scientific findings perhaps surprisingly heralded the beginnings of a significant movement towards the autonomy of empirical science. But with this increased autonomy came also a growing incompatibility between the claims of science and those of religious authorities. Thus the tension between faith and reason now became set squarely for the first time in the conflict between science and religion. This influx of scientific thinking undermined the hitherto reign of Scholasticism. By the seventeenth century, what had begun as a criticism of the authority of the Church evolved into a full-blown skepticism regarding the possibility of any rational defense of fundamental Christian beliefs.
The Protestant Reformers shifted their emphasis from the medieval conception of faith as a fides (belief that) to fiducia (faith in). Thus attitude and commitment of the believer took on more importance. The Reformation brought in its wake a remarkable new focus on the importance of the study of Scripture as a warrant for one’s personal beliefs.
The Renaissance also witnessed the development of a renewed emphasis on Greek humanism. In the early part of this period, Nicholas of Cusa and others took a renewed interest in Platonism.
In the seventeenth century, Galileo understood “reason” as scientific inference based and experiment and demonstration. Moreover, experimentation was not a matter simply of observation, it also involved measurement, quantification, and formulization of the properties of the objects observed. Though he was not the first to do attempt this systematization — Archimedes had done the same centuries before – Galileo developed it to such an extent that he overthrew the foundations of Aristotelian physics. He rejected, for example, Aristotle’s claim that every moving had a mover whose force had to be continually applied. In fact it was possible to have more than one force operating on the same body at the same time. Without the principle of a singular moved mover, it was also conceivable that God could have “started” the world, then left it to move on its own.
The finding of his that sparked the great controversy with the Catholic Church was, however, Galileo’s defense of Copernicus’s rejection of the Ptolemaic geocentric universe. Galileo used a telescope he had designed to confirm the hypothesis of the heliocentric system. He also hypothesized that the universe might be indefinitely large. Realizing that such conclusions were at variance with Church teaching, he followed Augustine’s rule than an interpretation of Scripture should be revised when it confronts properly scientific knowledge.
The officials of the Catholic Church – with some exceptions — strongly resisted these conclusions and continued to champion a pre-Copernican conception of the cosmos. The Church formally condemned Galileo’s findings for on several grounds. First, the Church tended to hold to a rather literal interpretation of Scripture, particularly of the account of creation in the book of Genesis. Such interpretations did not square with the new scientific views of the cosmos such as the claim that the universe is infinitely large. Second, the Church was wary of those aspects of the “new science” Galileo represented that still mixed with magic and astrology. Third, these scientific findings upset much of the hitherto view of the cosmos that had undergirded the socio-political order the Church endorsed. Moreover, the new scientific views supported Calvinist views of determinism against the Catholic notion of free will. It took centuries before the Church officially rescinded its condemnation of Galileo.
Inspired by Greek humanism, Erasmus placed a strong emphasis on the autonomy of human reason and the importance of moral precepts. As a Christian, he distinguished among three forms of law: laws of nature, thoroughly engraved in the minds of all men as St. Paul had argued, laws of works, and laws of faith. He was convinced that philosophers, who study laws of nature, could also produce moral precepts akin to those in Christianity. But Christian justification still comes ultimately only from the grace that can reveal and give a person the ability to follow the law of faith. As such, “faith cures reason, which has been wounded by sin.” So, while the laws of works are for the most part prohibitions against certain sins, the laws of faith tend to be positive duties, such as the injunctions to love one’s enemies and to carry one’s cross daily.
Martin Luther restricted the power of reason to illuminate faith. Like many reformers, he considered the human being alone unable to free itself from sin. In The Bondage of the Will, he makes a strict separation between what man has dominion over (his dealings with the lower creatures) and what God has dominion over (the affairs of His kingdom and thus of salvation). Reason is often very foolish: it immediately jumps to conclusions when it sees a thing happen once or twice. But by its reflections on the nature of words and our use of language, it can help us to grasp our own spiritual impotence.
Luther thus rejected the doctrine of analogy, developed by Aquinas and others, as an example of the false power of reason. In his Heidelberg Disputation Luther claims that a theologian must look only “on the visible rearward parts of God as seen in suffering and the cross.” Only from this perspective, do we keep our faith when we see, for example, that in the world the unjust prosper and the good undergo afflictions. Thus faith is primarily an act of trust in God’s grace.
Luther thus stresses the gratuitousness of salvation. In a traditional sense, Roman Catholics generally held that faith is meritorious, and thus that salvation involves good works. Protestant reformers like Luther, on the other hand, held that indeed faith is pure gift. He thus tended to make the hitherto Catholic emphasis on works look voluntaristic.
Like Luther, John Calvin appealed to the radical necessity of grace for salvation. This was embodied in his doctrine of election. But unlike Luther, Calvin gave a more measured response to the power of human reason to illuminate faith. In his Institutes of the Christian Religion, he argued that the human mind possesses, by natural instinct, an “awareness of divinity.” This sensus divinitatis is that whereby we form specific beliefs about God in specific situations, e.g. when experiencing danger, beauty, or even guilt. Even idolatry can contain as aspect of this. So religion is not merely arbitrary superstition. And yet, the law of creation makes necessary that we direct every thought and action to this goal of knowing God.
Despite this fundamental divine orientation, Calvin denied that a believer could build up a firm faith in Scripture through argument and disputation. He appealed instead to the testimony of Spirit embodied gained through a life of religious piety. Only through this testimony is certainty about one’s beliefs obtained. We attain a conviction without reasons, but only through “nothing other than what each believer experiences within himself–though my words fall far beneath a just explanation of the matter.” He realized, however, that “believers have a perpetual struggle with their own lack of faith.” But these struggles never remove them from divine mercy.
Calvin is thus an incompatibilist of the transrational type: faith is not against, but is beyond human reason.
René Descartes, even more profoundly than Calvin, moved reason into the confines of the thinking subject. But he expanded the power of reason to grasp firmly the preambles of faith. In his Meditations, he claimed to have provided what amounted to be the most certain proofs of God possible. God becomes explicated by means of the foundation of subjective self-certainty. His proofs hinged upon his conviction that God cannot be a deceiver. Little room is left for faith.
Descartes’s thinking prepared Gottfried Leibniz to develop his doctrine of sufficient reason. Leibniz first argued that all truths are reducible to identities. From this it follows that a complete or perfect concept of an individual substance involves all its predicates, whether past, present, or future. From this he constructed his principle of sufficient reason: there is no event without a reason and no effect without a cause. He uses this not only to provide a rigorous cosmological proof for God’s existence from the fact of motion, but also to defend the cogency of both the ontological argument and the argument from design.
In his Theodicy Leibniz responded to Pierre Bayle, a French philosophe, who gave a skeptical critique of rationalism and support of fideism. First, Leibniz held that all truths are complementary, and cannot be mutually inconsistent. He argued that there are two general types of truth: those that are altogether necessary, since their opposite implies contradiction, and those that are consequences of the laws of nature. God can dispense only with the latter laws, such as the law of our mortality. A doctrine of faith can never violate something of the first type; but it can be in tension with truths of the second sort. Thus though no article of faith can be self-contradictory, reason may not be able to fully comprehend it. Mysteries, such as that of the Trinity, are simply “above reason.” But how do we weigh the probabilities favoring a doctrine of faith against those derived from general experience and the laws of nature? We must weigh these decisions by taking into account the existence and nature of God and the universal harmony by which the world is providentially created and ordered.
Leibniz insisted that one must respect the differences among the three distinct functions of reason: to comprehend, to prove, and to answer objections. In the faith/reason controversy, Leibniz thought that the third function takes on particular prominence. However, one sees vestiges of the first two as well, since an inquiry into truths of faith employs proofs of the infinite whose strength or weakness the reasoner can comprehend.
Baruch Spinoza, a Dutch philosopher, brought a distinctly Jewish perspective to his rigorously rationalistic analysis of faith. Noticing that religious persons showed no particular penchant to virtuous life, he decided to read the Scriptures afresh without any presuppositions. He found that Old Testament prophecy, for example, concerned not speculative but primarily practical matters. Obedience to God was one. He took this to entail that whatever remains effective in religion applies only to moral matters. He then claimed that the Scriptures do not conflict with natural reason, leaving it free reign. No revelation is needed for morality. Moreover, he was led to claim that though the various religions have very different doctrines, they are very similar to one another in their moral pronouncements.
Pascal rejected the hitherto claims of medieval natural theologians, by claiming that reason can neither affirm nor deny God’s existence. Instead he focused on the way that we should act given this ambiguity. He argued that since the negative consequences of believing are few (diminution of the passions, some pious actions) but the gain of believing is infinite (eternal life), it is more rational to believe than to disbelieve in God’s existence. This assumes, of course, both that God would not grant eternal life to a non-believer and that sincerity in one’s belief in God is not a requirement for salvation. As such, Pascal introduced an original form of rational voluntarism into the analysis of faith.
John Locke lived at a time when the traditional medieval view of a unified body of articulate wisdom no longer seemed plausible. Yet he still held to the basic medieval idea that faith is assent to specific propositions on the basis of God’s authority. Yet unlike Aquinas, he argued that faith is not a state between knowledge and opinion, but a form of opinion (doxa). But he developed a kind of apology for Christianity: an appeal to revelation, without an appeal to enthusiasm or inspiration. His aim was to demonstrate the “reasonableness of Christianity.” Though faith and reason have “strict” distinct provinces, faith must be in accord with reason. Faith cannot convince us of what contradicts, or is contrary, to our knowledge. We cannot assent to a revealed proposition if it be contradictory to our clear intuitive knowledge. But propositions of faith are, nonetheless, understood to be “above reason.”
Locke specifies two ways in which matters of faith can be revealed: either though “original revelation” or “traditional revelation.” Moses receiving the Decalogue is an example of the former; his communication of its laws to the Israelites is an example of the latter. The truth of original revelation cannot be contrary to reason. But traditional revelation is even more dependent on reason, since if an original revelation is to be communicated, it cannot be understood unless those who receive it have already received a correlate idea through sensation or reflection and understood the empirical signs through which it is communicated.
For Locke, reason justifies beliefs, and assigns them varying degrees of probability based on the power of the evidence. But, like Aquinas, Locke held to the evidence not only of logical/mathematical and certain self-affirming existential claims, but also “that which is evident to the senses.” All of these veridical beliefs depend upon no other beliefs for their justification. But faith requires the even less certain evidence of the testimony of others. In the final analysis, faith’s assent is made not by a deduction from reason, but by the “credit of the proposer, as coming from God, in some extraordinary way of communication.” Thus Locke’s understands faith as a probable consent.
Locke also developed a version of natural theology. In An Essay Concerning Human Understanding he claims that the complex ideas we have of God are made of up ideas of reflection. For example, we take the ideas of existence, duration, pleasure, happiness, knowledge, and power and “enlarge every one of these with our idea of Infinity; and so putting them together, make our complex idea of God.” We cannot know God’s own essence, however.
David Hume, like Locke, rejected rationalism, but developed a more radical kind of empiricism than Locke had. He argued that concrete experience is “our only guide in reasoning concerning matters of fact.” Thus he rejected the possibility of arguing for the truths of faith on the basis either of natural theology or the evidence of miracles. He supported this conclusion on two grounds. First, natural theology requires certain inferences from everyday experience. The argument from design infers that we can infer a single designer from our experience of the world. Though Hume agrees that we have experiences of the world as an artifact, he claims that we cannot make any probable inference from this fact to quality, power, or number of the artisans. Second, Hume argues that miracles are not only often unreliable grounds as evidence for belief, but in fact are apriori impossible. A miracle by definition is a transgression of a law of nature, and yet by their very nature these laws admit of no exceptions. Thus we cannot even call it a law of nature that has been violated. He concludes that reason and experience fail to establish divine infinity, God’s moral attributes, or any specification of the ongoing relationship between the Deity and man. But rather than concluding that his stance towards religious beliefs was one of atheism or even a mere Deism, Hume argued that he was a genuine Theist. He believed that we have a genuine natural sentiment by which we long for heaven. The one who is aware of the inability of reason to affirm these truths in fact is the person who can grasp revealed truth with the greatest avidity.
Immanuel Kant was heavily influenced by Descartes’s anthropomorphism and Spinoza‘s and Jean Jacques Rousseau‘s restriction of the scope of religion to ethical matters. Moreover, he wanted a view that was consistent with Newton’s discoveries about the strict natural laws that govern the empirical world. To accomplish this, he steered the scope of reason away from metaphysical, natural, and religious speculation altogether.
Kant’s claim that theoretical reason was unable to grasp truths about God effectively continued the contraction of the authority of scienta in matters of faith that had been occurring since the late medieval period. He rejected, then, the timeless and spaceless God of revelation characteristic of the Augustinian tradition as beyond human ken. This is most evident in his critique of the cosmological proof for the existence of God in The Critique of Pure Reason. This move left Kant immune from the threat of unresolvable paradoxes. Nonetheless he did allow the concept of God (as well as the ideas of immortality and the soul) to become not a constitutive but a regulative ideal of reason. God’s existence remains a necessary postulate specifically for the moral law. God functions as the sources for the summum bonum. Only God can guarantee an ideal conformity of virtue and happiness, which is required to fulfill the principle that “ought implies can.” This grounded what Kant called a faith distinct from knowledge or comprehension, but nonetheless rational. Rational faith involves reliance neither upon God’s word nor the person of Christ, but only upon the recognition of God as the source of how we subjectively realize our duties. God is cause of our moral purposes as rational beings in nature. Yet faith is “free belief”: it is the permanent principle of the mind to assume as true, on account of the obligation in reference to it, that which is necessary to presuppose as condition of the possibility of the highest moral purpose. Like Spinoza, Kant makes all theology moral theology.
Since faith transcends the world of experience, it is neither doubtful nor merely probable. Thus Kant’s view of faith is complex: it has no theoretical grounds, yet it has a rational basis that provides more or less stable conviction for believers. He provided a religion grounded without revelation or grace. It ushered in new immanentism in rational views of belief.
G.W.F. Hegel, at the peak of German Idealism, took up Kant’s immanentism but moved it in a more radical direction. He claimed that in Kant, “philosophy has made itself the handmaid of a faith once more” though one not externally imposed but autonomously constituted. Hegel approved of the way Kant helped to modify the Enlightenment’s dogmatic emphasis on the empirical world, particularly as evidenced in the way Locke turned philosophy into empirical psychology. But though Kant held to an “idealism of the finite,” Hegel thought that Kant did not extend his idealism far enough. Kant’s regulative view of reason was doomed to regard faith and knowledge as irrevocably opposed. Hegel argued that a further development of idealism shows have faith and knowledge are related and synthesized in the Absolute.
Hegel reinterpreted the traditional proofs for God’s existence, rejected by Kant, as authentic expressions of the need of finite spirit to elevate itself to oneness with God. In religion this attempt to identify with God is accomplished through feeling. Feelings are, however, subject to conflict and opposition. But they are not merely subjective. The content of God enters feeling such that the feeling derives its determination from this content. Thus faith, implanted in one’s heart, can be defended by the testimony of the indwelling spirit of truth.
Hegel’s thoroughgoing rationalism ultimate yields a form of panentheism in which all finite beings, though distinct from natural necessity, have no existence independent from it. “There is only one Being… and things by their very nature form part of it.” God is the being in whom spirit and nature are united. Thus faith is merely an expression of a finitude comprehensible only from the rational perspective of the infinite. Faith is merely a moment in our transition to absolute knowledge.
Physics and astronomy were the primary scientific concerns for theologians in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. But in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries the sciences of geology, sociology, psychology, and biology became more pronounced.
Kant’s understanding of God as a postulate of practical reason – and his dismissal of metaphysical and empirical support for religion — soon led to the idea that God could be a mere projection of practical feeling or psychological impulse. Such an idea echoed Hobbes’s claim that religion arises from fear and superstition. Sigmund Freud claimed, for example, that religious beliefs were the result of the projection of a protective father figure onto our life situations. Although such claims about projection seem immune from falsification, the Freudian could count such an attempt to falsify itself simply as rationalization: a masking of a deeper unconscious drive.
The nineteenth century biological development most significant for theology was Charles Darwin’s theory of natural selection. It explained all human development on the basis simply of progressive adaptation or organisms to their physical environment. No reference to a mind or rational will was required to explain any human endeavor. Darwin himself once had believed in God and the immortality of the soul. But later he found that these could not count as evidence for the existence of God. He ended up an agnostic. On the one hand he felt compelled to affirm a First Cause of such an immense and wonderful universe and to reject blind chance or necessity, but on the other hand he remained skeptical of the capacities of humans “developed from a mind as low as that possessed by the lowest animals.” Such naturalistic views made it difficult to support any argument for God’s existence, particularly a design argument.
Not all nineteenth century scientific thinking, however, yielded skeptical conclusions. Emilé Durkheim, in his sociological study The Elementary Forms of Religious Life, took the scientific critiques of religion seriously, but gave them a much different interpretation. He concluded that the cultic practices of religion have the non-illusory quality of producing measurable good consequences in their adherents. Moreover, he theorized that the fundamental categories of thought, and even of science, have religious origins. Almost all the great social institutions were born of religion. He was lead to claim that “the idea of society is the soul of religion”: society derived from religious forces.
In the context of these various scientific developments, philosophical arguments about faith and reason developed in several remarkable directions in the nineteenth century.
Friedrich Schleiermacher was a liberal theologian who was quite interested in problems of biblical interpretation. He claimed that religion constituted its own sphere of experience, unrelated to scientific knowledge. Thus religious meaning is independent of scientific fact. His Romantic fideism would have a profound influence on Kierkegaard.
Karl Marx is well known as an atheist who had strong criticisms of all religious practice. Much of his critique of religion had been derived from Ludwig Feuerbach, who claimed that God is merely a psychological projection meant to compensate for the suffering people feel. Rejecting wholesale the validity of such wishful thinking, Marx claimed not only that all sufferings are the result of economic class struggle but that they could be alleviated by means of a Communist revolution that would eliminate economic classes altogether. Moreover, Marx claimed that religion was a fundamental obstacle to such a revolution, since it was an “opiate” that kept the masses quiescent. Religious beliefs thus arise from a cognitive malfunction: they emerge from a “perverted world consciousness.” Only a classless communist society, which Marx thought would emerge when capitalism met its necessary demise, would eliminate religion and furnish true human emancipation.
Søren Kierkegaard, arguably the father of existentialism, was a profound religious thinker. He came up with an unequivocal view of faith and reason much like Tertullian’s strong incompatibilism. If Kant argued for religion within the limits of reason alone, Kierkegaard called for reason with the limits of religion alone. Faith requires a leap. It demands risk. All arguments that reason derives for a proof of God are in fact viciously circular: one can only reason about the existence of an object that one already assumes to exist. Hegel tried to claim that faith could be elevated to the status of objective certainty. Seeking such certainly, moreover, Kierkegaard considered a trap: what is needed is a radical trust. The radical trust of faith is the highest virtue one can reach.
Kierkegaard claimed that all essential knowledge intrinsically relates to an existing individual. In Either/Or, he outlined three general forms of life individuals can adopt: the aesthetic, ethical, and ethico-religious. The aesthetic is the life that seeks pleasure. The ethical is that which stresses the fulfillment of duties. Neither of these attains to the true individuality of human existence. But in the ethico-religious sphere, truth emerges in the authenticity of the relationship between a person and the object of his attention. With authenticity, the importance is on the “how,” not the “what,” of knowledge. It attains to a subjective truth, in which the sincerity and intensity of the commitment is key. This authenticity is equivalent to faith understood as “an objective uncertainty held fast in an appropriation-process of the most passionate inwardness.” The coexistence of this “objective uncertainty” with “passionate inwardness” is strikingly paradoxical. Kierkegaard makes a similarly paradoxical claim in holding that “nothing historical can become infinitely certain for me except the fact of my own existence (which again cannot become infinitely certain for any other individual, who has infinite certainty only of his own existence) and this is not something historical.” Thus faith can never be a matter of objective certainty; it involves no reckoning of probabilities, it is not an intellectual acceptance of a doctrine at all. Faith involves a submission of the intellect. It is not only hostile to but also completely beyond the grasp of reason.
Though he never read Kierkegaard, Friedrich Nietzsche came up with remarkable parallels to his thought. Both stressed the centrality of the individual, a certain disdain for public life, and a hatred of personal weakness and anonymity. They also both attacked certain hypocrisies in Christendom and the overstated praise for reason in Kant and Hegel. But Nietzsche had no part of Kierkegaard’s new Christian individual, and instead defended the aesthetic life disdained by Kierkegaard against both morality and Christianity. So he critique religion not from Kierkegaard’s epistemological perspective, but from a highly original moral perspective.
Nietzsche claimed that religion breeds hostility to life, understood broadly as will to power. Religion produces two types of character: a weak servile character that is at the same time strongly resentful towards those in power, and an Übermensch, or superman, who creates his own values. In The Joyful Wisdom Nietzsche proclaims that God as a protector of the weak, though once alive, is now dead, and that we have rightly killed him. Now, instead, he claims that we instead need to grasp the will to power that is part of all things and guides them to their full development completely within the natural world. For humans Nietzsche casts the will to power as a force of artistic and creative energy.
Roman Catholics traditionally claimed that the task of reason was to make faith intelligible. In the later part of the nineteenth century, John Cardinal Newman worked to defend the power of reason against those intellectuals of his day who challenged its efficacy in matters of faith. Though maintaining the importance of reason in matters of faith, he reduces its ability to arrive at absolute certainties.
In his Grammar of Assent, Newman argued that one assents to God on the basis of one’s experience and principles. And one can do this by means of a kind of rational demonstration. And yet this demonstration is not actually reproducible by others; each of us has a unique domain of experience and expertise. Some are just given the capacity and opportunities to make this assent to what is demonstrated others are not. Drawing for Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, Newman argues that “a special preparation of mind is required for each separate department of inquiry and discussion.” He stressed the continuity between religious belief and other kinds of belief that involve complex sets of phenomena. He claims that Locke, for example, overlooked how human nature actually works, imposing instead his own idea of how the mind is to act on the basis of deduction from evidence. If Locke would have looked more closely at experience, he would have noticed that much of our reasoning is tacit and informal. It cannot usually be reconstructed for a set of premises. Rather it is the accumulation of probabilities, independent of each other, arising out of the circumstances of the particular case. No specific consideration usually suffices to generate the required conclusion, but taken together, they may converge upon it. This is usually what is called a moral proof for belief in a proposition. In fact, we are justified in holding the beliefs even after we have forgotten what the warrant was. This probabilistic approach to religious assent continued in the later thinking of Basil Mitchell.
William James followed in the pragmatist tradition inaugurated by Charles Sanders Peirce. Pragmatists held that all beliefs must be tested, and those that failed to garner sufficient practical value ought to be discarded.
In his Will to Believe, James was a strong critic of W.K. Clifford’s uncompromising empiricism. Clifford, like Hume, had argued that acting on beliefs or convictions alone, unsupported by evidence, was pure folly. He likened such acting to that of an irresponsible shipowner who allows an untrustworthy ship to be ready to set sail, merely thinking it safe, and then gives “benevolent wishes” for those who would set sail in it. Clifford concluded that we have a duty to act only on well founded beliefs. If we have no grounds for belief, we must suspend judgment. This provided the basis for an ethics of belief quite different than Newman’s. Clifford’s evidentialism inspired subsequent philosophers such as Bertrand Russell and Michael Scriven.
James argued, pace Clifford, that life would be severely impoverished if we acted only on completely well founded beliefs. Like Newman, James held that belief admits of a wide spectrum of commitment: from tentative to firm. The feelings that attach to a belief are significant. He defended the need we have, at times, to allow our “passional tendencies” to influence our judgments. Thus, like Pascal, he took up a voluntarist argument for religious belief, though one not dependent solely upon a wager. There are times, admittedly few, when we must act on our beliefs passionately held but without sufficient supporting evidence. These rare situations must be both momentous, once in a lifetime opportunities, and forced, such that the situation offers the agent only two options: to act or not to act on the belief. Religious beliefs often take on both of these characteristics. Pascal had realized the forced aspect of Christian belief, regarding salvation: God would not save the disbeliever. As a result, religion James claimed that a religious belief could be a genuine hypothesis for a person to adopt.
James does, however, also give some evidential support for this choice to believe. We have faith in many things in life — in molecules, conversation of energy, democracy, and so forth — that are based on evidence of their usefulness for us. But even in these cases “Our faith is faith in some one else’s faith.” Our mental life effectively comprises a constant interplay between volitions and beliefs. Nonetheless, James believed that while philosophers like Descartes and Clifford, not wanting to ever be dupes, focused primarily on the need to avoid error, even to the point of letting truth take its chance, he as an empiricist must hold that the pursuit of truth is paramount and the avoidance of error is secondary. His position entailed that that dupery in the face of hope is better than dupery in the face of fear.
In “The Sentiment of Rationality” James concludes that faith is “belief in something concerning which doubt is still theoretically possible; and as the test of belief is willingness to act, one may say that faith is the readiness to act in a cause the prosperous issue of which is not certified to us in advance.” So, faith is not only compatible with doubt, but it requires its possibility. Faith is oriented towards action: it is a kind of “working hypothesis” needed for practical life.
Darwins’s scientific thesis of natural selection and Freud’s projective views of God continued to have a profound impact on many aspects of the philosophy of religion in the twentieth century. In fact the interplay between faith and reason began to be cast, in many cases, simply as the conflict between science and religion.
Not all scientific discoveries were used to invoke greater skepticism about the validity of religious claims, however. For example, in the late twentieth century some physicists endorsed what came to be called the anthropic principle. The principle derives from the claim of some physicists that a number of factors in the early universe had to coordinate in a highly statistically improbable way to produce a universe capable of sustaining advanced life forms. Among the factors are the mass of the universe and the strengths of the four basic forces (electromagnetism, gravitation, and the strong and weak nuclear forces). It is difficult to explain this fine tuning. Many who adhere to the anthropic principle, such as Holmes Rolston, John Leslie, and Stephen Hawking, argue that it demands some kind of extra-natural explanation. Some think it suggests possibilities for a new design argument for God’s existence. However, one can hold the anthropic principle and still deny that it has religious implications. It is possible to argue that it indicates not a single creator creating a single universe, but indeed many universes, either contemporaneous with our own or in succession to it.
The twentieth century witnessed numerous attempts to reconcile religious belief with new strands of philosophical thinking and with new theories in science.
Many philosophers of religion in the twentieth century took up a new appreciation for the scope and power of religious language. This was prompted to a large extent by the emphasis on conceptual clarity that dominated much Western philosophy, particularly early in the century.
This emphasis on conceptual clarity was evidenced especially in logical positivism. A.J. Ayer and Antony Flew, for example, argued that all metaphysical language fails to meet a standard of logical coherence and is thus meaningless. Metaphysical claims are not in principle falsifiable. As such, their claims are neither true nor false. They make no verifiable reference to the world. Religious language shares these characteristics with metaphysical language. Flew emphasized that religious believers generally cannot even state the conditions under which they would give up their faith claims. Since their claims then are unfalsifiable, they are not objects for rational determination.
One response by compatibilists to these arguments of logical positivists was to claim that religious beliefs, though meaningless in the verificational sense, are nonetheless important in providing the believer with moral motivations and self-understanding. This is an anti-realist understanding of faith. An example of this approach is found in R.M. Hare. Responding to Flew, he admitted that religious faith consists of a set of unfalsifiable assumptions, which he termed “bliks.” But Hare argued that our practical dealings with the everyday world involve numerous such “bliks.” Though some of these principles are faulty, we cannot but have some in order to live in the world.
Basil Mitchell responded to Flew’s claim that religious beliefs cannot be falsified. Mitchell argued that although rational and scientific considerations can and ought at times to prompt revisions of one’s religious belief, no one can give a general determination of exactly at what point a set of evidence ought to count decisively against a faith claim. It is up to each believer to decide when this occurs. To underscore this claim, Mitchell claimed that the rationality of religious beliefs ought to be determined not foundationally, as deductions from rational first principles, but collectively from the gathering of various types of evidence into a pattern. Nonetheless, he realized that this accumulation of evidence, as the basis for a new kind of natural theology, might not be strong enough to counter the skeptic. In the spirit of Newman, Mitchell concluded by defending a highly refined cumulative probabilism in religious belief.
Another reaction against logical positivism stemmed from Ludwig Wittgenstein. In his “Lectures on Religious Belief,” he argued that there is something unique about the linguistic framework of religious believers. Their language makes little sense to outsiders. Thus one has to share in their form of life in order to understand the way the various concepts function in their language games. The various language games form a kind of “family resemblance.” Wittgenstein concluded that those who demand a nonperspectival impartial way of assessing the truth value of a religious claim are asking for something impossible. From Wittgenstein’s perspective, science and religion are just two different types of language games. This demand to take on an internal perspective in order to assess religious beliefs commits Wittgenstein to a form of incompatibilism between faith and reason. Interpreters of Wittgenstein, like Norman Malcolm, claimed that although this entails that religious beliefs are essentially groundless, so are countless other everyday beliefs, such as in the permanence of our objects of perception, in the uniformity of nature, and even in our knowledge of our own intentions.
Wittgenstein, like Kierkegaard, claimed that proofs for God’s existence have little to do with actual belief in God. He did think that life itself could “educate” us about God’s existence. In Culture and Value he claims that sufferings can have a great impact on one’s beliefs. “These neither show us God in the way a sense impression shows us an object, nor do they give rise to conjectures about him. Experiences, thoughts–life can force this concept on us.” D.Z. Phillips also holds the view that religion has its own unique criteria for acceptable belief.
John Hick, in Faith and Knowledge, modifies the Wittgensteinian idea of forms of life to analyze faith claims in a novel manner. Hick claimed that this could shed light upon the epistemological (fides) analysis of faith. From such an analysis follows the non-epistemological thinking (fiducia) that guides actual practice.
Taking up the epistemological analysis, Hick first criticizes the voluntarisms of Pascal and James as “remote from the state of mind of such men as the great prophets.” He criticizes James in particular for reducing truth to utility. Hick argues instead for the importance of rational certainty in faith. He posits that there are as many types of grounds for rational certainty as there are kinds of objects of knowledge. He claims that religious beliefs share several crucial features with any empirical claim: they are propositional; they are objects of assent; an agent can have dispositions to act upon them; and we feel convictions for them when they are challenged. Nonetheless, Hick realizes that there are important ways in which sense beliefs and religious beliefs are distinct: sense perception is coercive, while religious perception is not; sense perception is universal, while religious is not; and sense perception is highly coherent within space and time, while religious awareness among different individuals is not. In fact, it may in fact be rational for a person who has not had experiences that compel belief to withhold belief in God.
From these similarities and differences between faith claims and claims of reason, Hick concludes that religious faith is the noninferential and unprovable basic interpretation either of a moral or religious “situational significance” in human experience. Faith is not the result of logical reasoning, but rather a profession that God “as a living being” has entered into the believer’s experience. This act of faith situates itself in the person’s material and social environment. Religious faith interprets reality in terms of the divine presence within the believer’s human experience. Although the person of faith may be unable to prove or explain this divine presence, his or her religious belief still acquire the status of knowledge similar to that of scientific and moral claims. Thus even if one could prove God’s existence, this fact alone would be a form of knowledge neither necessary nor sufficient for one’s faith. It would at best only force a notional assent. Believers live by not by confirmed hypotheses, but by an intense, coercive, indubitable experience of the divine.
Sallie McFague, in Models of God, argues that religious thinking requires a rethinking of the ways in which religious language employs metaphor. Religious language is for the most part neither propositional nor assertoric. Rather, it functions not to render strict definitions, but to give accounts. To say, for example, “God is mother,” is neither to define God as a mother nor to assert an identity between them, but rather to suggest that we consider what we do not know how to talk about–relating to God – through the metaphor of a mother. Moreover, no single metaphor can function as the sole way of expressing any aspect of a religious belief.
Many Protestant and Roman Catholic theologians in the twentieth century responded to the criticisms of religious belief, leveled by atheistic existentialists, naturalists, and linguistic positivists, by forging a new understanding of Christian revelation.
Karl Barth, a Reformed Protestant, provided a startlingly new model of the relation between faith and reason. He rejected Schleiermacher’s view that the actualization of one’s religious motivation leads to some sort of established union between man and God. Barth argued instead that revelation is aimed at a believer who must receive it before it is a revelation. This means that one cannot understand a revelation without already, in a sense, believing it. God’s revelation of Himself, His very communication of that self, is not distinct from Himself. “In God’s revelation God’s Word is identical with God Himself” (in Church Dogmatics ii, I). Moreover, Barth claimed that God’s revelation has its reality and truth wholly and in every respect, both ontically and noetically, within itself. Revelation cannot be made true by anything else. The fullness of the “original self-existent being of God’s Word” reposes and lives in revelation. This renders the belief in an important way immune from both critical rational scrutiny and the reach of arguments from analogy.
Barth held, however, that relative to the believer, God remains “totally other” (totaliter aliter). Our selfhood stands in contradiction to the divine nature. Religion is, in fact, “unbelief”: our attempts to know God from our own standpoint are wholly and entirely futile. This was a consistent conclusion of his dialectical method: the simultaneous affirmation and negation of a given theological point. Barth was thus an incompatibilist who held that the ground of faith lies beyond reason. Yet he urged that a believer is nonetheless always to seek knowledge and that religious beliefs have marked consequences for daily life.
Karl Rahner, arguably the most influential Catholic theologian of the twentieth century, was profoundly influenced by Barth’s dialectical method. But Rahner argued that God’s mystical self-revelation of Himself to us through an act of grace is not predestined for a few but extends to all persons: it constitutes the “supernatural existential” that grounds all intelligibility and action. It lies beyond proof or demonstration. Thus all persons, living in this prior and often unthematized state of God’s gift, are “anonymous Christians.” All humans can respond to God’s self-communication in history. Rahner held thus that previous religions embodied a various forms of knowledge of God and thus were lawful religions. But now God has revealed his fullness to humans through the Christian Incarnation and word. This explicit self-realization is the culmination of the history of the previously anonymous Christianity. Christianity now understands itself as an absolute religion intended for all. This claim itself is basic for its understanding of itself.
Rahner’s claim about the gratuitous gifts of grace in all humans reaches beyond a natural theology. Nonetheless one form of evidence to which he appeals for its rational justification is the stipulation that humans, social by nature, cannot achieve a relationship to God “in an absolutely private interior reality.” The individual must encounter the natural divine law, not in his role as a “private metaphysician” but according to God’s will in a religious and social context. Rahner thus emphasized the importance of culture as a medium in which religious faith becomes understood. He thus forged a new kind of compatibilism between faith and rationality.
Paul Tillich, a German Protestant theologian, developed a highly original form of Christian apologetics. In his Systematic Theology, he laid out a original method, called correlation, that explains the contents of the Christian faith through existential questions and theological answers in mutual interdependence. Existential questions arise from our experiences of transitoriness, finitude, and the threat of nonbeing. In this context, faith is what emerges as our thinking about our “ultimate concern.” Only those who have had these kinds of experiences can raise the questions that open them to understand the meaning of the Christian message. Secular culture provides numerous media, such as poetry, drama, and novels, in which these questions are engendered. In turn, the Christian message provides unique answers to these questions that emerge from our human existence. Tillich realized that such an existentialist method – with its high degree of correlation between faith and everyday experience and thus between the human and the divine — would evoke protest from thinkers like Barth.
Steven Cahn approaches a Christian existentialism from less sociological and a more psychological angle than Tillich. Cahn agrees with Kierkegaard’s claim that most believers in fact care little about proofs for the existence of God. Neither naturalist nor supernaturalist religion depend upon philosophical proofs for God’s existence. It is impossible to prove definitely the testimony of another’s supposedly self-validating experience. One is always justified in entertaining either philosophical doubts concerning the logical possibility of such an experience or practical doubts as to whether the person has undergone it. Moreover, these proofs, even if true, would furnish the believer with no moral code. Cahn concludes that one must undergo a self-validating experience personal experience in which one senses the presence of God. All moral imperatives derive from learning the will of God. One may, however, join others in a communal effort to forge a moral code.
The Darwinistic thinking of the nineteenth century continued to have a strong impact of philosophy of religion. Richard Dawkins in his Blind Watchmaker, uses the same theory of natural selection to construct an argument against the cogency of religious faith. He argues that the theory of evolution by gradual but cumulative natural selection is the only theory that is in principle capable of explaining the existence of organized complexity in the world. He admits that this organized complexity is highly improbable, yet the best explanation for it is still a Darwinian worldview. Dawkins even claims that Darwin effectively solved the mystery of our own existence. Since religions remain firm in their conviction that God guides all biological and human development, Dawkins concludes that religion and science are in fact doomed rivals. They make incompatible claims. He resolves the conflict in favor of science.
Contemporary philosophers of religion respond to the criticisms of naturalists, like Dawkins, from several angles.
Alvin Plantinga thinks that natural selection demonstrates only the function of species survival, not the production of true beliefs in individuals. Yet he rejects traditional Lockean evidentialism, the view that a belief needs adequate evidence as a criterion for its justification. But he refuses to furnish a fideist or existentialist condition for the truth of religious beliefs. Rather he claims that religious beliefs are justified without reasons and are, as such, “properly basic.” These he sets in contrast to the claims of natural theology to form the basis of his “Reformed epistemology.” Other Reformed epistemologists are W.P Alston and Nicholas Wolterstorff.
Plantinga builds his Reformed epistemology by means of several criticisms of evidentialism. First, the standards of evidence in evidentialism are usually set too high. Most of our reliable everyday beliefs are not subject to such strict standards. Second, the set of arguments that evidentialists attack is traditionally very narrow. Plantinga suggest that they tend to overlook much of what is internally available to the believer: important beliefs concerning beauty and physical attributes of creatures, play and enjoyment, morality, and the meaning of life. Third, those who employ these epistemological criticisms often fail to realize that the criticisms themselves rest upon auxiliary assumptions that are not themselves epistemological, but rather theological, metaphysical, or ontological. Finally, and more importantly, not all beliefs are subject to such evidence. Beliefs in memories or other minds, for example, generally appeal to something properly basic beyond the reach of evidence. What is basic for a religious belief can be, for example, a profound personal religious experience. In short, being self-evident, incorrigible, or evident to the senses is not a necessary condition of proper basicality. We argue to what is basic from below rather than from above. These claims are tested by a relevant set of “internal markers.” Plantinga does admit that in fact no widespread acceptance of the markers can be assumed. He concludes, though, that religious believers cannot be accused of shirking some fundamental epistemic duty by relying upon this basic form of evidence.
Epistemological views such as Plantinga develops entail that there is an important distinction between determining whether or not a religious belief is true (de facto) and whether or not one ought to hold or accept it (de jure). On de jure grounds, for example, one can suggest that beliefs are irrational because they are produced either by a errant process or by an proper process aimed at the wrong aim or end. Theism has been criticized on both of these grounds. But since Christianity purports to be true, the de jure considerations must reduce ultimately to de facto considerations.
J.J. Haldane criticizes the scientific critiques of religion on the grounds that they themselves make two unacknowledged assumptions about reality: the existence of regular patterns of interaction, and the reality of stable intelligences in humans. These assumptions themselves cannot be proven by scientific inquiry. Thus it seems odd to oppose as rivals scientific and religious ways of thinking about reality. Science itself is faith-like in resting upon these assumptions; theology carries forward a scientific impulse in asking how the order of the world is possible. But what do we make of the fact that scientific models often explain the world better than religious claims? What troubles Haldane is the explanatory reductionism physical sciences employ is often thought to be entailed by the ontological reduction it assumes. For example, the fact that one can give a complete description of human action and development on a biological level alone is often thought to mean that all action and development can be explained according to biological laws. Haldane rejects this thesis, arguing that certain mental events might be ontologically reducible to physical events, but talk of physical events cannot be equally substituted for mental events in the order of explanation. Such argumentation reflects the general direction of the anomological monism proposed by Donald Davidson. Haldane concludes that language can be a unique source of explanatory potential for all human activity.
Like Haldane, Nancey Murphy also holds for a new form of compatibilism between religion and science. In Science and Theology she argues that the differences between scientific and theological methodologies are only of degree, not kind. She admits that scientific methodology has fundamentally changed the way we think about the world. Consequently, theology in the modern period has been preoccupied with the question of theological method. But she thinks that theological method can develop to meet the same standard of criteria as scientific method has.
Scientific thinking in the twentieth century in particular has been developing away from foundationalism: the derivation of theories from indubitable first principles. Willard van Orman Quine and others urged that scientific methodologists give up on foundationalism. He claimed that knowledge is like a web or net of beliefs: some beliefs are simply more apt to be adopted or rejected in certain situations than others are. Murphy sees that theology, too, is developing away from the foundationalism that literal interpretations of Scripture used to provide. Now it tends to emphasize the importance of religious experience and the individual interpretation of beliefs. But two problems await the move from theology away from foundationalism: subjectivism and circularity. The subjectivism emerges from the believer’s inability to make the leap from his or her private inner experience to the real world. The circularity emerges from the lack of any kind of external check on interpretation. Alasdair MacIntyre is concerned with the latter problem. He claims that evidence for belief requires a veridical experience for each subsequent belief that arises from it. But Murphy finds this approach still close to foundationalism. Instead she develops two non-foundational criteria for the interpretation of a religious belief: that several related but differing experiences give rise to the belief, and that the belief have publicly observable consequences emanating from it.
To illustrate this approach to interpretation of beliefs, Murphy considers Catherine of Siena’s claim that a true “verification” of a revelation from God requires that the believer subsequently engage in publicly observable acts of humility and charity. The verification also requires what Murphy calls discernment. Discernment reveals analogous experiences and interpretations in other believers and a certain reliability in the actions done. It functions the same way that a theory of instrumentation does in science. Discernment often takes place within a community of some sort.
But are these beliefs, supported by this indirect verification and communal discernment, still in any sense falsifiable? Murphy notes that religious experience has clashed with authoritative theological doctrine numerous times. But it has also ended up correcting it, for example in the way that Catherine of Siena’s writings eventually changed the Roman Catholic tradition in which she was writing.
Murphy claims, however, that until theology takes on the status as a kind of knowledge of a reality independent of the human subject it is unlikely that theology and science will have a fruitful dialogue. But she thinks that turning from the subjectivization of the liberal turn in theology to discourse about human religiosity will help this dialogue.
A strong critic of the negative impact of scientific naturalism on faith is the Canadian philosopher Charles Taylor. Taylor finds in all naturalisms a kind of “exclusive humanism” that not only puts humans at the center of the universe, but denies them any authentic aspirations to goals or states beyond the world in which they live. In modernity naturalism has led inexorably to secularization. In Sources of the Self, Taylor argues that secularization, inspired by both Luther and Calvin, first resulted in the prioritizing of “ordinary life” of marriage and family over that of contemplative lives in the vowed or clerical state. In later phases it led to the transformation of cultural practices into forms that are neutral with regard to religious affiliation. But secularization is not a prima facie problem for any religious believer, since it does not preclude the possibility of religious faith or practices per se. Moreover, secularization has made possible the development of legal and governmental structures, such as human rights, better fit for pluralistic societies containing persons of a number of different religious faiths. Thus it has made it easier for Christians to accept full rights for atheists or violators of the Christian moral code. Nonetheless, Taylor sees problems that secularism poses for the Christian faith. It can facilitate a marriage between the Christian faith and a particular form of culture.
In contrast to naturalism, Taylor urges the adoption of a unique transcendental point of view. Such a view does not equate a meaningful life with a full or good life. Instead, a transcendental view finds in suffering and death not only something that matters beyond life, but something from which life itself originally draws. Thus natural life is to be subordinated to the “abundant life” that Jesus advocates in his Good Shepherd discourse (John 10:10). This call of the transcendental requires, ultimately, a conversion or a change of identity. This is a transition from self-centeredness, a kind of natural state, to God-centeredness. Unable to find value in suffering and death, those who focus on ordinary life try assiduously to avoid them. The consequences of this resistance to the transcendent, found in this uncritical embrace of ordinary life, are not so much epistemic as moral and spiritual. Ordinary life virtues emphasize benevolence and solidarity. But modern individuals, trying to meet these demands, experience instead a growing sense of anger, futility, and even contempt when confronted with the disappointments of actual human performance. This is ordinary life’s “dialectics of reception.” A transcendental vision, on the other hand, opens up a future for humans that is not a matter of guarantee, but only faith. It is derived from “standing among others in the stream” of God’s unconditional love.
The theological principle by which Taylor buttresses this vision is that “Redemption happens through Incarnation.” The incarnational and natural “ordinary” requires always the call of a redemptive “beyond” that is the object of our endeavors inspired by faith and hope.
Liberation theologians, such as Juan Segundo and Leonardo Boff, have drawn their inspiration from the plight of the poverty and injustice of peoples in the Third World, particularly Latin American. Drawing from Marx’s distinction between theory and practice, Gustavo Gutiérrez, in A Theology of Liberation, argues that theology is critical reflection on the socio-cultural situation in which belief takes place. Ultimately theology is reactive: it does not produce pastoral practice, but it finds the Spirit either present or absent in current practices. The reflection begins by examining the faith of a people is expressed through their acts of charity: their life, preaching, and historical commitment of the Church. The reflection also draws from the totality of human history. In a second moment, the reflection provides resources for new practices. Thus it protects the faith of the people from uncritical practices of fetishism and idolatry. Theology thus plays a prophetic role, by interpreting historical events with the intention of revealing and proclaiming their profound meaning.
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Last updated: October 22, 2008 | Originally published: