The Buddhist ideologue Fazang (Fa-tsang) stands as one of the foremost figures of medieval Chinese Buddhism. He lived at the very pinnacle of Chinese Buddhism among towering figures such as the legendary pilgrim and Yogacara (Faxiang) master Xuanzang (602-664), the Chan patriarch Shenxiu (d. 706) and the great chronicler Daoxuan (596-667). According to Song dynasty biographer Zanning, he was “mysterious and upright, by nature surpassingly clever and sagacious.” For the better part of his life, he worked in close proximity with the highest echelons of imperial power, deeply engaged in matters of court and country. For four decades, under a series of emperors, he served as a lecturer, a translator, a rhetorician, a propagandist, and a miracleworker. Tirelessly, he lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, translated Buddhist sutras from Sanskrit and Khotanese (a Middle Iranian language once spoken in what is now China’s Xinjiang province) into Chinese, and wrote meticulously crafted commentaries interpreting Buddhist scripture in a manner that served to exalt his imperial patron’s status. Shortly after his death, the emperor Ruizong (r. 684-690, 710-712) praised him effusively: “The late monk Fazang inherited his virtuous karma from the Heavens and his open intelligence accorded with principle. With his eloquence and outstanding understanding, he had his mind interfused with penetrating enlightenment.” He would become known as the third patriarch and systematizer of the Flower Garland (Huayan or Hua-yen) school of Buddhism.
Fazang was a native of Sogdiana (in Chinese, Sute). This is an Iranian civilization that encompassed territories now incorporated into the modern states of Uzbekistan and Tajikistan in Central Asia. As a youth, he embraced Buddhism with fervent devotion; at sixteen, he burned off one of his fingers as an offering to the Buddha before the Aśokan reliquary in the famous Famen Temple in the Tang dynasty capital of Chang’an. Thereafter, he became a recluse on nearby Mount Taibai, where he encountered masters of the Flower Garland (Avatamsaka) Sutra. Returning to Chang’an to attend to his ailing parents, he encountered Zhiyan (602-668) and became his student and disciple. Fazang was constantly called upon to explicate the profound wonders contained in the Flower Garland Sutra, lecturing to clergy and rulers more than thirty times.
Like many eminent Buddhists, a mystical aura has grown around Fazang in subsequent hagiography. One must investigate with a careful and critical eye the many miracles and legends that surround his person. Some of the purported miracles were closely associated with his oratory prowess. In 689, when he delivered his lecture on the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a piece of auspicious ice was discovered in which, it is said, an image of “twinned pagodas” appeared. When Śiksānanda and he were translating the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a hundred-petaled lotus flower blossomed in front of the translation hall. After lectures in 692 and 696, light allegedly issued from Fazang’s mouth, prompting the congregated faithful to marvel. On other occasions, following his lectures, it is said that flowers fell from the heavens and five-colored clouds accumulated in the skies.
Fazang appears to have been a practitioner of esoteric Buddhism, which many East Asian rulers believed commanded magical powers. In 697, the throne requested that he use Buddhist scriptural magic to help defeat the Khitan, a proto-Mongolian ethnic group that once dominated what is now Manchuria. Fazang performed a ritual cleansing, changed clothes, set an eleven-faced image of the bodhisattva (an enlightened being who selflessly seeks to aid others) Guanyin (Kuan-yin) on a ritual platform, and worked his magic. Heavenly drums echoed, the image of Guanyin appeared on high, surveying the countless divine troops who materialized to combat the raiders, inspiring the Zhou forces and plunging the Khitan into despair. This triumph prompted the empress Wu Zhao to exclaim, “This is the blessed aegis of Buddha force!” and change the reign era name to Shengong (“Divine Merit”).
He was also renowned as a conjurer, capable of summoning weather. On multiple occasions, his prayers and rites brought timely rain to alleviate drought. In 687, at the empress’ behest, he prayed for rain, fasting for seven days, until the skies fortuitously opened and drenched the parched ground. Again, in 696, his prayers proved effective in bringing salubrious rain to afflicted Yongzhou. In 702, Fazang invited another monk to pray at Wuzhen Temple in Lantian, which had no spring. After three dawns of reciting sutras, a freshet suddenly jetted forth at Maitreya Pavilion, bringing vernal bounty to the surrounding lands. Under the emperor Zhongzong, when drought struck Chang’an, Fazang prayed and performed Buddhist rites for seven days, finally bringing a downpour. The following year his prayers for rain were successful once again. Under the emperor Ruizong, he relieved drought and snowless winter, his sincere prayers brought down a blizzard.
In spite of his impressive monastic, scholastic, and thaumaturgical credentials, Fazang was no detached ascetic who speculated on matters recondite and metaphysical. Under Wu Zhao (a.k.a. Empress Wu or Wu Zetian, 624-705, r. 690-705), the only female emperor in Chinese history, the Buddhist clergy was politicized as never before. Contending against a Confucian tradition that stridently opposed her assumption of power, Wu Zhao naturally sought validation for her sovereignty in Buddhism. She styled herself in Buddhist terms as a cakravartin (a universal wheel-turning monarch) and a living bodhisattva. A brilliant orator, lecturer, ideologue, rhetorician and translator, Fazang was one of many Buddhist ideologues who helped sanction her sovereignty. He differed from the vast majority of her other Buddhist supporters in that he was an independent-minded and profound thinker who lectured to Wu Zhao, rather than mustering rhetoric for her. The remarkable duration and depth of their mutual commitment also stands out. For better than three decades, beginning when he preached the Flower Garland Sutra on behalf of her recently deceased mother, he applied his abundant talents toward enhancing Wu Zhao’s reputation as a Buddhist ruler.
At a pivotal juncture of Wu Zhao’s political ascent, as part of a grand ceremony early in 689 that anticipated the inauguration of her Zhou dynasty by a single year, she ordered Fazang to convene a dharma assembly and, from an elevated seat, expound upon the Flower Garland Sutra to thousands of Buddhist monks and nuns congregated for the event. When Fazang delivered a lecture at Buddha’s Prophecy Temple in Luoyang in 700 (shortly after the completion of his new translation of the Flower Garland Sutra), the ground of the lecture hall and temple purportedly shook. Rather than interpreting this earthquake in Confucian fashion, as an inauspicious disharmony of the elements, Wu Zhao understood it as a wondrous event, praising Fazang:
Because he has extended the knowledge of the subtle and profound; disseminated wisdom on the mysterious and abstruse, on the first day of translation, I dreamed that sweet dew descended as an auspicious sign. On the morning of the lecture I felt the earth tremor, a miraculous sign. This, then, was the footfall of the Future Buddha, Maitreya, using the mandala as a lucky icon.
This marriage of ideology and power did not end happily. In Wu Zhao’s turn toward Daoist expiatory rites and longevity potions during her final years, Fazang felt a shift in his patron’s imperial favor. In early 705, Fazang transported the sacred finger-bone of the Buddha from Famen Temple to Luoyang, where Wu Zhao placed him in charge of the relic veneration ceremony, which she believed might ameliorate her declining health. In this official capacity, which provided him access to her person and to the Forbidden City, Fazang worked in tandem with conspirators from the court and betrayed his longstanding patron Wu Zhao, supporting the coup that removed her in 705. A political opportunist, he continued to promote Flower Garland Buddhism serving under emperors Zhongzong (r. 684, 705-710), Ruizong, and Xuanzong (r. 712-756). Curiously, his treachery, to no small extent, saved Buddhism from being identified as a rogue ideology used to validate one whom the Confucian establishment styled an illegitimate female usurper.
Fazang’s successful promotion and propagation of Flower Garland Buddhism under successive rulers played an important role in the subsequent spread, development and Sinification of the school. Over a period of three decades, Fazang played a leading role in these cooperative efforts among the corps of Indian, Khotanese, Sogdian, Korean and Chinese writing translations and commentaries on Buddhist sutras. In Fazang’s epistolary correspondence with Korean Flower Garland monk Ŭisang, another disciple of his master Zhiyan, it is apparent that he attempted to propagate a worldwide state without barriers, an infinite realm linked by the Mahayana Buddhist faith. Fazang also taught another Korean monk, Shimsang, who helped transmit Chinese Flower Garland Buddhism to Japan. Ultimately, these contacts helped propagate Flower Garland Buddhism, linking it to a wider pan-Asian network
At the very heart of Flower Garland Buddhism is the idea of what is known in Sanskrit as shunyata (“emptiness”): universal interconnectedness, all-inclusiveness, intercausality and interpenetration. Fazang did a great deal to elevate Flower Garland Buddhism over rival schools, acknowledging other Buddhist schools and sutras, but championing the Flower Garland Sutra as the central teaching of the Buddha. As the Buddha’s first sermon upon attaining enlightenment, the nearly incomprehensible Flower Garland Sutra was invested with a profundity and wisdom unequalled in the Buddha’s subsequent works. In this effort, Fazang gathered and classified the rather unsystematic and wide-ranging Buddhist teachings into five categories in order of ascending profundity and power. In ascending order: Hinayana, Initial Mahayana, Final Mahayana, Sudden Teaching of the One Vehicle (proto-Zen), and, at the pinnacle, the Comprehensive Teaching of the One Vehicle—in essence, the Flower Garland Sutra. The sense of universality allowed the Flower Garland School to be compatible with other sects, effectively encompassing their doctrine, while maintaining the overarching primacy of the Flower Garland teachings.
This doctrine of interdependence is also reflected in Fazang’s thoughts on bodhicitta (mental dedication to helping all sentient beings and attaining enlightenment). Following the logic that each element pervades all that exists and itself contains all other elements in the phenomenal world, “In practicing the virtues, when one is perfected, all are perfected,” he writes, “and when one first arouses the thought of enlightenment one also becomes perfectly enlightened” (trans. Wright). Fazang’s emphasis on the omniversal generative power of the tathagatagarbha, the “womb of Buddhahood,” while not unique, subsequently developed into an important concept in the East Asian Mahayana Buddhist tradition.
So that others might better comprehend the profound doctrine of the Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang used the metaphor of the Ten Mysteries (Ten Mysterious Gates) to explicate the interconnectedness and inter-causality in the Flower Garland universe. These Ten Mysteries illustrate how seemingly contradictory pairs—the hidden and the manifest, truth and falsehood, the infinite and the infinitesimal, the general and the specific–mutually complement each other and coexist without obstruction. Indra’s net (see below) is one of the Ten Mysteries.
Fazang’s ideas of an interconnected omniverse extended easily and effectively from the metaphysical realm to the political arena. Indeed, it allowed Wu Zhao to serve as the alpha link in a cosmic concatenation. Stanley Weinstein has commented “Seeing herself as a universal monarch, she must have been attracted by the Flower Garland school with its well-ordered universe presided over by Vairocana Buddha, whose every act was reflected in countless worlds.” This integrated and totalistic vision of the cosmos was “analogous to the highly centralized imperial state that she ruled.” This ideology allowed Wu Zhao to portray herself as an absolute sovereign, all-pervasive and omnipresent. This central idea of the boundless reach of the Buddha’s power and compassion, nicely paralleled and supported the idea of the infinite compass of the ruler’s authority and benevolence. Fazang’s creative presentation and flair for theater (see below), both enhanced the great aesthetic, intellectual and philosophical appeal of his ideas and made them more comprehensible. In Wu Zhao, he found a potential cakravartin to propagate the Buddhist faith; in Fazang’s profound thought, she, in turn, discovered powerful ideological justification for her authority.
When Fazang first lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, the principles he expounded upon were so abstruse that the listeners were utterly dumbstruck. Therefore, to render the sutra comprehensible to his imperial patrons and to the masses of Buddhist faithful, he used metaphors such as Indra’s Net of Jewels and the Golden Lion. In the former, “In each of the jewels, the images of all the other jewels are reflected…the images multiply infinitely, and all these multiple images are bright and clear within a single jewel.” This concatenation, this mutual linking and inter-penetration, illustrates harmonious interconnectedness of everything. Here, causal sky net objects can not be conceived of independently: the nature of each object is defined by its place with relation to all other objects. He also devised a Hall of Mirrors to illustrate the workings of Indra’s Net and the power of the Buddha by arranging ten mirrors (corresponding with the Ten Mysterious Gates), eight in an octagon, one above and one below, with a statue of the Buddha set in the middle, the focal point of origin and return. When he lit a torch to illumine the centerpiece, an endless web of reflected light crisscrossed, creating an infinite series of images within images, each containing the entire Buddha. This demonstration made manifest the meaning of the inexhaustible interconnectedness of the universe, hence the infinite power of the Buddha.
Fazang’s most famous device of performative metaphor was a lion made of gold. The lion represents the cosmos, parts of the lion the various phenomena of the universe, while the gold represented emptiness. The lion had a mane, teeth, claws and eyes: parts that seemed distinct and unrelated. And yet the essential substance of the entire lion was the same–gold. Within each hair, paradoxically, there are infinite lions. The differences are all superficial. Such is the nature of the integrated, interconnected Flower Garland universe. After demonstrating this principle to Wu Zhao using the sculpture of a lion at the imperial palace gate around 700 (sources differ), Fazang wrote a one-chapter Essay on the Golden Lion.
In his Treatise on the Five Teachings, a house is used as a metaphor for the universe. The complex interplay between joists, uprights, roof, tenons and mortises—the sum total of structural relationships between all parts–is contained in a single rafter. The nature of the infinite can be seen in the infinitesimal. The role of the rafter–or any other component–helps one understand the interdependence of all sentient beings. Certainly, Fazang’s flair for the theatrical and his ability to convey the message to his patrons through such brilliant demonstrations, helped successfully propagate Flower Garland Buddhism.
Much of Fazang’s energy was devoted to exegetical work on and demonstrations of the Flower Garland Sutra. He produced more than sixty original works, commentaries on a wide variety of Buddhist texts, and meditation manuals, and participated in many Buddhist translation projects. Collectively, Fazang’s works and translations must be looked at not only in terms of their metaphysical and ideological merit, but as political rhetoric consciously geared toward promoting the Flower Garland school and exalting the sovereignty of his imperial sponsors. Fazang’s Treatise on the Five Teachings detailed a hierarchy of Buddhist sects, placing, of course, Flower Garland at the apex and clarifying common ideological ground.
Fazang was a propagandist. His Huayanjing zhuanji, a commentary he wrote between 690 and 693, helped provide legitimacy for Wu Zhao’s claim to be a cakravartin. Making reference to her titles as “Sage Mother” and “Divine Sovereign,” Fazang remarked, “Both sage and divine, she makes the Six Supernatural Penetrations act without stopping; infinitely good and infinitely beautiful, she displays the Ten Goodnesses beyond all limits.”
For Wu Zhao, retranslating and reinterpreting the Flower Garland Sutra was an ongoing, high-priority political activity. Fazang played a pivotal role in this effort. The Flower Garland Sutra was at the heart of a deep-rooted and longstanding Khotanese tradition of Buddhist kingship, with a Chinese lineage going from ruler Shi Hu of the Eastern Jin in the 4th century to Liang Wudi to Sui Wendi and finally to Wu Zhao. She sent emissaries to Khotan to seek the Sanskrit version of the Flower Garland Sutra. In 679, the Indian monk Divākara presented newly recovered Sanskrit sutras at Gaozong’s court. In 684, with Divākara, Fazang worked on a translation of the Flower Garland Sutra at Western Taiyuan Temple. As preparatory work for the compilation of the new Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang compared these new texts to extant translations, noting disparities and incorporating omissions. Between 695 and 699, she recruited Khotanese monks such as Śiksānanda and Devaprajña to work in tandem with Fazang, completing a new, improved Flower Garland Sutra that was eighty chapters instead of sixty. This new Flower Garland Sutra superseded the version completed in the 680s and helped confirm Wu Zhao’s identification as a cakravartin and a bodhisattva.
Norman Harry Rothschild
University of North Florida
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 13, 2006 | Originally published: