Feminist epistemology is an outgrowth of both feminist theorizing about gender and traditional epistemological concerns. Feminist epistemology is a loosely organized approach to epistemology, rather than a particular school or theory. Its diversity mirrors the diversity of epistemology generally, as well as the diversity of theoretical positions that constitute the fields of gender studies, women’s studies, and feminist theory. What is common to feminist epistemologies is an emphasis on the epistemic salience of gender and the use of gender as an analytic category in discussions, criticisms, and reconstructions of epistemic practices, norms, and ideals. While feminist epistemology is not easily and simply characterized, feminist approaches to epistemology tend to share an emphasis on the ways in which knowers are particular and concrete, rather than abstract and universalizable. Feminist epistemologies take seriously the ways in which knowers are enmeshed in social relations that are generally hierarchical while also being historically and culturally specific. In addition, feminist epistemologies assume that the ways in which knowers are constituted as particular subjects are significant to epistemological problems such as warrant, evidence, justification, and theory-construction, as well as to our understanding of terms like “objectivity,” “rationality,” and “knowledge.”
The themes which characterize feminist engagements with epistemology are not necessarily unique to feminist epistemologies, since these themes also crop up in science studies more generally, as well as in social epistemology. Feminist epistemologies are distinctive, however, in the use of gender as a category of epistemic analysis and re-construction. Feminist approaches to epistemology generally have their sources in one or more of the following traditions: feminist science studies, naturalistic epistemologies, cultural studies of science, Marxist feminism and related work in and about the social sciences, object relations theory and developmental psychology, epistemic virtue theory, postmodernism, hermeneutics, phenomenology, and pragmatism. Many feminist epistemological projects incorporate more than one of these traditions. For the sake of this entry, however, particular theorists have been segregated into these fairly arbitrary categories. The caveat here is that each particular theorist might just as well have been included under a number of different categories.
Work by Susan Bordo (1990) and Genevieve Lloyd (1984) analyzes the ways in which metaphors of masculinity operate in constructions of ideals of rationality and objectivity. Drawing on feminist discussions of object relations theory (Bordo) and of the role of the symbolic imaginary and metaphor in modern epistemological projects, both Lloyd and Bordo argue that the operations of the symbolic imaginary are implicated in the metaphysics of subjectivity and objectivity and in the characterization of epistemic problems that follow from that metaphysics. The result of the work done by these feminist historians is that ideals of reason, objectivity, autonomy, and disinterestedness operating in assumptions about inquiry, as well as the idea that the “perennial” problems of epistemology are gender neutral are now revealed to be connected to and constitutive of gender relations.
Bordo’s and Lloyd’s analyses provide resources for feminists working in science studies, as well as those working in Anglo-American analytic traditions. Much of the work in feminist epistemology is influenced by these critiques, and the emphasis that Lloyd especially places on the cognitive role of metaphor, is a starting point for much feminist work on the role of “affective” and “literary” aspects of cognition and philosophy more generally.
Susan Hekman’s (1990) work argues that dualisms of nature/culture, rational/irrational, subject/object, and masculine/feminine underwrite modernist epistemological projects and that feminist epistemology should aim to destabilize and deconstruct those dualisms. Hekman argues that such destablization can only take place if feminists refuse the dichotomous presuppositions of the modernist project, including the dichotomy of masculine/feminine and its role in identity ascriptions. The aim, then, of feminist epistemology is both the eradication of epistemology as a going concern with issues of truth, rationality, and knowledge and the undermining of gender categories.
Critics of feminist epistemology have charged that feminist critiques of rationality amount to a valorization of irrationality, a charge that misses the point of these critiques. If our ideals of rationality are to be interrogated and reconstructed, then, presumably, our ideals of irrationality will be so reconstructed as well, since the operative premise of Bordo’s, Lloyd’s and Hekman’s analyses are that the dichotomy of rationality and irrationality help to constitute the dualism of masculine/feminine and vice-versa. Thus, what critics take to be a valorization of irrationality can only appear so if those dichotomies remain in place.
Much of the initial work in feminist epistemology grew out of feminist critiques of, and engagement with, science. This work generally emphasizes the ways in which science has been marked by gender bias, not only in the fact that women are seriously underrepresented in the sciences, but also in the ways in which assumptions about gendered behavior serve an evidential role in dominant and widely accepted theories in such fields as anthropology, biology, and psychology (Bleier, (1984), Haraway (1988, 1989), Keller (1983, 1984)).
Harding and Hintikka’s (1983) collection represents early work primarily in science studies and epistemology but also includes early work that represents one of the primary and unique contributions of feminist epistemology: the incorporation of moral and political theory in discussions of epistemology and science.
The recognition that the process of scientific theory construction and inquiry essentially involved appeals to extra-scientific values was further developed by subsequent theorists augmenting the early critiques of gender bias in science. Rather than claiming that values and politics always compromised scientific inquiry, feminist theorists such as Nelson (1990), Longino (1990) and Harding (1986, 1991, 1998) argue that such values are always operating in evaluations of evidence, justification, and theory-construction and that trying to develop an epistemology for science that would make it less prone to gender bias requires the recognition of the ways in which values enter the process of scientific reasoning. Feminist theorists, thus, turned their attention to developing epistemologies that would allow for critical evaluation of the values that are shared, and, thus, often invisible, to inquirers in the sciences. Nelson’s work, drawing on Quine, develops a holistic approach to questions about evidence and justification, emphasizing the ways in which knowledge is held by communities, rather than by individual knowers who are abstractable members of such communities. Helen Longino argues for the value of pluralism in the construction of scientific models as a way of making the values and assumptions of scientific communities accessible for critical evaluation. Harding uses Marxist analysis to develop a feminist version of standpoint theory.
What these approaches to feminist science studies emphasize is that good science is not value-free science, since values are ineradicable from the process of scientific inquiry and theory-construction. Instead, they argue that good science is science that can critically evaluate the values and assumptions that operate epistemically in scientific theory construction and in the ways in which scientific problems are formulated. Good science is a science that can develop mechanisms for critically evaluating, not only the results of inquiry, but also the ways in which those results depend upon a raft of value-laden and theory-laden assumptions and facts.
Part of the problem with these approaches (with the exception of standpoint epistemologies, which are discussed in more detail below), however, is that they have few theoretical resources for dealing with questions about how such diversity can be brought into scientific theorizing, and how one could, in principle, exclude groups with commitments or values that are, on the face of it, anti-scientific (e.g. magic) or unpalatable in other ways (e.g. Nazi science). If the value of pluralism is that it would allow for the critical reflection necessary for ensuring that the values and commitments that enter scientific inquiry are visible, then on what grounds could one exclude, for example, creationism? Feminist epistemology that draws on work in science studies has revealed the ways in which it is individuals in communities who know and how such communities operate with a variety of value commitments that make knowledge possible. However, the issue about methodological pluralism remains a difficult one.
Feminist naturalized epistemologies have developed as a way of taking account of the fact that knowers are located in “epistemic spaces” and the ways in which knowledge is more properly understood on a community rather than an individual model. Naturalism is defined here as an approach to epistemology that focuses on causal accounts of knowledge, and in the case of feminist naturalism, these causal accounts also include social, political, and historical factors. Primarily, feminist naturalism seeks to emphasize the ways in which cultural and historical factors can enable, rather than distort, knowledge. Feminist naturalism is itself a rather loosely organized category, with some approaches privileging scientific naturalism and others placing science within the broader scope of human epistemic endeavors. Feminist naturalist approaches by Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1990) and Louise Antony (Antony and Witt 1993) try to develop Quinean naturalism in ways that are consistent with feminist insights about the epistemic relevance of gender and social relations; other feminist epistemologists, such as Elizabeth Potter (1995, 2001), draw on sociological and historical work (in Potter’s case, specifically work on Robert Boyle) to develop naturalistic accounts of theory construction and choice. Work by Alison Wylie (1999) develops feminist naturalistic analyses of the scientific practices of archaeology. The work of Lorraine Code (1987, 1991, 1995, 1996) can also be characterized as a form of feminist naturalized epistemology; this work is discussed in greater detail in the section on Epistemic Virtue Theories below. Nancy Tuana (2003) has developed Charles Mills’s concept of “epistemologies of ignorance” by looking at the ways in which ignorance, rather than knowledge, is constructed by studies of sexuality and public school sex education programs.
Feminist naturalized approaches, like non-feminist naturalized approaches, often come to grief over the status of normativity in the construction of theory, since, traditionally, the naturalistic impulse is to provide a descriptive account of knowledge. However, without an appeal to the ways in which sexism, racism, or homophobia might deform knowledge practices, feminist epistemology would appear to have few resources for arguing that present cultural and historical conditions should be changed, since there is no way to show that these are inherently unreliable or objectionable. Feminist naturalized epistemologies differ in how seriously they take this problem. Some theorists take the challenge presented by this problem very seriously, while others argue that it is only a problem if we assume a strong descriptive/prescriptive or fact/value distinction. Those who take the issue seriously generally offer solutions that either emphasize the value of pluralism in epistemic pursuits or argue that the distinction between the normative and the descriptive is less clear cut than naturalism’s opponents think, thus allowing the feminist naturalist the normative resources that allow for internal critique. Furthermore, feminist naturalists often point out that scientific theories that have been motivated by feminist insights have often turned out to be more empirically reliable than those which claim to be normatively neutral.
Cultural studies of science begin with the assumption that science is a practice and that practices include both normative and descriptive components that cannot be easily separated from each other. Feminist cultural studies of science emphasize the importance of non-relativistic epistemological commitments and the importance of using revised versions of normative concepts such as “objectivity” and “evidence.” However, they recognize that, insofar as science is a practice, these concepts and their normative import are worked out in practical interactions with the material world, a position that requires that these concepts be revised in ways that are not committed to representational theories of mind and truth. Karen Barad (1999) uses an analysis of the practice of using the scanning tunneling microscope to emphasize the ways in which the boundaries between subject and object are relatively permeable and to show the ways in which observation itself is a form of practice. Her “agential realism” seeks to bridge the gap between descriptive epistemologies and normative epistemologies on the one hand, and between naïve realism and social constructivist approaches to scientific objects on the other.
Donna Haraway’s (1988) work on situated knowledges emphasizes the ways in which science is a rule-governed form of “story-telling” that aims at getting at the truth, but the idea of truth she uses here is not that of reality an sich but a reality that is produced by human material practices. Thus, she argues “facts” are in fact “artifacts” of scientific inquiry. This does not make them false, but it does render them bound up with processes of human production and human needs. Nonetheless, they maintain an ontological independence to a certain extent; this is the central insight of the analogy to other kinds of artifacts.
Feminist standpoint epistemology initially developed in the social sciences, primarily in work by Nancy Hartsock (1998) in political science and by Dorothy Smith in sociology. As a methodology for the social sciences, it emphasizes the ways in which socially and politically marginalized groups are in a position of epistemic privilege vis-à-vis social structures. Drawing on Hegel and Marx, feminist standpoint theorists in the social sciences argue that those on the “outside” of dominant social and political groups must learn not only how to get along in their own world, but also how to get along in the dominant society. Thus, they have an “outsider” status with respect to dominant groups that allows them to see things about social structures and how they function that members of the dominant group cannot see.
In philosophy, this theoretical position was developed most thoroughly by Sandra Harding (1986, 1991, 1998). Harding argues that “starting thought out” from the lives of the marginalized will lead to the development of new sets of research questions and priorities, since the marginalized enjoy a certain epistemic privilege that allows them to see problems differently, or to see problems where members of a dominant group do not. However, Harding emphasizes that one need not be a member of a marginalized group in order to be capable of starting one’s thought from that standpoint. She argues that Hegel was not a slave and Marx was not a member of the proletariat, yet they both were able to identify with the standpoint of the slave and with that of the proletariat. Thereby, they were able to start their thought out from lives very different from their own.
The concept of the “standpoint” of the marginalized is both what sets standpoint epistemology apart from a general pluralism as well as the concept that has provided the most challenges to feminist standpoint theorists. One does not occupy the “feminist standpoint,” for instance, simply in virtue of being a woman; the feminist standpoint is an achievement rather than something one is born with. One comes to occupy the feminist standpoint by engaging in critical thought about one’s experience and its relationship to larger social and political structures. By the same token, one need not be a woman in order to occupy the feminist standpoint, since, like Hegel and Marx, one can come to identify with that standpoint. However, the claim that social marginalization confers epistemic privilege seems to depend on a concept of identity that needs to be grounded in the experience of social marginalization, and this has led to charges that standpoint epistemology cannot avoid assuming a great deal of commonality in the experiences of marginalized groups. This has also led to charges that standpoint epistemology must appeal to an “essential” women’s experience or to an “essential” marginalized experience. Such an appeal, implying that there are necessary and sufficient conditions for such experiences, is considered illegitimate by many feminist and postmodernist theorists because they take it to imply that there is something about experience that is “natural” or “given” and that it can serve a foundational role in identity construction. These theorists are suspicious of the claim that there are some experiences that all and only women have that can serve as a basis for identification with that group, arguing that the category of “woman” is either too fractured or too regulative to do the work that feminist standpoint theorists and identity theorists need it to do.
Similar charges of “essentialism” have been leveled at feminist epistemologies that draw on developmental psychology and object relations theory to develop epistemic norms. This strand has been more influential in developing feminist moral epistemologies, but it has had some influence on epistemologies developed in tandem with the science studies strain in feminist epistemology as well. Carol Gilligan’s (1982) groundbreaking work in developmental moral psychology in In a Different Voice gave rise to a variety of feminist moral epistemologies that emphasized relatedness and affect to counterbalance the traditional emphasis on moral reasoning as a process of deductive reasoning that takes the reasoner from a moral principle to a particular moral judgment. In a Different Voice raises the issue of whether and how reasoning is tied to the practices of child-rearing, through which children develop gender affiliations and come to live out gendered ideals. Gilligan argues that the moral reasoning processes that take into account relationships in determining the right moral action in a given situation, processes which child development theorists characterized as “immature” or less developed than reasoning processes that operated deductively, are simply complementary and not necessarily inferior. Gilligan’s criticism of Kohlberg’s work, however, ties these reasoning styles to sex: Kohlberg’s studies of moral development and moral reasoning uses boys almost exclusively. The responses that girls give, which often invoke the importance of maintaining relationships when posed with a moral conflict and which emphasize negotiations, are characterized by Kohlberg and his research team as developmentally prior to the deductive reasoning that characterizes the boys’ responses. Gilligan conjectures that girls have more permeable boundaries of the self and are often more concerned with relationship maintenance as a result of their upbringing and that this might account for the different “reasoning styles” that seem to attend gender differences.
Support for this conjecture may be found in object-relations theory. Object relations theory emphasizes the fact that the cognitive distinctions that underlie physical object theory, the process of learning to distinguish between self and other, and the processes of learning language and moral norms all evolve contemporaneously and are tied to each other in a variety of ways such that they re-enforce each other. Coming to learn about objects is connected to coming to learn about what makes one a self and not a thing, and is, thus, connected to theories of mind and intentionality; coming to learn about the persistence of physical objects in time and space depends on developing a sense of an “I” which persists and remains unchanged, even as perceptions change. Feminists emphasize the fact that while all the aforementioned cognitive developments are taking place, the development and re-enforcement of gender ideals and norms is also taking place, overlapping and helping to constitute the cognitive distinctions. Thus, cognitive ideals and virtues come to be saturated with, and partly constitutive of, gender norms and moral norms.
Developmental psychology and object-relations theory, however, are seen by some feminist epistemologists as troublesome, insofar as they assume certain kinds of commonalities in child-rearing that transcend class and race differences. In addition, the claim that women reason differently than men, no matter what the source of that difference, is thought to be both wrong and politically retrograde. However, the virtue of these approaches is that they allow feminist epistemologists to claim that the gender of the reasoner is epistemically significant, which in turn can support the claim that the fact that women are absent from particular studies. Alternatively from the practice of philosophy or science, it means that different ways of thinking about problems or issues may also be missing as a result of that exclusion.
Some of the ways in which the developmental psychology and object-relations strain have contributed to feminist epistemologies in both the sciences and in moral philosophy, however, have relied less on the empirical claims that there are reasoning differences between men and women. These approaches take seriously the ways in which certain aspects of human cognition and reasoning have been tied to women and often devalued as a result, and they take that symbolic relationship as the starting point for epistemic investigation. Along these lines, feminist epistemologists analyze the ways in which testimony operates epistemically while also being embedded in particular social relations that are often opaque to actors and reasoners. Similarly, feminist epistemologies have sought to find a place for affect, relationships, and care in both moral reasoning and in epistemic practices more generally. This branch of feminist epistemology is covered in the section on epistemic virtue theories below.
The ways in which Continental philosophical approaches have shaped feminist epistemologies are both complicated and widespread, and even feminist epistemologists who are writing primarily in the Anglo-American tradition have often been influenced by the critical trends in Continental thought. This is true not only of Marxist-feminist epistemologies described above, but it is also true of feminist science studies generally and of feminist epistemologies which draw on developmental psychology and feminist epistemic virtue theory. It is not unusual to find feminist philosophers who are trained primarily in the Anglo-American “analytic” tradition who draw on work in hermeneutics, phenomenology and postmodernism, while feminists who locate their work in these traditions often cross this boundary as well. Similarly, feminist pragmatism (discussed below) often draws on both the Anglo-American analytic tradition and the Continental tradition. It is safe to say that these categories, never stable in non-feminist philosophy, are even more loosely defined in feminist philosophy.
Feminist epistemologies that develop out of the Continental tradition often take as their starting point the need to re-envision and reconstruct the epistemological project more generally. Drawing on Foucault, Gadamer, and Habermas, among others, Linda Martín Alcoff (1993, 1996) argues for a re-orientation of epistemological projects that can take into account the political nature of truth-claims and knowledge production and can provide resources for reconstructing normative epistemic concepts such as rationality, justification, and knowledge.
Continental feminist epistemologies emphasize the ways in which epistemic practices, norms, and products (e.g. knowledge) are not neutral but are, in fact, both produced by, and partly-constitutive of, power relations. However, the claim that knowledge practices and products are not neutral does not amount to the claim that they are false or distorted, since all knowledge practices and products are enmeshed in power relations. The ideal of neutrality, assumed to be essential to good knowledge practices, is, in fact, itself a political construction. Thus, a re-construction of epistemic value terms must be a re-construction that recognizes the political nature of epistemology and epistemic practices. Feminist theorists add to this theoretical approach an emphasis on the ways in which gender is another, and different, layer of power relations.
The other aspect of Continental philosophical traditions that has been used by feminists to introduce and develop an analysis of the epistemic salience of gender has been the phenomenological tradition and its emphasis on the “lived body.” Work by Gail Weiss and Elizabeth Grosz (1994), among others, draws on phenomenology to re-frame epistemological inquiry as well as develops its theory of the body to undermine the oppositional dualisms that Genevieve Lloyd (1984), Susan Bordo (1990), and Susan Hekman (1990) identify as implicated in gender norms and ideals.
Feminist work in the Continental tradition has also led to a critical evaluation of the centrality of epistemology to philosophy and to a concomitant critique of feminists who insist on locating their work in the field of epistemology. A related argument will be addressed below in the section on pragmatist feminist epistemology. The theoretical impetus that comes from the Continental tradition, unlike the one that arises in pragmatism, is connected to the analysis of truth as an instrument of domination, as part of the constitution and maintenance of hegemonic practices, or as a strategic move to eliminate conflict and resistance. This is not a position on which there is agreement among feminist theorists working in the Continental tradition, but the critique of epistemology has been one of the most important developments to come out of feminist engagements with this tradition, and that critique has taken a unique form. Thus, one aspect of feminist Continental epistemology is the attack on epistemology itself, feminist epistemology included.
Epistemic virtue theories generally focus on the ways in which epistemology and value theory overlap, but feminist versions of these theories focus on the ways in which gender and power relations come into play in both value theory and epistemology and, specifically, on the ways in which subjects are constructed in the interplay of knowledge claims, power relations, and value theory.
Work on the history of philosophy by feminists has led to critiques of philosophical assumptions about what constitutes epistemic virtue, particularly those virtues assumed to be definitive of reason and objectivity. Bordo’s (1990) and Lloyd’s (1984) work examines the ways in which “maleness” and “femaleness” operate symbolically in philosophical discussions of conceptual relationships assumed to be dichotomous, for instance: reason/unreason, reason/emotion, objectivity/subjectivity, and universality/particularity.
These critical engagements with the history of philosophy have laid the groundwork for feminist attempts to reconfigure epistemic virtues in ways that allow for the re-integration of faculties or aspects of knowledge that have been excluded from analyses of epistemic virtue because of their alignment in the “imaginary” of philosophy with women or with the forces of irrationality.
Lorraine Code’s work (1987, 1991, 1995, 1996) argues for the epistemic salience of, among other things, testimony, gossip, and the affective and political operations according to which identities are constructed and maintained. Code and other feminists working in this area emphasize the ways in which social and political forces shape our identities as epistemic authorities and as rational agents and how these, in turn, lead to a different understanding of epistemic responsibility.
Code’s work has also been influential in the development of another strand of feminist epistemology. This strand can be characterized as a version of naturalism [[that]] takes issue with the ways in which traditional epistemological paradigms derive from cases of simple and uncontroversial empirical beliefs. For instance, beliefs like, “I know that I am seeing a tree,” deform the epistemic landscape. This includes a criticism of the paradigm of knowledge as propositional and a related criticism of the presumed individualism of epistemic pursuits. In addition, this naturalistic turn in feminist epistemology takes issue with the traditional epistemological concern with the skeptical problem, in most instances simply ignoring it as an epistemological issue rather than arguing against its importance. The skeptical problem is often taken to be a problem primarily for individualist epistemologies that also assume that knowledge is essentially propositional and that it is to be explained in terms of individual mental states. Since many feminist epistemic virtue theorists reject all or most of these assumptions, the skeptical problem cannot get any traction and is consequently ignored in virtue of its status as a pseudo-problem.
For feminist pragmatist approaches, the skeptical problem becomes a non-problem as well, but this is in virtue of the major change wrought in philosophical thinking about knowledge in the wake of Darwin and the pragmatists. Early pragmatists like John Dewey and William James were already recognizing that key terms used in epistemological discourse require revision: terms like “belief” as opposed to “emotion” or “desire,” issues of truth and reference, and representational theories of belief and knowledge are all radically de-stabilized by pragmatist thinkers. Richard Rorty’s development of this theme in the twentieth century led him to conclude that epistemology is dead and that philosophy is the better for it.
Feminist pragmatists share this suspicion of epistemology, although they continue to work on issues related to knowledge. However, theorists like Charlene Haddock Seigfried (1996) argue that since epistemology is importantly tied to terms for which feminist pragmatists have no use, they ought to see themselves as doing something other than epistemology.
Feminist pragmatism has its own version of a naturalized epistemology, but it is a naturalism that, like the naturalism found in feminist epistemic virtue theories, resists reduction to cognitive psychology or neuroscience. Instead, and similar to feminist epistemic virtue theories, it begins with the common problems of knowledge that occur at the crossroads of ordinary experience. Knowledge and its problems present themselves in the same way that other social problems present themselves: as opportunities for melioration and the improvement of life.
The basic epistemic building block for pragmatist feminist approaches is the organism rather than the mind or the body. “Experience” is more complex than sensory states, since it is the way in which the organism interacts with its world, a world that includes not just objects but also social institutions, relationships, and politics. As a result, knowledge pursuits are already implicated with values, politics, and bodies.
Pragmatist feminist approaches to accounts of knowledge, thus, share much with naturalized accounts of epistemology, but the idea of science that operates in feminist pragmatist theories is science as characterized by Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, and John Dewey, rather than the characterization of science as it appears in the analytic tradition of philosophy. There are, of course, differences among Peirce, James, and Dewey in their characterization of science, but it is fair to understand their views as underwritten by an understanding of science as a way of interacting with the world that is also enmeshed in human values and human endeavors. Feminist pragmatist epistemologies share this understanding of science, emphasizing its liberatory project and its role in the melioration of social problems.
Thus, feminist pragmatist epistemological projects attempt to keep our knowledge endeavors true to the liberatory impulse while also re-configuring problems of knowledge in terms that take seriously the insights of evolutionary theory, humanistic empirical psychology, and the understanding of the knowing subject as an organism whose knowledge endeavors are taken up in both a material and a social world.
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Last updated: October 31, 2004 | Originally published: