This article traces the history of U.S. mainstream feminist thought from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences, to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. It begins with the question of the social construction of gender and the mainstream feminist assumption that ‘woman’ means middle class white woman. The challenge to this assumption is then posed by women of color, poor women, immigrants, lesbians and women in the ’third world.” Section Three presents the various forms of inclusion of black women within mainstream feminist frameworks. Following that is a discussion on the construction of whiteness, the privileges that race afford white women, and feminist strategies to overcome racism within mainstream feminism. Section Five reviews the struggles of Latina and Asian American women, the specific questions of identity they confront, and how these relate to mainstream feminism. Section Six discusses the challenges posed to U.S. mainstream feminism by third world feminists.
Feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, together with what unites women in common contexts of struggle. The focus on difference, as well as identity, however, often overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but with how to establish one in the first place. Concentrating on identity and difference, either by working to obliterate or represent it, also tends to the neglect of power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place.
This article further explores how sexism and racism are structural problems endemic to American culture. As such, they need to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination. The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women, and a blindness of “first world” complicity in third world oppressions. As Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.” The conclusion explores how feminists unite to struggle against systems of domination and exploitation, and work to give up privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition for those benefiting from power, to dismantle the “master’s house” and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.
The question of difference has been central to U.S. feminism since the inception of a women’s movement in the United States. When Sojourner Truth, a black woman, walked into the predominately white Women’s Convention in Akron, Ohio in 1851, three years after the first Women’s Rights Convention in Seneca Falls, New York, jaws dropped. Not a sound could be heard. Truth was an imposing woman. She stood almost 6 feet tall and bore the scars of brutal beatings, the sale of her children, and the loss of her own parents while she was sold off into slavery. Surrounded by affluent, educated white women and their gentlemen supporters, her presence at first stirred fear, but eventually gave rise to awe. The white women at the conference didn’t want to muddy their struggle and demands for women’s rights with the uncomfortable subject of race and the rights of colored folk, despite their debt to Fredrick Douglass’ efforts to keep the controversial issue of women’s suffrage central at the first Convention in Seneca Falls. Yet, when Truth rose to enter into the conversation, her words, collected under the title “Ain’t I a Woman,” not only drew strong admiration, but presaged what would come to be the fundamental question of Western feminism: What exactly is a woman?
In the speech titled “Ain’t I a Woman,” Truth reveals the contradictions inherent to the use and meaning of the term woman, and exposes the political, economic, and cultural assumptions underlying its use. Taking the platform at the Convention in Ohio, she spoke out against the declarations of several men. They believed that women were to refrain from strenuous work, both physical and mental, so to better fulfill their “womanly nature.” But Truth knew nothing of this so-called nature that they espoused and engendered. What she knew was toil and work as arduous as any man could endure.
That man over there says that women need to be helped into carriages, and lifted over ditches, and to have the best place everywhere. Nobody ever helps me into carriages, or over mud-puddles, or gives me any best place! And ain’t I a woman? Look at me! Look at my arm! I have plowed, and planted, and have gathered into barns, and no man could head me! And ain’t I a woman? I could work as much, and eat as much as man – when I could get it – and bear the lash as well! And ain’t I a woman? I have borne thirteen children and seen most all sold off to slavery, and when I cried out with a mother’s grief, none but Jesus heard me! And ain’t I a woman? (Truth, 2009).
Almost one hundred years later, Truth’s questioning can be heard in Simone de Beauvoir’s challenge to claims that the meaning of womanhood is self-evident. In her groundbreaking and canonical work The Second Sex (1949, 1st English trans., 1953), Beauvoir set the course for the subsequent study of the “woman question” in the West by putting the issue of gender into focus. Responding to male discontentment that French women were losing their femininity and were not as “womanly” as they believed Russian women to be, Beauvoir wondered if one is born a woman or whether, in fact, one must become a woman through various socialization and indoctrination processes. This critical perspective led her to challenge the usefulness of the category of woman altogether and to ask whether it was, in fact, helpful as a term representing all the experiences of the so-called members of the “second sex.” Perhaps nothing better illustrates Beauvoir’s concerns regarding the legitimacy and effectiveness of the category of “woman” than the development of white, U.S. mainstream feminist thought in relation to challenges posed by women of color, the poor, lesbians, immigrants, and women from “third world” nations. In making their voices heard, these marginalized women expanded feminist thinking by showing that ideologies of womanhood had just as much to do with race, class, and sexuality, as they had to do with sex.
Feminists in the U.S. have set out to identify, expose, and subvert the longstanding gender stereotypes that have been used to dominate and subordinate women. Central to any theory of feminism, then, is how terms like “woman,” “female,” and “feminine” are construed or misconstrued. The pioneer women in the U.S. suffragist movement spoke of and fought for women’s rights, using the term woman to signify all women. What they failed to recognize was that their notion of womanhood was modeled on the experiences and problems of a small percentage of females who, like them, were almost exclusively white, middle-class, and relatively well-educated. However, the assumption that middle-class white women’s experiences represented all women’s experiences was not only made by the early Suffragists, but continued to shape the ideal of womanhood well into the second wave of the American feminist movement and beyond.
In The Problem That Has No Name, a book that helped usher in the second wave of feminism in the U.S., Betty Friedan exposed the hidden frustrations of women who had bought into the “mystique of feminine fulfillment” (2001:24). Trading in their career ambitions for the promised bliss of marriage, motherhood, and domesticity, many women instead found themselves trapped and isolated behind white picket fences in what Friedan described as the “housewife’s syndrome.” But, what Friedan also failed to recognize was that this syndrome affected only a certain minority of women— namely, those who were white, middle-class, and often highly educated, like herself. She did not realize that the binary and complimentary gender divisions she assumed, woman as breadmaker and man as breadwinner, were built upon a racialized patriarchy that excluded women of color, the poor, and immigrants from this “mystique of femininity.” It was these women who would be called upon to leave their children and homes to care for the children and homes of the white women who had successfully “liberated” themselves from domesticity to voluntarily enter into the work force.
Discounting the lives of women of color by assuming that the experiences of white women were representative of the lives of all women, Friedan imagines a unity among women’s experiences that simply does not exist. According to bell hooks, this ideal of gender solidarity is built upon an assumption of sameness that is supported by the idea that there exists a common oppression of patriarchy around which women must rally. “The idea of ‘common oppression’ was a false and corrupt platform disguising and mystifying the true nature of women’s varied and complex social reality” (1984:44). This complexity is especially disclosed in the lives of women of color who must contend with multiple and overlapping forms of oppressions–including oppression by white women, who fail to acknowledge the different struggles confronting women who are not like them.
Mainstream feminist thought continues to grapple with the interrelations between gender and race, as well as class, colonialism, imperialism, and issues of sexual orientation in what might arguably be called a third wave of feminism in the U.S.. More importantly, the critiques of women who have suffered the most from sexist societies — women of color, the poor, third world women — are now at the forefront of a contemporary, progressive feminist politics. Thus, to understand the current contours of mainstream feminist thought in the U.S. and the question of race, one must look at how feminist theory and practice have addressed differences among women, and the specific ways that differences within women’s lives have shaped their relationships to mainstream U.S. feminism.
Feminist theorists have addressed the relationship of race and feminism in at least two different ways. One approach is to view race as integral to gender and explore the ways in which gender identity is constructed in relation to race, and how racial identity is equally constructed in relation to gender. The other follows a method whereby the voices of women of color are added to the conventional curriculum in a sort of separate but equal manner. This latter approach has been called the “additive” approach. Because it simply adds the voices of those historically excluded from the mainstream feminist canon, but does not examine the constitution of these voices within the contexts of power that have given rise to them, it carries the risk of essentializing gender and race, or assuming these categories to be fixed and timeless.
With respect to the former, Jacquelyn Dowd Hal highlights the interconnections of race and gender in her discussion of lynching. Hal shows that lynching was not only used to enforce labor contracts, maintain racial etiquette and the socio-economic status quo, but was also effective in re-inscribing gender roles among whites. White men cast themselves as protectors of white women, sheltering them from the presumed threat of black male sexual prowess, while simultaneously securing white women’s adherence to ideals of chastity and femininity (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 132). These ideals were further re-inscribed by white women in their perceptions and accusations regarding black male sexuality. Ida B. Wells had made the same observation, arguing that white men maintained their ownership over white women’s bodies by using them as the terrain for lynching black males (Carby, 1986: 309). It comes as little surprise, then, that by joining anti-lynching campaigns white women were not only defending black males, but simultaneously reacting against Southern chivalry and their roles as fragile sex objects (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 133).
The more popular approach to the question of race and feminism, however, seems to have been the “additive” approach. In “Toward a Black Feminist Criticism” (1977), Barbara Smith embarks on a journey that she states no man or woman has gone on before: documenting black women’s experience and culture while providing black women with a resource for reading about their lives. “It is galling that ostensible feminists and acknowledged lesbians have been so blinded to the implications of any womanhood that is not white womanhood and that they have yet to struggle with the deep racism in themselves that is at the source of this blindness” (Carby, 1992: 158). Smith believes that it is necessary both to retrieve the writings of black women and to place them before black feminist literary critics who are able to interpret these writers experiences. She argues that black women writers share a singular tradition of styles, themes and aesthetics that are rooted in a shared culture of oppression. Furthermore, she believes that these themes are expressed in a uniquely black woman’s language that is accessible only to black feminist literary critics who simply need turn inwards, or towards their own lived experiences, in order to decipher the messages told by black women writers (Carby, 1992:164). With her novel idea of an “identity politics,” Smith went on to form the black lesbian feminist Combahee River Collective in Boston.
“The Combahee River Collective Statement” (1986), along with This Bridge Called My Back, Writings by Radical Women of Color, published two years earlier, gave voice to women of color and served as the primary texts from which white women and women of color would draw in discussions of race and gender. In the Combahee Statement, the Collective explained their need to organize and come together as black women into a movement for black women. “We realize that the only people who care enough about us to work consistently for our liberation is us. Our politics evolve from a healthy love for ourselves, our sisters, and our community, which allows us to continue our struggle and our work” (1995: 21-22). Black-only movements worked to raise the self-esteem of black women and address specific problems confronting all black people. Angela Davis also describes how, despite the sexist and heterosexist elements of the Black Nationalist Movement, it gave her a framework within which to understand herself as beautiful and valuable. In addition, Black Nationalism also served to counter racist images of African-Americans by providing positive images of Africa. “I was able to construct a psychological space within which I could ‘feel good about myself.’ I could celebrate my body (especially my nappy hair, which I always attacked with a hot comb in ritualistic seclusion), my musical proclivities and my suppressed speech patterns, among other things…This distanced me from the white people around me while simultaneously rendering controllable the distance I had always felt from them” (1992:319).
Patricia Hill Collins invokes the notion of a shared black women’s language and highlights a common tradition that reaches back to the idea of an “African consciousness.” However, she cautions against carving out a uniquely black female voice, or category of experience, for fear of sliding into an essentialist perspective which may, ultimately, be counterproductive. She recognizes that identifying a black feminist thought problematically assumes that “being Black and/or female generates certain experiences that automatically determine the variants of a Black and/or feminist consciousness” (1991:21). Still, Collins maintains that black women have certain perspectives that arise out of a shared experience, along with a different relation to knowledge production that give rise to a uniquely “black feminist standpoint” (1991:21-22).
Collins draws on the mainstream feminist strategy of “standpoint theory” that Nancy Hartsock helped develop out of Karl Marx’s insight that the material conditions of existence structure one’s lived experiences,. A standpoint theory argues that the place from which one stands influences the perspective or view that one has of the world; and, further, that those who are most oppressed are able to provide a broader and clearer perspective on the whole of society and societal relations (Hartsock, 1999). Collins believes that any black feminist standpoint must take into account white domination, the concomitant struggle for self-definition, and the Afrocentric worldview that helps blacks cope with racial domination. This Afrocentricism, Collins claims, existed prior to,and is independent of, racial oppression. Moreover, it has given rise to traditions of storytelling and narrative that value concrete, lived experience, as well as black women’s community and sisterhood (1991:206, 212). Collins’ version of standpoint feminism, therefore, focuses on concrete lived experiences that have their roots in African oral traditions, black families, churches, and other black organizations.
But even the idea of this mitigated account of an essential black female identity does not sit well with many black women. For example, Hazel Carby sees the idea of black feminist criticism, as well as any notion of a specifically black feminist consciousness, as a problem and not a solution. She traces this problem to the processes whereby one finds academic legitimation by aiming to fit into certain allotted slots that are open for discussions of racial and gender identity within mainstream curricula. Carby advocates the need to examine racism and sexism not as trans-historical and essentialist categories, but as historical practices which are enmeshed with evolving sets of social, political, and economic practices that function to maintain power in a given context and society (1989:18). Any emphasis on the elaboration of standpoint theory, Carby claims, sanctions the segregation and ghettoization of race and gender, while simultaneously positing white women as a normative standard (1992:193 ).
Moreover, Carby believes that this supplemental approach, which consists simply in adding the experiences and writings of women of color to the established mainstream feminist canon, will not solve the problems of “exclusion” from mainstream feminism, but will instead further reify differences. Joan Scott echoes these remarks and cautions women against relying on an uncritical deployment of experience to tell their stories. By assuming experience to be self-evident and transparent, one naturalizes difference and leaves unexamined the constitutive mechanisms according to which people’s experiences have been historically constructed by relational webs of power and multiple oppressions (1991: 25-26). These mechanisms are structural and institutional. They are therefore more difficult to identify and eradicate. To adequately address the root causes of racism in the feminist movement, women must therefore acknowledge that any attempt to universalize their experiences colludes, not only with ideologies of white womanhood, but also with the dominant and privileged white male norms. The prominence given to white women’s experience, Carby points out, is no accident. “White women are made visible because they are the women that white men see” (1986: 302). Taking into account the historical and political contexts that define gender reveals the racial constructions that structure both the lives of whites and people of color.
Many black women, especially those excluded from the earlier Suffragist movement, went even further and drew an explicit link between imperialism, racism, and patriarchy. This link was cemented at the 1893 World’s Columbian Exposition in Chicago, where a group of black women who had thought they were there to represent the lives of American women, were instead made part of exhibits featuring “exotic” peoples, which further fed into racist stereotypes and fears (Carby, 1986). Subsequently, these women came to recognize the need to form their own national organizations. In 1896, a number of black women’s groups merged into the National Association of Colored Women (NACW), headed by Josephine Ruffin and Mary Church Terrell. Its members included Harriet Tubman, Frances E.W. Harper, and Ida Bell Wells-Barnett. Harper and Anna J Cooper, the fourth African American woman to earn a Doctorate in the U.S., saw an inseparable link between imperialism, domestic racial oppression, and unrestrained patriarchal power. Cooper writes in A Voice from the South: By A Woman from the South (1892):
“Whence came this apotheosis of greed and cruelty? Whence this sneaking admiration we all have for bullies and prizefighters? Whence the self-congratulation of ‘dominant’ races, as if ‘dominant’ meant ‘righteous’ and carried with it a title to inherit the earth? Whence the scorn of so-called weak or unwarlike races and individuals, and the very comfortable assurance that it is their manifest destiny to be wiped out as vermin before the advancing civilization?” (Carby, 1986:305).
Cooper’s observations came 40 years after Arthur de Gobineau declared in The Inequality of Races, that, indeed, Africans were “incapable of civilization” because they did not have the drive or ambition to conquer their neighbors, but rather lived “side by side in complete independence of each other” (Bernasconi, 2000:47). It was this conquering drive that Gobineau argued marked European civilization as advanced in contrast to the backwardness of Africans, who practiced living in harmonious co-existence with their neighbors.
In recognition of the advantages that race has conferred upon white women, many feminists have embarked upon analyses of race and gender that moves towards an acknowledgment of white privilege and racial injustice. Feminists have also worked to develop strategies for addressing white racism and identifying power differentials between women, between men, and among white women and men of color.
In 1988, inspired by the model of how men gain advantage from women’s disadvantage, Peggy McIntosh began to document some of the ways in which white women have benefited from racism. Having observed how men were taught not to recognize their male privilege, McIntosh explored some of the unconscious avenues that allow white women not to recognize their “unearned skin privilege” (2008:63). “[W]hites are taught to think of their lives as morally neutral, normative, and average, and also ideal, so that when we work to benefit others, this work is seen as work that will allow ‘them’ to be more like ‘us’” (2008:63). Positioning whites as the norm is seen by Anna Stubblefield as pivotal to securing the superiority of whites. “The ideology of white supremacy is that whiteness sets the standard—whiteness is normative—such that anything that is symbolic of or associated with blackness is therefore deviant” (2005:74).
McIntosh describes how she was taught to view racism as prejudice or bigotry, and to subscribe discriminatory acts of cruelty to isolated individuals, rather than to acknowledge “invisible systems conferring racial domination on my group from birth” (2008:68). She lists the unearned advantages that come from being a member of the dominant group, such as the comfort that comes from being in situations that reflect the worldview, values, and ideals of whites. White privilege ranges from the confidence white parents have that their children will receive educational materials highlighting the accomplishments and contributions of their race, to not attributing acts of injustice to racial prejudices, and not having to stand as a representative for one’s particular racial group. Marilyn Frye further discusses the privilege that whites have to define or determine how others will see them. More specifically, she contrasts the images and ideals that whites have of themselves with the ways in which they are viewed by men and women of color to underscore the disparity in perceptions (2001:85). Because whites are taught that they are moral, honest, and fair, they believe that they alone are capable of and responsible for teaching others about what is right and wrong. This confidence is built upon a body of established Western principles, codes, and rules that presume to guarantee the correctness of their moral judgments. However, these self-descriptions of the dominant racial group are not shared by the majority of people of color who view many whites as behaving arbitrarily, or in a self-serving, violent, and often oppressive ways.
In “The Whiteness Question” (2005), Linda Alcoff argues that the key to overcoming racism lies in a confrontation with the “psychic processes of identity formation[.]” Tracing the origins of whiteness to domination and exploitation, Alcoff asserts that “whiteness” is inseparable from the subjection, denigration, objectification, and repudiation of those who are perceived as non-white. “The very genealogy of whiteness was entwined from the beginning with a racial hierarchy, which can be found in every major cultural narrative from Christopher Columbus to Manifest Destiny to the Space Race and the Computer Revolution” (2005). Before the concept of race originated in the 16th century, various populations of people identified and structured their communities in varieties of ways that did not include reference to skin color. The origins of the category of race are, indeed, the origins of European expansion and oppression against Africans, Asians, indigenous peoples in the Americas and Australia, and even Muslims. According to G.W.F. Hegel, it is only Europeans, or, more precisely, Christians who are able to attain the highest level of reason and spirituality by distancing themselves from the “absolute” through rationality. Africans are not able to actualize these higher mental and spiritual faculties because they fetishize the absolute by objectifying it in relics that they then toss away when their fetish fails to come to their aid. Muslims too, while successful at raising God above the level of the sensuous, are nevertheless unable to bring God back down to earth and unite the universal with the concrete, and therefore are unable to attain self-conscious reason (Bernasconi, 2000).
Alcoff, therefore, concludes that white collective self-esteem and identity are rooted in forms of white supremacy. Thus, to break free from racist ideology may not be such an easy task for whites, as it threatens the very foundations of their pride and self-love. This threat arises from the acknowledgement that historical achievements, and the legacy of cultural resources from which a white identity is drawn, are steeped in practices of racial oppression and domination. Consequently, relinquishing racism means not only giving up the actual privileges and benefits that are associated with being white, but may involve shunning one’s ties to a cultural history upon which white personal esteem and sense of self are grounded. Feelings of hysteria, shame, and anxiety often accompany this break. Yet, belonging to a history is crucial to one’s esteem and identity. Alcoff, therefore, suggests a form of “white double consciousness” that moves from a recognition of practices of domination, exploitation, and discrimination to “a newly awakened memory of the many white traitors to white privilege who have struggled to contribute to the building of an inclusive human community. The Michelangelos stand beside the Christopher Columbuses, and Michael Moores next to the Pat Buchanans” (2005).
The interrelationship between white identity and white supremacy has lead some anti-racist whites, most notably Noel Ignatiev, to go further and to call for the overall abolition of the white race: “Treason to whiteness is loyalty to humanity” (1997). Marilyn Frye similarly advocates a disassociation from “whiteness” by calling for whites to opt out of the club she calls “whiteliness” (2001: 85). The very conditions for disclaiming whiteness, a disclaiming of identity that some women of color point out is possible only for whites, rests in the understanding that race is something socially constructed. Frye explains that being white “is like being a member of a political party, or a club, or a fraternity—or being a Methodist or a Mormon” (2001:85).
The possibility of relinquishing “whiteliness,” therefore, involves a recognition of its contingency, and depends upon the repudiation of practices that arise from enacting, embodying and animating whiteness. Transforming consciousness is one step toward eliminating whiteliness. However, Frye and McIntosh are clearly aware that reflection and reorientation address only a fraction of the problems associated with race, since most of these are stubbornly structural and institutional. Still, Linda Gordon fears that a failure to begin addressing these difficult problems merely contributes towards legitimating more of the same—whites talking only about themselves (1991).
Sarita Srivastava is similarly unhappy with the direction that discussions of race have taken insofar as they tend toward white self-examination and constructions of whiteness. When analysis of race and racism occurs in feminist organizations, the emphasis, she finds, often falls on white guilt rather than organizational change. This results in self-centered strategies by whites to correct their moral self-image, an image that sustains inequalities, and, Srivastava argues, is rooted in the very foundations of feminism, imperialism, and nationalism that are the target of change.(2005: 36). Rather than work directly to alter the order of racial oppression, white women instead strive to empathize with the victims. Empathy serves to underscore white women’s “goodness,” and transforms the essentially socio-political nature of the problem to a more personal one. This practice further reinforces decades of racist and colonialist practices by validating white women’s moral authority and their belief that they have somehow been entrusted with the responsibility to educate and liberate those less civilized (2005: 44). Thus, Srivastava argues that white women fail to genuinely confront their own racism by focusing on their guilt and, in doing so, maintain power inequities. She quotes a woman of color’s frustration over white women’s refusal to look at their racism during political discussions on the topic of race. “The indignant response, anger, the rage that turns to tears, the foot stomping, temper tantrum, which are very typical responses [to being called racist]. Every single organization that I have been in, every single one. So I realized that it wasn’t about me…after awhile [laughter]” (2005: 42-43).
Alcoff further shows how white feminists distance themselves from a serious critique of racism by focusing on behavior modification, rather than challenging oppressive institutional structures and calling for wealth redistribution. In her analysis of Judith Katz’s White Awareness: Handbook for Anti-Racism Training (Katz 1978), Alcoff describes Katz’s depiction of how she came to terms with the depth of her own racism as a painful, demoralizing process that threatened her self-trust. While Katz warns against wallowing in white guilt, she nonetheless links anti-racism to psychological liberation while, at the same time, distancing herself from the workings and mechanisms of racist practices that are endemic to the culture. The focus on difference and overcoming of difference, either by obliterating or representing it, tends to neglect the power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place. Concentrating on identity and difference also overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle, not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but, to the contrary, with how to establish an identity in the first place.
Struggling to negotiate and come to terms with an identity, many women of color are not as eager as white women to give up their racial or ethnic distinctiveness. “To be oppressed,” Norma Alarcon explains, “means to be disenabled not only from grasping an ‘identity’, but also from reclaiming it” (1995:364). Moreover, specific histories of oppressions have positioned women differently with regard to gender roles and the family. Cherrie Moraga describes how Latina women’s relationships to ideals of gender and motherhood have been uniquely shaped by colonization. Accompanying European expansion and colonization, was the concomitant threat of genocide. The fear of extinction strengthened the commitment to traditional family ideals and roles, such as encouraging women to be pregnant and assuming males at the head of the household. “At all costs, la familia must be preserved…We believe the more severely we protect the sex roles with the family, the stronger we will be as a unity in opposition to the anglo threat” (1995:181). Consequently, Moraga explains, Latina feminists’ relation to gender roles and the structure of the family confront a very particular kind of resistance. While mainstream feminists are challenging traditional sex roles of men and women, some Latina feminists, due to their certain histories of colonization, seek to preserve these roles. Thus, Latina women’s concerns are often foreign to, and often in direct opposition to, mainstream white feminists who seek to abolish or overcome conventional forms of gender identity, especially within the family.
U.S. immigration policies and discriminatory practices against Asian Americans have also sometimes lead to the embracing of gender ideals among Asian American women that are in opposition to the ideals of many white feminists in the U.S.. Ester Ngan-Ling Chow shows how racism, colonialism, and imperialism have worked to position Asian American women differently toward Asian American men, feminism, and Westernization. Addressing the apparent lack of feminist consciousness and activism in Asian American women, she attributes this deficit to ethnic pride and solidarity with Asian American men to end racial discrimination against Asians in the U.S.. Asian American men, for example, often view Asian American women’s engagement with mainstream U.S. feminism as a threat to the Asian American community. Chow also points to specific Asiatic values of obedience, filial duty, loyalty, fatalism, and self-control that encourage forms of submissiveness among Asian American women that are incompatible with American values of individualism and self-assertiveness. The force of traditional Asian values contributes to the particularity of Asian American women’s struggles, and work to distance their struggle from the concerns of the mainstream, white feminist movement. These differences, among others, are why Chow states: “The development of feminist consciousness for Asian American women cannot be judged or understood through the experience of White women” (1991:266).
Yen Le Espiritu further discusses the complexities surrounding the intersections of race, class, and gender confronting Asian American women. Regrettably, some Asian American women find themselves victims of the discrimination faced by Asian American men. Among other things, Espiritu writes, racial ideology defines Asian American men as feminine and weak—a rendering that incidentally works to confirm the notion that manhood is white. Frustrated also by the higher value placed on Asian American women’s employability, some Asian American men try to assert their power by physically abusing the women and children in their lives. Breathing humor into these problems of physical abuse, Espiritu draws upon a joke that gets a laugh from both men and women. “When we get on the plane to go back to Laos, the first thing we will do is beat up the women!’” (Espiritu, 1997: 136). Despite the discriminations Asian American women endure within their community, they too often find it difficult to juggle between the desire to expose male privilege, and the desire to unite with men in their shared struggle against prejudice and discrimination.
Gloria Anzaldua describes the particular ways that a feminist consciousness is developed by Latina women who many times find themselves struggling to arrive at a positive image of themselves. She explains how an internalization of racism and colonialist mentality has given rise to shame, self-hatred, and abuse of other Latina women in various communities. Self-hatred and the hatred one has towards others like oneself are further ignited by jostling for the limited positions of superiority that are open to women of color. Here is where ethnic and cultural identity begin to be conflated with race and purported biological distinctions. In the early phases of colonialism, European colonizers flexed their powers overtly in order to destroy the fabric, legal codes, cultural systems, mannerisms, language and habits of the colonized under the guise of civilizing the “savage natives.” Slowly, local inhabitants internalized Western values, attitudes, and ways of life, including racialized thinking that resulted in a desire for some Latin Americans to become more white and reject their indigenous cultures. “Like them we try to impose our version of ‘the ways things should be’, we try to impose one’s self on the Other by making her the recipient of one’s negative elements, usually the same elements that the Anglo projected on us” (1995: 143).
More graphically, Anzaldua alludes to how the “forced cultural penetration” of rape has, so to speak, inseminated white values into the bodies of women of color (1995:143). A Latina woman with lighter skin who does not speak the language of her ancestors is often held suspect by other Latina women and cast out of the community. Anzaldua attributes this exclusionary practice to an “internalized whiteness that desperately wants boundary lines (this part of me is Mexican, this Indian)[.]” (1995: 143). In opposition to the Enlightenment fantasy of a uniform and self-contained subject, Anzaldua introduces the concept of “mestiza consciousness,” a consciousness of the Borderlands that captures the multiplicity and plurality of Latina consciousness. “From this racial, ideological, cultural and biological cross-pollinization, an ‘alien’ consciousness is presently in the making—a new mestiza consciousness, una conciencia de mujer” (2008: 870). Writing primarily in English but peppering her discussion of mestiza consciousness with phrases in Spanish, Anzaldua puts the non-Spanish reader in an uncomfortable position, paralleling the discomfort felt by many immigrants who are confronted with a language they don’t understand. In this way, Anzaldua describes and invokes an appreciation of the inner conflict that those straddling two or more cultures, languages, and value systems experience. She provides a provocative illustration of warring cultures that produce in their subjects a “psychic restlessness” (2008).
The notion of a splintered personality brought on by a collision of cultures is also addressed by Alcoff, who proposes a positive reconstruction of mixed race identities whereby one finds comfort in ambiguity and a contentment with living the “gap” (2000:160). “I never reach shore: I never wholly occupy either the Angla or the Latina identity. Paradoxically, in white society I feel my Latinness, in Latin society I feel my whiteness, as that which is left out, an invisible present, sometimes as intrusive as an elephant in the room and sometimes more as a pulled thread that alters the design of my fabricated self” (2000:160).
Maria Lugones gives a phenomenological description of what it is like to shift between identities as a person of mixed race or a hyphenated identity. When voluntarily embraced, she calls this practice of shifting identities “world traveling.” “Those of us who are ‘world’- travelers have the distinct experience of being different in different ‘worlds’ and ourselves in them” (1995: 396). Lugones’ concept of world traveling arose out of her awareness of the different levels of comfort she experiences in embodying different identities in distinct worlds. In some worlds, Lugones observes she is more playful and not overly concerned with how others view her. However, while inhabiting a world in which her identity is constructed negatively, or strictly on the basis of her ethnicity, she finds she is less playful and may even begin to animate self-defeating stereotypes.
Shifting in and out of various worlds, Lugones advocates a strategy whereby women attempt to empathize with each other by trying to stand in one another’s shoes. Laurence Thomas, to the contrary, warns against such a strategy that asks people who are so differently positioned within society to try to identify with each other’s experiences. Instead, he introduces the model of “moral deference”: “the act of listening that is preliminary to bearing witness to another’s moral pain, but without bearing witness to it” (1986: 377). In this stance, the one suffering has the platform and the one listening, who does not inhabit the same socially constituted identity, cedes the platform by recognizing the incommensurability of his or her experience of the other’s pains and struggles. It is this respect – rooted in an acknowledgment of the irreducibility of lived experience—that is at the heart of Third World Women’s appeal to Western Feminists.
Significantly, the concerns raised by women of color in the U.S. are almost identically replayed by third world women, in what might be called a shift from biological to cultural racism. However, instead of fighting against a cultural norm of white womanhood, third world feminists are fighting to assert their difference in opposition to a monolithic and dominant notion of Western feminism that is increasingly gaining legitimacy by controlling how women in the third world are represented.
Chandra Talpade Mohanty raises awareness of the impact of Western Scholarship on third world women “in a context of a world system dominated by the West[.]” (1991:53). She encourages Western feminist scholarship to situate itself within the current Western hegemony over the production, publication, distribution, and consumption of information, and to examine its role within this context (1991:55). In her analysis of the representations of third world women in nine texts in the Zed Press “Women in the Third World” series, Mohanty finds that in almost all these texts women are monolithically represented as victims of an unchanging patriarchy. These representations uproot women from their lived situations and the practices that shape, and are shaped by them. “The crucial point that is forgotten is that women are produced through these very relations as well as being implicated in forming these relations” (1991:59).
When women’s lives and struggles are not historically and locally situated, they are robbed of their political agency. Those, then, writing about third world women “become the true ‘subjects’ of this counterhistory” (1991:71). Western scholarship must, therefore, recognize the ethnocentric universalism it assumes in encoding and representing all third world women as victims of an ahistorical and decontextualized notion of patriarchy that results in a homogenous notion of the oppressed third world women. Only when feminist thinkers examine their role within Western dominations can genuine progress be made.
Uma Narayan highlights the facticity of women’s historical situations in her exposition of the particularities that women in the third world confront in participating in a feminist movement. Because of the histories of colonialism and imperialism, suspicions against feminist movements as possible instruments of colonial domination surround attempts made by women to organize for change. Specifically, Narayan explores how the term Westernization is used to silence critiques by third world feminists regarding the status and treatment of women in their communities. Ironically, it is Western educated and assimilated men in the third world that are spearheading these attacks against third world feminists by accusing them of disrespecting their culture and embracing Western values and customs. Narayan rejects the implication that feminism is foreign to the third world, noting that historical and political circumstances that raise awareness of women’s oppression give rise to a feminist consciousness that is organic to third world women’s lives.
Minoo Moallem locates a “feminist imperialism” in Western women’s desire to enlighten third world women to the civilizing project of the West, wherein first world women become the norm and third world women get constructed as a singular, non-Western other (2006). Elora Shehabuddin identifies a feminist imperialism in Western women’s attempt to position themselves as the saviors of Muslim women, thereby ignoring women’s voices fighting to make change within the Muslim world “In presenting change in the Muslim world as possible only with the intervention from the United States—either by force through the violent eradication of oppressive Muslim men or the less dramatic support of ‘moderate’ Muslim groups and individuals—these writers foreclose the possibility of change from within Muslim societies” (2011: 121).
Ignoring the racism inherent in colonialist narratives documenting the oppression of Muslim women by Muslim men, Shehabuddin points out, Western feminists are content to draw on stories of abuse by a few vocal “Muslim escapees” as representative of the victimization of all Muslim women. What seems to be the primary concern of these Western feminists is not the actual lives of women in the Muslim world, but the assertion of their own moral authority, exercised in presumably righting the sexism in the Islamic world. In this way, Western feminists repeat and redirect their racism and condescension toward Muslim women and third world women in general, while conveniently avoiding the sexism and oppression in their own backyards. The remedy to cultural racism is an acknowledgement of it and a commitment to displace Eurocentricism by actually listening to women’s experiences, and engaging women in the hopes of opening up a dialogue. Shehabuddin writes: “In the end, the only way to find out ‘what Muslim women want’ is to listen to them, not by assuming their needs and concerns are self-evident because they identify as Muslims and not by taking a small group of vocal, articulate individuals—whose opinions on issues like Israel and the war on terror are more acceptable—as the representative and authentic voices” (2011: 132).
The history of U.S. feminist thought has evolved from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. “The real problem of feminism,” states Elizabeth Spellman, “is how it has confused the condition of one group of women with the condition of all women” (1988:15 ). In assuming that the experiences of middle-class white women represented the lives of all women, a false unity and solidarity among women was presupposed. Taking account of the multiple and overlapping forms of oppression that many women, especially women of color and third world women must negotiate, reveals the complexity and diversity of women’s lives. Women of color in the U.S., for example, not only define themselves in a struggle against white men and men of color, but also in resistance to white women. The same holds for third world women who find themselves fighting against the omission of their experiences and the overarching assumptions made by “first world” feminists regarding their needs and the forms of subordination they confront. Moving away from a monolithic notion of woman, U.S. feminist theory and practice engages difference by focusing on context-specific positionings of women in relation to other constantly changing categories. But some women worry that without a commonality uniting women the power to make changes will be lost.
To address the complexity of the multitude of oppressions confronting women, Mohanty suggests a model based on “imagined communities of women” organized by “the way we think about race, class, and gender—the political links we choose to make among and between struggles” (1991:4). In these communities, political alliances are formed not by a person’s race or sex, but on the basis of “common contexts of struggle against specific exploitative structures[.]” (1991:7) Today, U.S. mainstream feminism is engaged with recognizing diversity and forming cross-cultural coalitions against injustices. The recognition of difference, however, is not complete without a further commitment to making institutional change.
Like sexism, racism is a problem that is structural and endemic to American culture and needs to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination. As Robert Bernasconi notes, “Personal attitudes are not the main source of the problem and they cannot provide the solution” (2005: 20). The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women and a blindness of first world complicity in various forms of third world oppressions. Indeed, as Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.” However, by waging struggles against systems of domination and exploitation and assuming responsibility to actively give up the privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition, U.S. feminists embark upon dismantling the master’s house and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.
Still, a change in personal attitudes does go a long way. When mainstream feminists recognize the interconnections between gender, race, nationalism and class, Espiritu writes, “then they can better work with, and not for, women (and men) of color” (Espiritu, 1997: 140). In sum, feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, as well as what unites women in common contexts of struggle. In the early twentieth century, Emma Goldman wrote of the significance of recognizing and respecting differences, while at the same time working together in spite of these differences to challenge institutional inequalities that prevent individuals from living together in a free society. Goldman laid out a vision for a way forward that goes beyond the mere tolerance of difference when she said: “The problem that confronts us today and which the nearest future is to solve, is how to be one’s self and yet in oneness with the others, to feel deeply with all human beings and still retain one’s own characteristic qualities” (1973: 509).
Sharin N. Elkholy
University of Houston – Downtown
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 10, 2012 | Originally published: