Feminist standpoint theorists make three principal claims: (1) Knowledge is socially situated. (2) Marginalized groups are socially situated in ways that make it more possible for them to be aware of things and ask questions than it is for the non-marginalized. (3) Research, particularly that focused on power relations, should begin with the lives of the marginalized. Feminist standpoint theory, then, makes a contribution to epistemology, to methodological debates in the social and natural sciences, to philosophy of science, and to political activism. It has been one of the most influential and debated theories to emerge from second-wave feminist thinking. Feminist standpoint theories place relations between political and social power and knowledge center-stage. These theories are both descriptive and normative, describing and analyzing the causal effects of power structures on knowledge while also advocating a specific route for enquiry, a route that begins from standpoints emerging from shared political struggle within marginalized lives. Feminist standpoint theories emerged in the 1970s, in the first instance from Marxist feminist and feminist critical theoretical approaches within a range of social scientific disciplines. They thereby offer epistemological and methodological approaches that are specific to a variety of disciplinary frameworks, but share a commitment to acknowledging, analyzing and drawing on power/knowledge relationships, and on bringing about change which results in more just societies. Feminist scholars working within a number of disciplines—such as Dorothy Smith, Nancy Hartsock, Hilary Rose, Sandra Harding, Patricia Hill Collins, Alison Jaggar and Donna Haraway—have advocated taking women’s lived experiences, particularly experiences of (caring) work, as the beginning of scientific enquiry. Central to all these standpoint theories are feminist analyses and critiques of relations between material experience, power, and epistemology, and of the effects of power relations on the production of knowledge.
At first blush there appears a tension between the traditional epistemological assumption that a general, universal and abstract account of knowledge and scientific enquiry is possible, and the politically inflected feminist claim that such analyses are only properly understood in the social contexts in which they arise, and in terms of the biases and prejudices those contexts generate. From the outset, then, feminist epistemologies seem to be located within the contradictory pull of the politicized material and experiential concerns of feminism and the abstract universal concerns of epistemology. Feminist epistemological projects began as a critique of that tradition but have evolved beyond the critical to reframe and reconceptualize the problems of knowledge and the epistemological project itself. Feminist epistemology does not adopt a monolithic critical position with respect to a traditional canon of epistemological work; rather it consists of a variety of feminist epistemological approaches, of which feminist standpoint epistemologies form a strand.
Here feminist standpoint theory is examined primarily as a feminist epistemology and as a methodology for feminist researchers in the social sciences where, arguably, feminist standpoint theory has had the most influence and been the subject of most debate. As with feminist theories generally, it would be somewhat misleading to represent feminist standpoint theory as a single set of epistemological commitments or a single methodological approach. More appropriate would be to think of them in terms of ‘standpoint theories’. Nevertheless, standpoint theories share common commitments and approaches, which are taken as the focus here. Aspects of those theories that attract controversy both within and outside of the intellectual conversations in which feminist standpoint theories have been developed and employed are also briefly discussed.
The genealogy of feminist standpoint theory begins in Hegel’s account of the master/slave dialectic, and subsequently in Marx and, particularly, Lukacs’ development of the idea of the standpoint of the proletariat. Hegel argued that the oppressed slave can eventually reach a state of freedom of consciousness as a result of her/his realization of self-consciousness through struggles against the master, and via involvement through physical labor in projects that enable her/him to fashion the world—to affect it in various ways. Hegel’s analysis of the struggle inherent in the master/slave relationship gave rise to the insight that oppression and injustice are better analyzed and understood from the point of view of the slave than from that of the master. Marx and Engels, and, later, Lukacs developed this Hegelian idea within the framework of the dialectic of class consciousness, thereby giving rise to the notion of a standpoint of the proletariat (the producers of capital) as an epistemic position that, it was argued, provided a superior starting point for understanding and eventually changing the world than that of the controllers and owners of capital. The Hegelian and Marxist traditions, then, provide the genesis of standpoint theorists’ claim that the ‘double vision’ afforded to those who experience social relations from a position of marginality can, under certain circumstances, offer them epistemic advantage.
Although their genealogy begins in the Hegelian and Marxist traditions, some current feminist standpoint theories are also located squarely within an empiricist tradition in epistemology. These feminist epistemologies extend the traditional empiricist commitment to experience and observation as the starting points for knowledge. Following Quine and his successors, they recognize and acknowledge that observation is theory-laden and that those theories themselves are artifacts of our making. They also draw on the insight that a set of observation-based data can serve as equally credible evidence for more than one of those theories.
Feminist standpoint theorists such as sociologists Dorothy Smith and Patricia Hill Collins, political philosophers Nancy Hartsock and Alison Jaggar, sociologist of science Hilary Rose, and philosopher of science Sandra Harding extended and reframed the idea of the standpoint of the proletariat to mark out the logical space for a feminist standpoint. Their principal claim regarding feminist standpoint theories is that certain socio-political positions occupied by women (and by extension other groups who lack social and economic privilege) can become sites of epistemic privilege and thus productive starting points for enquiry into questions about not only those who are socially and politically marginalized, but also those who, by dint of social and political privilege, occupy the positions of oppressors. This claim is captured by Sandra Harding thus: “Starting off research from women’s lives will generate less partial and distorted accounts not only of women’s lives but also of men’s lives and of the whole social order.” [1993: 56]
Following Marxist tradition in rejecting liberal assumptions that social and historical factors are irrelevant to epistemic questions, central tenets of feminist standpoint theories include their recognition of the role of social and historical location in shaping epistemic agents and their knowledge, and an embrace of that location as a potentially valuable contribution to knowledge. Feminist standpoint theories work towards an epistemic approach that continues to value objectivity (albeit rethought and reworked) as a goal of enquiry, while at the same time accommodating, analyzing and understanding the effects of social location on epistemic agents and on knowledge. This stance is in stark contrast to the relatively pervasive traditional assumption that recognizing the effects of the socio-historical location of epistemic agents rather than abstracting them from that location disrupts enquiry. Feminist standpoint theories, then, involve a commitment to the view that all attempts to know are socially situated. The social situation of an epistemic agent—her gender, class, race, ethnicity, sexuality and physical capacities—plays a role in forming what we know and limiting what we are able to know. They can affect what we are capable of knowing and what we are permitted to know. The influence of social location on epistemic content and capacity can be felt throughout our epistemic practices, shaping not only the way in which we understand the world, but also the way in which it is presented to us via experience. Consider the following example offered by Terri Elliot:
Person A approaches a building and enters it unproblematically. As she approaches she sees something perfectly familiar which, if asked, she might call ‘The Entrance’. Person X approaches the same building and sees a great stack of stairs and the glaring lack of a ramp for her wheelchair. [1994: 424]
The experience of person A is of the entrance to a building. Whereas the experience of person X is of a barrier to entrance and (at best) an inconvenience. Person X’s social location—qua person with a disability—means that the building presents differently to her from how it does to someone without a disability.
Feminist standpoint theories seek, moreover, to go beyond analysis and description of the role played by social location in structuring and shaping knowledge. The normative aspect of feminist standpoint theories manifests firstly in a commitment to the thesis that the ways in which power relations inflect knowledge need not be understood as with a subjectivity that threatens their objectivity; rather that socially situated knowledge can be properly objective. Secondly, feminist standpoint theories’ normative weight is felt via their commitment to the claim, developed by extension of the Marxist view of the epistemic status of the standpoint of the proletariat, that some social locations, specifically marginalized locations, are epistemically superior in that they afford hitherto unrecognized epistemic privilege, thereby correcting falsehoods and revealing previously suppressed truths. Thus, as Sandra Harding puts it, “Standpoint theories map how a social and political disadvantage can be turned into an epistemic, scientific and political advantage.” [2004; 7-8]
Standpoint theories, then, move beyond a descriptive situated-knowledge thesis to a normative thesis, among the transformative objectives of which is a more socially just world.
The concept of a standpoint employed in feminist standpoint theories takes a narrow meaning, owed to Marxist theory, according to which a standpoint is an achieved collective identity or consciousness. The establishment of a standpoint is the political achievement of those whose social location forms its starting point; it is not merely ascribed from beyond that location. There is a consensus among feminist standpoint theorists that a standpoint is not merely a perspective that is occupied simply by dint of being a woman. Whereas a perspective is occupied as a matter of the fact of one’s socio-historical position and may well provide the starting point for the emergence of a standpoint, a standpoint is earned through the experience of collective political struggle, a struggle that requires, as Nancy Hartsock puts it, both science and politics [Harding 2004: p. 8]. By way of emphasis of this point, Hartsock uses the label ‘feminist standpoint’ whereas Dorothy Smith uses the label ‘women’s standpoint’, reflecting the way in which standpoint theory argues for “women’s place” as a starting point for enquiry [Harding 2004: 21].
So while both the dominant and the dominated occupy perspectives, the dominated are much more successfully placed to achieve a standpoint. Nevertheless, it is not impossible for those who occupy non-marginalized perspectives to become part of the process of helping reach a shared critical consciousness with respect to the effects of power structures on epistemic production. There are many different lives consisting of many different activities and many different social relations and, thus, potentially many different consciousnesses and many different standpoints. The ongoing political and epistemic project of achieving a standpoint offers critical insights that give rise to a new perspective on reality. Sandra Harding explains the point thus,
Only through such struggles can we begin to see beneath the appearances created by an unjust social order to the reality of how this social order is in fact constructed and maintained. This need for struggle emphasizes the fact that a feminist standpoint is not something that anyone can have simply by claiming it. It is an achievement. A standpoint differs in this respect from a perspective, which anyone can have simply by ‘opening one’s eyes’. [1991: 127]
According to feminist standpoint theories, the process of achieving knowledge begins when standpoints begin to emerge. They emerge when those who are marginalized and relatively invisible from the vantage point of the epistemically privileged become conscious of their social situation with respect to socio-political power and oppression, and begin to find a voice. It is no historical accident that feminist standpoint theory emerged in academic discourses more or less contemporaneously with the feminist consciousness movement within feminist activism. This demonstrates the way in which feminist standpoint theories are grounded in feminist political practice. Contrary to the tendency of critics who perceive feminist standpoint theory via an individualist lens, mistakenly reducing the notion of a standpoint to an individual’s social location, the emergence of standpoints is a collective process occurring through the recognition and acknowledgment of others who occupy more or less the same standpoint as oneself. Although such narratives may form a starting point, the emergence of a standpoint does not consist merely in the telling of individual women’s narratives. Self-definition in terms of a standpoint provides a starting point for the self-assertion of one’s own identity, challenging those identities imposed by conventional stereotypes that form part of hegemonic ways of thinking from the point of view of the socially and politically dominant. This assertion of identity—of who I am—adds to a body of knowledge about how my life is and how I experience the world. Those truths debunk myths about me, about my relationship with the world, and about my relationships with others in that world that have heretofore been taken to be true. In this vein, Patricia Hill Collins discusses a stereotypical understanding of African American women working as domestic servants—the Mammy stereotype which objectifies black women as ‘faithful and obedient’ domestic servants, dedicated to the care of their white family—in contrast to the Sapphire, controlling and manipulative, or the Jezebel, a temptress [1990; 456]. As Collins shows, stereotypes such as these serve as ‘controlling images’ that serve to reinforce for everyone, including African American women, the ways of thinking from the point of view of the racially and sexually dominant. This way of thinking oppresses as it constrains what can be known about being an African American woman. African American women, rather than racist and sexist social structures, are blamed for that oppression. Thus the epistemic process whereby a standpoint emerges enables the occupants of that standpoint to gain an element of power and control over knowledge about their lives. In becoming occupants of a standpoint, they also become knowing subjects in their own right, rather than merely objects that are known by others.
As shown by the claim from Harding that appears at the end of the previous section, feminist standpoint theorists argue that the epistemic and political advantages of beginning enquiry from within women’s lived experiences are not limited to providing a truer account of those lives, but of all the lives and socio-political relations within which those lives are enmeshed. Initial enquiry in women’s lived experiences, mediated by the politicized consciousness that emerges within a feminist standpoint, reveals the way in which male-dominated ideologies distort reality. Standpoints make visible aspects of social relations and of the natural world that are unavailable from dominant perspectives, and in so doing they generate the kinds of questions that will lead to a more complete and true account of those relations. Feminist standpoint theorists point out that, in order to survive within social structures in which one is oppressed, one is required to understand practices of oppression, to understand both oppressed and oppressor; but, this epistemic bi-polarity is neither required of, nor available to, the dominant. For example, the colonized have to learn the language of the colonizer—the New Zealand Māori learned English while use of the Māori language was strongly discouraged, for instance—in order to survive colonization, but the colonizer need not learn the language of the colonized in order to survive. The colonized, then, have some means of entry into the world of the colonizer, and the potential for gaining some understanding of how the world works from that perspective, but the colonizer is generally shut out of the world of the colonized and restricted to a mono-visual view of how the world is. The double vision afforded via the social location of women and other marginalized groups can provide the epistemic advantage of insights into social relations that are unavailable to the non-marginalized. An illustration of the way in which the often undervalued, messy caring work (caring for the sick and the elderly, bearing and raising children, unrewarding, unpaid domestic labor, emotional labor) in which women are traditionally engaged offers productive epistemic starting points; Hartsock cites a passage from Marilyn French’s novel The Women’s Room:
Washing the toilet used by three males, and the floor and walls around it, is, Mira thought, coming face to face with necessity. And that is why women were saner than men, did not come up with the made, absurd schemes men developed; they were in touch with necessity, they had to wash the toilet bowl and the floor. [Harding 2004: 43; French, 1978: 214]
Mediated via a critical standpoint, Mira’s lived experience could form a wellspring of epistemic insights not only into the gender power relations of which her situation (cleaning up men’s mess) is a result, but also of the basic necessities of all our lives and of the need to ensure that they are met equitably. Thus, from this starting point in the material condition of women’s lives, questions arise that would not otherwise get asked, and these questions can form rich sites for research, for policy reform and, ultimately, for social change. For instance, such questions might address issues such as violence against women—why is it so prevalent in so many societies against women of all classes and races, and why are women so often blamed for it? While violence against women remains an ongoing challenge and tragedy, women have derived epistemic advantage from the conceptual resources and clearer understanding of violence that has been afforded to them within feminist standpoints. In turn, this stronger understanding has flowed into social and political discourses to the extent that, at least in some parts of the world, violence is no longer considered acceptable or part of the normal dynamics of a marriage or partnership. Moreover, campaigning by women and their male allies has resulted, in some jurisdictions, in an anti-violence policy environment, and in legal protection and redress for women. Moreover, women’s feminist stand against family violence has (among other factors) motivated researchers to look for and critically analyze the causes and conditions of family violence, such as poverty and inter-generational family violence. In so doing, they have widened understanding of, and enquiry into, family violence more generally to encompass violence perpetrated on children, on male partners, and on elders. Other sites of enquiry that emerge from women’s lived experience might include: Gender equity in the workplace—why are women so over-represented in low-paid and under- or unvalued caring work?; Gender equity in the domestic sphere—why is it often considered normal or usual for a woman to work a double shift, one outside the home and one at home?; Bodies and their normal biological processes—why are menstruation, birthing and menopause understood as medical problems to be treated as illnesses?; Women’s bodies and objectification—why do women’s bodies continue to be used to promote and sell products that run the gamut from instant coffee powder to motorsport?
The development of a standpoint by the dominated dissipates the conceptual dissonance experienced by someone who has been forced to adopt dominant conceptual frameworks that do not truly belong to them. Conceptual frameworks emanating from patriarchal systems fail to provide cognitive tools that enable women and others who are marginalized to make sense of their experiences in and of the world. The emergence of appropriate conceptual frameworks furnishes the marginalized with the cognitive tools to become epistemic subjects, whereas previously they are merely known by others. It enables them to name and think about their experiences in ways that properly represent those experiences. That is not to say that existing conceptual frameworks have been of no use whatsoever for women, for even this conceptual dissonance has been mediated and expressed within those frameworks. Rather, thinking from within a standpoint enables the emergence of conceptual frameworks which resolve the contradictions that arise, and fill the gaps and silences that are left empty when using a conceptual framework that is not entirely fit for purpose.
Some critics of standpoint theories have charged that their central claim of epistemic advantage amounts to a claim of automatic epistemic privilege. However, as we have seen in Section 4, a standpoint is not equivalent to a social location and the standpoint theorist’s claim is not that epistemic advantage is bestowed by dint of one’s social location, but that it is rather earned through involvement in collective political struggle. Theorists argue that experiences of the marginalized reveal problems to be explained; problems that can become research agendas or policy issues/initiatives and are a source of objectivity-maximizing questions. Such questions force us to examine the beliefs, prejudices and biases of the dominant groups in society, the propositions that have previously counted as knowledge. It is in this way, feminist standpoint theorists propose, that we achieve less partial and distorted understandings of all of our lives than we do if we allow questions about those lives to originate only from the experiences of dominant groups. The realities of women’s lives, then, can provide sites of enquiry that lead to new, more complete, less partial, and more objective knowledge.
Moreover, as Alison Wylie argues [2004: 345-6], standpoint theorists’ situated-knowledge claims explicitly undermine the conventional assumption that objective epistemic agents are non-specifically located, and that they are neutral and disinterested with respect to the subject of their enquiry. In so doing, however, standpoint theorists’ approach to the method of enquiry demonstrates a commitment to what are typically taken to be its virtues when it is scientific: empirical adequacy, construed as either empirical depth or breadth; internal coherence; inferential robustness; consistency with relevant well-established bodies of knowledge; and, explanatory power. Indeed, as Wylie notes, feminist interventions in social and scientific enquiry have been successful in demonstrating how it thus far has not always manifested those virtues. Standpoint theorists move beyond this critical moment, showing how the inclusion of lived realities, not yet properly visible to enquirers, can make for better-supported hypotheses. In a case study of archaeology considered in their article “Coming to Terms with the Values of Science”, Wylie and Nelson point out the ways in which researchers taking a gender-sensitive standpoint with respect to studies on netting and basketry and on skeletal remains have resulted in (among other things) a widening of the evidential base of archaeological enquiry in these areas, leading to the re-examination of established hypotheses [2007: 64-70].
The epistemic advantage of the ‘double vision’ afforded to those in the position of being outsiders within is a recurring theme of feminist standpoint theories. Several theorists emphasize the epistemic advantage afforded to those forced conceptually to straddle both sides of a dichotomous social divide. That advantage is captured by black feminist critic Bell Hooks’ description of growing up in small-town Kentucky thus:
Living as we did—on the edge—we developed a particular way of seeing reality. We looked both from the outside in and from the inside out…we understood both. [1984: vii]
Patricia Hill Collins, for instance, considers black feminist academics to occupy a position of potential epistemic privilege in so far as they are, on the one hand, insiders by dint of their position as authentic academics; yet, on the other hand, outsiders in so far as they are women and black, thus remaining to some extent decentered within the context of the Academy. This places them in a unique position from which to understand how things are in the Academy from the perspective of an insider who enjoys some degree of power and privilege both professionally and personally as a result of her membership, and who at the same time has an understanding of how things are from the perspective of one who is marginalized with respect to the centre of that power as a result of her gender and race. The dual perspective available to someone in this position leaves her well-placed to recognize the underlying assumptions and evaluative commitments that drive and shape the dynamics of power within the Academy, while at the same time providing her with a critical frame of reference derived from her own experience of the Academy, within which to potentially gain a better understanding of its power structures and dynamics. A dual perspective such as this, then, could form the basis of a feminist standpoint which would generate challenging questions about the social and political structures that engender the reality that black women academics experience in their professional and personal lives. In addition, standpoint theories offer explanatory resources for understanding how this dual positioning can potentially bestow epistemic advantage.
The self-reflexivity inherent in the identification of this insider/outsider position as a potentially advantaged epistemic location connects with the broader feminist theme of the (often vexed) relationship between feminist practice and feminist theory. Several feminist standpoint theorists’ work starts in their own lives, their initial site of analysis is the material experience of women as academics and scientists. Feminist sociologist Dorothy Smith argues that women sociologists are placed at the centre of a contradiction in the relation of their discipline to their experience of the world. This contradiction leads to a ‘bifurcation of consciousness’ [Harding 2004: p. 27]. On one side of that divide is the conceptual practice of academic work conducted within the conceptual structures of the discipline of sociology; and on the other, the concrete of the domestic sphere. She argues that sociological discourse has been authored and authorized by men, noting that the frames of reference against which its discourses of enquiry and discussion take place have their origins in men’s lived experiences, not women’s. The sociologist is thus conceived of as male, and women cannot be afforded the status of full participants in the practices of sociology without suffering a ‘double estrangement’. To gain legitimacy and status as sociologists they must suspend their identities qua women.
In her “Hand, Brain and Heart: A Feminist Epistemology for the Natural Sciences”, Hilary Rose makes similar points with respect to women in the natural sciences—‘Women Scientists in the Men’s Laboratories’, as she puts it [Harding 2004: 75]. Those women also have to negotiate the contradictory demands of private and professional spheres. Drawing on physicist Evelyn Fox Keller’s accounts of her experiences as a student (which includes narrative of male students avoiding her and a male university teacher not countenancing the possibility that she could solve mathematical problems without male help), Rose, like Smith, identifies a split in the woman scientist’s consciousness: she is ‘cut in two’, her abstract, conceptual scientific labor arises in ‘painful contradiction’ with her caring labor [Harding 2004: 76]. The implicit requirement that a woman suppress part of herself in order to acquire any professional credibility is one reason, Rose argues, why women scientists were, and in some disciplines remain, comparative rarities.
Thus, while the outsider-within position can afford the epistemic advantage of ‘double vision’ in the absence of the kind of political context and consciousness of which a standpoint is constituted, those benefits can remain unrealized as women scientists suppress their identity as women and as feminists in order to pass as scientists. As Uma Narayan has argued, it should be acknowledged that this colonialized bi-culturalism has a ‘dark side’ [Harding 2004: 221-3] with which women adopt various strategies to survive. In order to negotiate and cope, the best she can, with various contexts in which she finds herself having to operate, a woman might suppress part of herself in some of those contexts while assuming the persona best suited to each. Thus some women professionals emphasize only those characteristics considered valuable in their professional context, allowing themselves to be women and feminist only in private contexts. Alternatively, a woman might simply try to imitate the traits, habits and practices of the dominant group while suppressing herself entirely. For the feminist standpoint theorist, an alternative to these strategies is to attempt to remain within the contradictory contexts, and to do so critically. This is, potentially, the most epistemically powerful response, but it is also the most challenging given the risk of alienation from oneself and from those with whom one may have the most in common.
The difficulty of surmounting such challenges might account, in part, for the tension inherent in many feminist standpoint theorists’ accounts of epistemic insight. This tension arises between, on the one hand, recognition that epistemic insights occur as a result of an individual’s insider/outsider experience and, on the other, the central claim that a standpoint is a shared, rather than an individual, achievement. Perhaps the existence of this tension reinforces the claim that, while epistemic insight is achievable on the basis of individual insider/outsider experience, it is only from the political context and shared consciousness of a standpoint that such insights can be truly advantageous and move those within it from improved understanding of the realities of their lives towards social and political change.
More than three decades have passed since the publication of the first work that developed and advocated feminist standpoint theories. Yet standpoint theory remains controversial and its controversies manifest both between and beyond feminist scholars, as Alison Wylie writes,
Standpoint theory may rank as one of the most contentious theories to have been proposed and debated in the twenty-five to thirty year history of second-wave feminist thinking about knowledge and science. Its advocates, as much as its critics, disagree vehemently about its parentage, its status as a theory, and crucially, its relevance to current thinking about knowledge. [Harding 2004: 339-40]
This section outlines what are perhaps the most significant challenges to feminist standpoint theory.
Since feminist standpoint theories take the view that enquiry is best started from within women’s material experience and that epistemic advantage ensues from within standpoints that emerge from that experience, they can mistakenly be understood to espouse an essentialist universalism, according to which women are afforded automatic epistemic privilege simply for the fact of their being women. Since feminist standpoint theorists argue that enquiry is best started from women’s lives, and that standpoints emerge only when women begin to reflect upon and question the reality of those lives through a politicized framework, feminist standpoint theories can also be misunderstood as proposing a single, monolithic feminist standpoint. This misunderstanding presents this feminist standpoint as arising not from ordinary women’s lives but from the lives of relatively privileged, mostly middle-class, mostly white, women academics.
A good proportion of the work that has since built on early moments in feminist standpoint theory has focused on incorporating considerations of difference within feminist standpoint theories. Feminist standpoint theories are clearly not committed to the project of formulating a homogenous women’s or feminist standpoint. Rather, they recognize that women’s presence in many areas of the terrain of social and economic marginalization means that women occupy positions at the intersection of a number of oppressive social structures.
However, reconciliation between feminist standpoint theories and those feminist theories which prioritize difference remains problematic and presents a dilemma: The formation of a standpoint requires shared experiences of oppression and of struggle against that oppression. But the inclusion of those experiences within a standpoint, it can be argued, runs the risk of occluding epistemically significant differences between women. A feminist standpoint may be taken (implicitly) as the position of all women, but what account is taken of class, race, sexuality, and other markers of difference, which structure the power relations that generate oppression, the shared experience of which forms the basis of the standpoint? The response to this dilemma from within standpoint theory has been, firstly, to emphasize that feminist standpoint theories envisage a plurality of feminist standpoints; and, secondly, to modify feminist standpoint theories to take account of the ways in which women’s different experiences at the intersections of various oppressive social structures will engender different standpoints. Patricia Hill Collins and Bell Hooks, for example, have developed black feminist standpoint theories that take into account the role of women of color in slavery and in devalued menial and caring labor, and the way in which this oppression is experienced at the hands of other, mostly white, women.
Thirdly, some feminist standpoint theorists respond head-on to the charge that by focusing on the experiences that are common to most women, standpoint theories fail to take account of significant differences between women. Maria Mies and Vandana Shiva, for example, participate in the feminist standpoint conversation from within their own experiences as activists in the women’s and ecology movements. They argue, contrary to the charge of false universalization, that there are many examples of women’s activism in pursuit of environmental causes which demonstrate the reality of women overcoming differences and developing a shared sense of solidarity through which they begin to gain an understanding of the oppressive relations in which their lives are enmeshed [Harding, 2004: 334-5]. Thus, as standpoints emerge, some differences will be occluded, but some significant similarities will be thrown into sharper relief.
Postmodernist feminist critics argue not only that the risk of occlusion of difference remains but, more fatally with respect to the possibility of reconciliation, the categories upon which feminist standpoint theory depends—woman, feminist, knowledge—are fluid and in a state of socially influenced flux and contestation, making it impossible ever properly to capture experiences and identities within standpoints. Standpoint theorists counter that the idea that identity is fluid itself puts the political power of feminism at risk and threatens the loss of the material experience of women’s oppression. Standpoint and postmodernist feminism remain opposed in this respect: the former requires materiality as its starting point, the latter rejects the reality of that ‘real world’ outright. As Haraway puts the point from the perspective of the former position:
[T]o lose authoritative biological accounts of sex, which set up productive tensions with its binary pair, gender, seems to be to lose too much; it seems to be to lose not just analytical power within a particular Western tradition, but the body itself as anything but a blank page for social inscriptions, including those of biological discourse. [Harding 2004: p. 94]
The charge that feminist standpoint epistemologies are committed to a politically dangerous epistemic relativism ensues from the claim that all knowledge is socially situated and that some social values enhance the process of enquiry and the acquisition of knowledge.
In response to this charge, Sandra Harding reconceptualizes objectivity, arguing for the pursuit of strong objectivity [1993: passim]. Harding argues that standpoint theory imposes a rigorous logic of discovery involving a strong demand for ongoing reflection and self-critique from within a standpoint, enabling the justification of socially-situated knowledge claims. This critical approach, Harding asserts, results in a stronger notion of objectivity than that achieved by traditional approaches to enquiry. The traditional starting point for knowledge is the position of the dominant and, despite assumptions to the contrary, that position is ideologically permeated. This results in partial and distorted accounts of reality, which thereby fail to live up to modernistic standards of impartiality, neutrality and universality associated with a commitment to epistemic objectivity.
With regard to the idea that the reconceptualization of objectivity represents a retreat from modernity, rationality and science [Walby, 2001: 489], Harding labels her feminist standpoint approach ‘neo-modern’ [2001: 518]. By these lights, feminist standpoint theories remain committed to strengthening modernist commitments to truth and objectivity, but are distanced from modernity’s absolutist overtones. Strong objectivity encompasses a sense of completeness and a lack of distortion. The ultimate epistemic goal of enquiry based on this model would be the inclusion of all standpoints, enabling the revelation of different aspects of truth. This would be a dialectical process consistent with standpoint theories’ roots in the Marxist tradition. Objective enquiry modelled thus requires trust—we need to trust others truthfully to reveal aspects of reality. Conceived thus, objectivity is not a goal that is easily achievable.
Some, such as Helen Longino  and Susan Hekman  have argued that two of the central tenets of feminist standpoint theories—the claim that knowledge is socially situated and the claim that marginalized standpoints (but not perspectives) offer epistemic advantage—are in deep tension with each other. On the one hand, it is claimed that there is no standpoint-neutral vantage point from which to make judgements about the relative epistemic superiority of certain standpoints over other ways of knowing the world; while on the other it is claimed that marginalized standpoints are, indeed, epistemically better than the epistemic positions of the non-marginalized. If this tension cannot be resolved, it is argued, the standpoint theorist is pushed back towards the relativistic embrace of ‘multiple and incompatible knowledge positions’ [Longino 1993: 107].
Harding’s ‘strong objectivity’ suggests a possible dissolution of this apparent tension. Responses to the claim of a bias paradox offered by Rebecca Kukla  and Kristina Rollins can be understood as means by which Harding’s notion can be realized. Both draw upon the resources of contextual approaches to epistemic justification to show how taking account of the social location of epistemic agents can strengthen knowledge claims. Kukla draws upon and extends Wilfrid Sellars’ account of perceptual warrant to argue for an account of epistemic objectivity in which contingent, contextual factors such as gender and race are recognized as sources of justification for knowledge claims, rather than rejected as disruptors of ‘aperspectival’ objective epistemic endeavor [2006: 86-7]. Only when we are socially located in certain respects, Kukla argues, can we best perceive certain aspects of reality.
Rollins, meanwhile, argues that the bias paradox arises out of a foundationalist framework: The standard of impartiality against which standpoints would be assessed involves basic, foundational beliefs and, according to foundationalism, these cannot be socially situated; hence, the tension between standpoint theories’ epistemic advantage thesis on the one hand and situated knowledge thesis on the other. Drawing and expanding upon the resources of Michael Williams’ contextualism, Rollins argues that by offering a standard of impartiality provided by a context of default entitlements whose status as such is always context-dependent, contextualism shows how it is possible to establish standards of epistemic justification that are themselves situated knowledge claims [2006: 129]. It is against a background of a standard such as this that it would be possible to claim, without retreat to relativism, that marginalized standpoints can offer epistemic advantage.
Generally, with respect to their commitment to objectivity, then, feminist standpoint theories can be understood as attempts to synthesize the elements that usually create an inherent tension in feminist and emancipationist projects. This tension arises from acknowledging the epistemic value of the inescapable social situation and dependence of epistemic subjects and of knowledge, and yet remaining committed to the idea that we don’t make the world up. Feminist standpoint theory attempts to occupy a position that incorporates both epistemic deference to the world and acceptance of the way in which that world and the ways we experience and understand it are shaped by our material circumstances. Feminist standpoint theory is also informed by an acceptance of the way in which different experiences, needs and interests give rise to different practices, and different ways of thinking about and interacting with the world, some of which are better than others. Real knowledge on this view just is socially situated; it is interested as opposed to disinterested [Harding 2004: 24-25]. In this vein, feminist standpoint theory serves as a critique of conventional epistemic standards, arguing that what Donna Haraway dubbed ‘the God Trick’—the traditional epistemic view that knowledge is only achieved by adopting a disinterested, impartial view from nowhere—is unachievable, for knowledge is always from somewhere [Harding, 2004: 93].
Many of the seminal articles on feminist standpoint theories, including the papers by Dorothy Smith, Nancy Hartsock, Hilary Rose, Patricia Hill Collins and Donna Haraway mentioned here are now collected together in Harding’s The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader. Harding’s collection also includes more recent papers that make new contributions to these debates, including the papers by Mies and Shiva, Narayan and Wylie.
Susan Hekman’s article “Truth and Method: Feminist Standpoint Theory Revisited”, Signs Vol 22, No. 2 (Winter, 1997) provides a critical response to feminist standpoint theories which manifests the tension between standpoint theory and the preoccupations of postmodernist feminism. This article and replies from Harding, Hartsock, Hill Collins and Smith all appear in Harding’s 2004 collection.
University of Waikato
Last updated: March 11, 2011 | Originally published: