Feng Youlan (Fung Yu-lan, 1895-1990)

Feng Youlan (romanized as Fung Yu-lan) was a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Throughout his long and turbulent life, he consistently engaged the problem of reconciling traditional Chinese thought with the methods and concerns of modern Western philosophy. Raised by a modernist family who nonetheless gave him a traditional Confucian education, Feng pursued two great goals during his career: rewriting the history of Chinese philosophy from a modern perspective, and developing a reconstructed version of Chinese philosophy that could respond to the modern situation. The famous translator of Chinese philosophical texts, Wing-tsit Chan, summed up Feng’s contribution by saying: “At a time when Chinese intellectuals saw little value in the Chinese tradition, Professor Feng upheld it.”

Although Feng published his monumental and still-influential Zhongguo zhexue shi (History of Chinese Philosophy) in 1934, his effort to synthesize the traditional Neo-Confucianism of Cheng Hao, Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi with the philosophical traditions of the modern West that he studied with John Dewey took much longer to complete and arguably was never entirely successful. Between 1939 and 1947, during the early years of China’s occupation by Japan, Feng published Xin lixue (New Teaching of Principle), in which he presented Chinese philosophy, particularly Confucianism, as valuable for addressing both “the True Realm” (corresponding to the transcendent, metaphysical world of what Confucians call li – “principle” or cosmic norms – and ti, “substance”) and “the Real Realm” (corresponding to the immanent, physical world of qi, “energy” or material forms, and yong, “function”). Feng contrasted Daoist philosophy, which he labeled “the philosophy of subtraction” (that is, inward-looking and seeking unity with nature), and both Mohist and Western philosophy, which he described as “the philosophy of augmentation” (that is, outward-looking and seeking to master nature); with Confucian philosophy, which he saw as “the middle way” between so-called “other-worldly” and “this-worldly” philosophies.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan and the successful Communist revolution in the 1940s, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule, even going so far as to denounce Confucius during the final years of the Cultural Revolution (1966-1976). This effort provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West. Partly as a result of his controversial immersion in Maoist politics, Feng’s most enduring contribution to Chinese philosophy probably is his historical account of the subject rather than his own philosophical synthesis. Nonetheless, his work remains an interesting example of the way in which early 20th century Chinese thinkers attempted to develop a rational philosophical system that was credible to both Chinese and Western traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophical Works
    1. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals
    2. Six Books of Zhengyuan
  3. A History of Chinese Philosophy
  4. Influence
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Feng Youlan, whose zi (“style”) or courtesy name was Zhisheng, was born on December 4, 1895, in Tanghe County, Henan Province, to an affluent and prominent family.  Feng’s father completed the highest level of study required by the Qing dynasty imperial civil service and headed the local Confucian academy, but also maintained a personal library that included books about the West and modern affairs. From the age of six, Feng pursued a private education in the Confucian curriculum typical of the time, but had little interest in traditional rote learning. At the age of fifteen, he began studying in the county middle school and one year later transferred to high school, first in the provincial capital of Kaifeng, and then in neighboring Hubei Province. At the age of seventeen, he was admitted to the preparatory class of the Chinese Public University in Shanghai, where all courses were taught with English textbooks and the curriculum included Western logic and philosophy.

Feng studied philosophy at Peking (Beijing) University from 1915 to 1918, during which time he was exposed to various forms of foreign thought, ranging from the philosophy of Henri Bergson to the “New Realism” associated with British philosophers such as W. P. Montague. Also during this time, the New Cultural Movement, which questioned traditional Confucian values, was in full swing, provoking counter-reactions from conservative Confucian scholars. At Peking University, Feng met both Hu Shi (1891-1962), the iconoclast critic of Confucianism and Liang Shuming (1893-1988), the New Confucian apologist and social activist. In 1919, he traveled to the United States and, like Hu Shi before him, studied with John Dewey at Columbia University. He was deeply impressed by the United States’ advanced technology, emphasis on commerce, and atmosphere of law and order, which helped to confirm his sense that the Chinese psyche was inward-looking, contemplative, and holistic, while the Western spirit was outward-looking, analytical, and reductionistic. He was among the first to introduce Liang Shuming’s work to America.

In 1923, Feng completed his Ph.D. at Columbia, having entitled his dissertation A Comparison of Life Ideals. Looking back at this early work some sixty years later, Feng wrote:

I maintained that the difference between cultures is the difference between the East and the West. This was in fact the prevailing opinion at that time.  However, as I further studied the history of philosophy, I found this prevailing opinion to be incorrect. I discovered that what is considered to be the philosophy of the East has existed in the history of the philosophy of the West as well, and vice versa. I discovered that mankind has the same essential nature and the same problems of life… (Feng 2008: 658)

After completing his doctoral studies at Columbia, Feng returned to China and began his long teaching career there, having paid close attention to intellectual trends in China while he was abroad. Between 1923 and 1926, Feng held appointments in the philosophy departments of several Chinese universities, culminating in his being named Chair of the Philosophy Department and Dean of College of Humanities at Beijing’s prestigious Tsinghua (Qinghua) University in 1927.

In 1934, Feng had a fateful encounter with Communist ideology that would influence the future course of his life. While en route to a philosophical conference in Prague, he stopped to visit the Soviet Union, where he found a grand social experiment in progress.  Although he was not blind to the imperfections of Soviet Communism, he also was attracted to its utopian possibilities, as he later proclaimed in public speeches. As a result of his visit to the Soviet Union, he was detained briefly by Jiang Jieshi’s (Chiang Kai-shek’s) Nationalist government, but upon his release established a close relationship with the regime, which then ruled China despite the revolutionary activities of Communist factions. The outbreak of war between China and Japan in 1937 inspired Feng to work for the patriotic recognition and preservation of China’s unique philosophical heritage.  Between 1937 and 1946, he published a series of books to help justify Jiang Jieshi’s New Life Movement, which sought to safeguard the prosperity of the nation by instilling traditional values into Chinese citizens’ daily lives and transforming their moral character.

Due to political upheaval in China following the defeat of Japan in 1945 and the successful Communist revolution in 1949, Feng proved unable to continue this philosophical project and in many ways reversed direction. Telling Chinese Communist Party chairman Mao Zedong that he was “unwilling to be a remnant of a bygone age in a time of greatness,” Feng renounced his association with the Nationalist regime and devoted himself to reinterpreting both his earlier work and Chinese philosophy in general through the lens of Marxist thought, which had become the orthodox ideology in mainland China under Mao’s rule. This new work provoked great controversy among his peers, many of whom had fled China to establish “New Confucian” enclaves within the universities of Hong Kong and Taiwan as well as in the West.

Despite his apparent conversion to doctrinaire Marxism, Feng attempted to preserve a place for Confucianism under Mao’s aegis, asserting that this and other Chinese philosophical traditions, despite their reactionary historical baggage, could be “conceptually and abstractly” relevant in the Communist era. For example, Feng argued that the Confucian concept of ren or “benevolence” had in the past served the purpose of making the oppressed and exploited masses lose sight of intense class struggle and had sedated them into believing a dream of an impossible classless and harmonious society. Feng believed, however, that if taken “abstractly,” ren for all people could be a helpful idea even in Mao’s “New China.”

During China’s Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) Feng, along with many other academics, was denounced by Mao. Near the end of this period, however, Feng was able to regain a measure of public influence by allying himself with Mao’s wife, Jiang Qing, who enlisted his aid in her propaganda campaign against Confucius between 1973 and 1976. After Mao’s death and Jiang’s arrest and imprisonment, Feng’s political decisions cost him both his mianzi (“face” or public reputation) and, for a short time, his freedom.  By the 1980s, Feng was able to return to teaching and began work on a new manuscript entitled A New History of Chinese Philosophy, which was incomplete when he died in 1990.

2. Philosophical Works

a. A Comparative Study of Life Ideals

In 1923, Feng wrote his doctoral thesis A Comparative Study of Life Ideals. As the title of his thesis suggests, the relationship between Chinese and Western cultures was the focal point of his philosophical thinking. According to Feng, all forms of philosophy fall into three categories: “the philosophy of subtraction,” “the philosophy of augmentation,” and “the middle way.” Philosophers who value the natural world and distain human interference with nature wish to return to a state of innocence by reducing human artifice and interference. In this camp Feng placed Laozi and Zhuangzi, both of whom advocated “abandoning humanity and righteousness” and “eliminating sagehood and wisdom.” On the other hand, Feng saw both Western thought and Mozi’s philosophy as encouraging the conquest and transformation of nature and thus belonging to “the philosophy of augmentation.” Finally, Confucianism as Feng sees it insists on cultivating a balanced relationship between humans and nature and is therefore the middle way.

b. Six Books of Zhengyuan

The so-called Six Books of Zhengyuan include A New Philosophy of Principle, New Discourses on Events, New Social Admonitions, A New Inquiry into Man, A New Inquiry into the Tao, and A New Understanding of Language. Here, Feng’s approach was strongly constructive, as he intended to carry forward the Chinese philosophical tradition through these publications. Inspired by Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Cheng Yi, and Zhu Xi, Feng called his philosophy the “New Philosophy of Principle” (Xin lixue).

In order to understand Feng’s reinterpretation of Neo-Confucian thought, it is necessary to examine the Neo-Confucian concepts of li (“principle” or “cosmic pattern”) and qi (“energy” or “material force”). Feng understood these paired concepts as representing the ontological relationship between the universal and the particular. The universal is eternal, abstract and intangible, yet it has a certain material basis in the concrete world or the world of “instruments,” as the Yijing (Book of Changes) describes it: “That which is above physical form is the Dao (“Way”); those things contained by physical form are instruments.” Objects in the concrete world that have physical form are not the proper objects of philosophical thinking. Rather, philosophy is concerned with knowing the universal through logical analysis. Feng distinguished between the metaphysical world of li (which he called “the True Realm”) and and ti (“substance”) and the physical world of qi (“the Real Realm”) and yong (“function”). The True Realm is like an arcane book, such that those with untrained eyes see only blank pages, but philosophical minds see meaningful words engraved on them. Between the two, the True Realm is “first,” not temporally but ontologically. That is, a given class of things in the Real Realm is an imperfect revelation of certain principle in the True Realm. Feng’s reimagined Confucian ethics, in shaping human society, is functionally derived from Principle of the True Realm.

Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” is realist in outlook – that is, it assumes that moral truths exist as facts, and thus that ethics and ontology are interrelated. As facts, moral truths really exist, and possess an inherent but abstract existence as “principle” (li). This “principle” manifests itself concretely as “material force” (qi) in the ever-flowing phenomenal world of the Way (Dao). Like Neo-Confucian thinkers long before him, Feng adapted Chinese Buddhism’s notion of “the emptiness of emptiness” to develop his notion of the Great Whole (daquan), or the totality of all that exists. Within the Great Whole, all things are one, and human beings find their purpose. The self-definition of human beings inevitably comes from their understanding of the universe.

All of this is very much in keeping with traditional Chinese thought’s concern for the harmonious relationship between Heaven, nature and human beings. Feng’s comparative studies of Plato and Zhu Xi, on the one hand, and of Immanuel Kant and the Daoists, on the other hand, represent a revamped lixue based on the fundamental outline of Zhu Xi’s highly influential philosophical synthesis, which (unlike the efforts of most of Feng’s fellow “New Confucians”), bid fair to become a major contribution to world philosophy.  Unfortunately, Feng proved unable to revise, refine, or elaborate upon this groundbreaking work of the 1930s.

3. A History of Chinese Philosophy

Feng began work on A History of Chinese Philosophy during the 1920s. Prior to its publication in 1934, the only available modern critical history of Chinese philosophy was Hu Shi’s Outlines of the History of Chinese Philosophy (1919), which was the first attempt to break away from traditional genres of writing about the history of Chinese philosophy. The latter are often based on unexamined genealogical traditions and historically unreliable materials. In addition, the traditional writings are typically in the form of commentaries and even random notes and reflections on classical texts, and lack a systematic approach. Hu attempted to address these two issues by offering critical scholarship analyzing and authenticating historical documents, on the one hand, and providing a survey of Chinese thought by means of employing Western philosophical concepts, on the other hand. The problem with Hu’s work was that he never finished it. Feng decided to follow in Hu’s footsteps and compose a comprehensive and critical historical account of Chinese philosophy, using the scholarly tools he had mastered at Columbia University. In contrast with Hu’s effort to dismantle and debunk Chinese traditions, however, Feng claimed that his approach more accurately and honestly interpreted the various schools and thinkers of Chinese philosophical traditions. Having based his own philosophy on Confucian concepts, Feng insisted on the central role of Confucianism in Chinese intellectual history.

Feng self-consciously adopted a modern approach to Chinese philosophy. He abandoned the traditional view that all historical Chinese thought was an imperfect interpretation of perfect truths revealed by ancient sages. However, unlike Hu Shi and other iconoclastic scholars of the time, Feng refused to see history as pious fabrications concocted by the political and religious powers of old. His method was to interpret and appreciate tradition as a valuable historical legacy. For instance, against traditional commentators, Feng insisted that the Laozi (also known as the Daodejing) was written at a time much later than the Spring and Autumn Period (770-481 B.C.E.)—a view since borne out by archaeological discoveries, although the date of the text remains a contested issue among scholars. But this does not make the Laozi a worthless forgery, as the iconoclasts contended. Feng was also extremely keen on creating a comprehensive understanding of the entire history of Chinese philosophy. Feng’s intention was to give his readers a sense of the direction and development in Chinese philosophy. He wanted to show that there were periods when Chinese thought was original and creative (such as in the era prior to the Qin dynasty’s establishment in 221 B.C.E.), followed by other periods when it became rigid and stagnant (as in the late feudal society of the 18th and 19th centuries). He also stressed that true philosophy came from observing nature and social life, not from lofty theories and hair-splitting textual analysis.

Many scholars see Feng’s historiographical contributions to Chinese philosophy as much more significant than his original constructive contributions as a Chinese philosopher.  Prior to the publication of A History of Chinese Philosophy, Chinese thinkers did not group their traditional schools of thought with “philosophy” as understood in the West.  It was not until the very late 19th century, in fact, that a word for “philosophy” appeared in East Asian languages. The Japanese thinker Nishi Amane (1829-1897) coined the term tetsugaku, “the study of wisdom,” to approximate the Western concept of “philosophy,” and this term was adopted for use in Chinese by the scholar-official Huang Zunxian (1848-1905) as zhexue, which typically was reserved for the description of Western thought, excluding traditional Chinese thought. Although this exclusive and Eurocentric view of philosophy still has its adherents, Feng’s achievement was in defining Chinese thought and Western thought in terms of the common category of zhexue or “philosophy.”

A History of Chinese Philosophy appeared in several different translations, first in Derk Bodde’s English edition and later in several other languages, including Japanese, French, Italian, Korean, and German. During Feng’s 1948 visit to the University of Pennsylvania, he gave lectures that later became the basis of the English-language book, A Short History of Chinese Philosophy (1948). In the 1980s, Feng began – but never completed – a revised, Marxist version of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which was to be called A New History of Chinese Philosophy.

4. Influence

Views of Feng’s philosophical legacy vary according to cultural context. In China, Feng is considered to be one of the few original philosophers that twentieth-century China produced. Not remembered for his classroom eloquence by his former students, Feng Youlan nevertheless was able to impart his scholarship on, and passion for, Chinese philosophy to generations of students, many of whom currently hold teaching positions in elite Chinese universities.

As a result of their renewed interest in twentieth-century “New Confucian” thinkers, contemporary Chinese scholars have devoted a considerable amount of scholarship to Feng’s “New Philosophy of Principle” (xin lixue), which they typically regard as a systematic and sophisticated endeavor. For many of his Chinese admirers, Feng’s works are evidence that ancient Chinese (especially Confucian) conceptions can be retooled and made useful for modern times. The influence of Feng’s thought is likely to become greater as Confucian traditions enjoy something of a revival across contemporary China.

In the West, on the other hand, Feng’s influence is limited mainly to the reception of A History of Chinese Philosophy, which has been translated into multiple Western languages. With the exception of a few somewhat obscure publications, there has not been substantial Western scholarly engagement of general philosophical interest with Feng’s works. Often recommended as an indispensable read for students of Chinese culture, history, and thought, A History of Chinese Philosophy also has received criticism for its apparent partiality to Confucianism over Buddhism and Daoism, China’s two other great spiritual and intellectual traditions. Although Feng considered himself to be a philosopher, his reputation outside of China is that of an historian, and the nature of Western academic interest in Feng has focused on him as an historical figure in his own right, who lived during a particularly critical and troubled moment in the development of modern China.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chen, Derong. Metaphorical Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy: Illustrated with Feng Youlan’s New Metaphysics. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2011.
  • Chen, Lai. Tradition and Modernity: A Humanist View. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2009.
  • Cheng, Chung-Ying, and Nicholas Bunnin, eds. Contemporary Chinese Philosophy. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 2002.
  • de Bary, William Theodore, and others, eds. Sources of Chinese Tradition. 2 vols. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999-2000.
  • Feng, Youlan. Selected Philosophical Writings of Feng Yu-lan. Beijing: Foreign Languages Press, 2008.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Hall of Three Pines: An Account of My Life. Trans. Denis C. Mair. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 1999.
  • Feng, Youlan. The Spirit of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Ernest Richard Hughes. Boston: Beacon Press, 1962.
  • Feng, Youlan. A History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1952-53.
  • Feng, Youlan. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Trans. Derk Bodde. New York: Free Press, 1948.
  • Makeham, John. New Confucianism: A Critical Examination. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2003.
  • Masson, Michel C. Philosophy and Tradition: The Interpretation of China’s Philosophic Past — Fung Youlan, 1939-1949. Taipei: Ricci Institute, 1985.
  • Obenchain, Diane B., ed. Something Exists: Selected papers of the International Research Seminar on the Thought of Feng Youlan. Honolulu: Dialogue Publishing, 1994.
  • Teoh, Vivienne. The Post ’49 Critiques of Confucius in the PRC, with Special Emphasis on the Views of Feng Youlan and Yang Rongguo: A Case Study of the Relationship between Contemporary Political Values and the Re-evaluation of the History of Chinese Philosophy. Thesis (Ph.D.) — University of New South Wales, 1982.
  • Wycoff, William Alfred. The New Rationalism of Fung Yu-Lan. Thesis (Ph. D.) –Columbia University, 1975.


Author Information

Xiaofei Tu
Email: tux@appalachian.edu
Appalachian State University
U. S. A.