James Frederick Ferrier was born in Edinburgh on June 16, 1808, the son of John Ferrier, writer to the signet. Ferrier was educated by the Reverend H. Duncan, at the manse of Ruthwell, Dumfriesshire; and afterwards at Edinburgh High School, and under Dr. Charles Parr Burney, son of Dr. Charles Burney (1757-1817), at Greenwich. He was at the university of Edinburgh from 1825-1827, and then became a fellow-commoner of Magdalen College, Oxford, where he graduated BA. in 1831. He formed in the same year the acquaintance of Sir William Hamilton, whose influence upon him was very great, and for whose personal character and services to speculation he expresses the highest reverence. For years together he was almost daily in Hamilton’s company for hours. In 1832 he became an advocate, but apparently never practiced. His metaphysical tastes, stimulated by Hamilton’s influence, led him to spend some months at Heidelberg in 1834, in order to study German philosophy. He was on intimate terms with his aunt, Miss Ferrier, and his uncle, John Wilson, and in 1837 married his cousin, Margaret Anne, eldest daughter of John Wilson. He became a contributor to Blackwood’s Magazine.” He there wrote an article on Coleridge’s plagiarisms in 1840. His first metaphysical publication was a series of papers, reprinted in his Remains, called “An Introduction to the Philosophy of Consciousness,” in Blackwood’s Magazine for 1838 and 1839.
In 1842 he was appointed professor of civil history in the university of Edinburgh; and in 1844-5 he lectured as William Hamilton’s substitute. In 1845 he was elected professor of moral philosophy and political economy at St. Andrews. He was a candidate for the professorship of moral philosophy, resigned by Wilson in 1852, and for the professorship of logic and metaphysics vacated by Hamilton’s death in 1856. But he was unsuccessful on both occasions, and continued at St. Andrews until his death. His chief work, the Institutes of Metaphysic, was published in 1854. The theory which it upholds had been already expounded to his class. It reached a second edition in 1856. In the same year he replied to his critics in a vigorous pamphlet called Scottish Philosophy, the Old and New, which, with certain omissions, is published as an “Appendix to the Institutes” in his Remains. He thought that the misunderstandings of his previous exposition had told against his candidature for the chair of metaphysics. Ferrier devoted himself to his professorial duties at St. Andrews; wrote and carefully rewrote his lectures, and lived chiefly in his study. He could seldom be persuaded to leave St. Andrews even for a brief excursion. An attack of angina pectoris in November 1861 weakened him permanently, though he continued to labor, and gave lectures in his own house. Renewed attacks followed in 1863, and he died at St. Andrews on June 11, 1864. After his death his minor publications were collected and published together along with a series of lectures as Lectures on Greek Philosophy and other philosophical remains (1866).
Ferrier provides the earliest, and in some ways the most impressive, statement of absolute idealism in English philosophy. As an historian of philosophy Ferrier did not pretend to exceptional research; but he had an ability to give a living presentation of their views. The history of philosophy was, for him, no mere record of discarded systems but “philosophy itself taking its time.” He was a sympathetic student of the German philosophers, banned by his friend Hamilton. It is difficult to trace any direct influence of Hegel upon his own doctrine, and indeed he said that he could not understand Hegel. But both his earlier and his later writings have an affinity with Fichte — especially in their central doctrine: the stress laid on self-consciousness, and its distinction from the “mental states” with which the psychologist is concerned. This doctrine connects him with Berkeley also. He was one of the first to appreciate the true nature of Berkeley’s thought, as not a mere transition-stage between Locke and Hume, but as a discovery of the spiritual nature of reality.
In an essay on “Berkeley and Idealism,” published in 1842, perhaps Ferrier’s most perfect piece of philosophical writing, he signalizes both the essential truth and the essential defect in a theory which was at the time much less understood than it is now. Berkeley, he says, “certainly was the first to stamp the indelible impress of his powerful understanding on those principles of our nature, which, since his time, have brightened into imperishable truths in the light of genuine speculation. His genius was the first to swell the current of that mighty stream of tendency towards which all modern meditation flows, the great gulf-stream of Absolute Idealism.” The element o peculiar value in Berkeley’s speculation is its concreteness, its faithfulness to reality.
The peculiar endowment by which Berkeley was distinguished, far beyond almost every philosopher who has succeeded him, was the eye he had for facts, and the singular pertinacity with which he refused to be dislodged from his hold upon them. . . . No man ever delighted less to expatiate in the regions of the occult, the abstract, the impalpable, the fanciful, and the unknown. His heart and soul clung with inseparable tenacity to the concrete realties of the universe; and with an eye uninfluenced by spurious theories, and unperverted by false knowledge, he saw directly into the very life of things.
His theory needs only to be widened, and thus corrected, to provide the true explanation of which philosophy is in search. How this is to be done, is more clearly stated in the Institutes.
He saw that something subjective was a necessary and inseparable part of every object of cognition. But instead of maintaining that it was the ego or oneself which clove inseparably to all that could be known, and that this element must be thought of along with all that is thought of, he rather held that it was the senses, or our perceptive modes of cognition, which clove inseparably to all that could be known, and that these required to be thought of along with all that could be thought of. These, just as much as the ego, were held by him to be the subjective part of the total synthesis of cognition which could not by any possibility be discounted. Hence the unsatisfactory character of his ontology, which, when tried by the test of a rigorous logic, will be found to invest the Deity — the supreme mind, the infinite ego, which the terms of his system necessarily compel him to place in synthesis with all things — with human modes of apprehension, with such senses as belong to man — and to invest Him with these, not as a matter of contingency, but as a matter these, not as a matter of necessity. Our only safety lies in the consideration — a consideration which is a sound, indeed inevitable logical inference — that our sensitive modes of apprehension are mere contingent elements and conditions of cognition; and that the ego or subject alone enters, of necessity, into the composition of everything which any intelligence can know.
Although there are occasional references to Kant in Ferrier’s works, he develops his theory through a continuous criticism of Reid, on the one hand, and of Hamilton, on the other. Reid is, for him, the representative of Psychology or the “science of the human mind,” and therefore, despite his own protestations to the contrary, of “Representationism.” Hamilton is the representative of Agnosticism, or the doctrine of the unknowableness of the Absolute Reality. Against the former view, he argues that we have a direct knowledge of Reality, both material and spiritual; against the latter, he formulates his “agnoiology” or “theory of ignorance,” to prove that the “ignorance” of which Hamilton would convict the human mind is not properly called ignorance or defect, but is simply that repudiation of the unintelligible or self-contradictory which is the essential characteristic of intelligence, rather than a defect peculiar to the human mind.
The fundamental error of Psychology is the acceptance of sensation, or the “state of consciousness,” as the original datum of knowledge, the consequence being that the inference to the existence of the object, as well as to the subject, is more or less uncertain. As a matter of fact, the subject and the object are inseparable. “Matter per se” is never the object of knowledge; what we perceive is always “Matter mecum.” The elementary fact of knowledge is not matter, but the perception of matter, or the subject as conscious of the object, either subjective or objective. Mere “phenomena” never exist; what exists is always phenomenal to a self or subject. If we define “substance” as that which is capable of existing, or of being conceived, alone and independently, then the conscious self, that is, the subject as conscious of an object, is substance, and can be known. The ego cannot know objects without knowing itself along with them; it cannot know itself except along with objects. It is because the psychologists have ignored the conscious, or rather the self-conscious self, which is present in all knowledge, that they have been unable to escape the conclusion that all we know is “ideas” or “phenomena” which represent, and may misrepresent, the object or substantial reality.
For the refutation of the Hamiltonian doctrine of the Relativity of Knowledge, Ferrier formulated what he regarded as an entirely original “theory of ignorance.” Ignorance, he holds, presupposes the possibility of knowledge; we can be ignorant only of that which it is possible for us to know. It is not a defect, but a merit of knowledge not to know that which cannot be known because it is the unintelligible or the self-contradictory. Now we have seen that subject and object, or mind and matter, per se, are both alike unknowable in this sense; since they are never presented in consciousness alone but always together, it follows that they cannot be represented or thought in separation from one another. It is of such an inconceivable or unintelligible reality that Hamilton proclaims that ignorance is inevitable; he might as well proclaim the unknowableness of Nothing, or of Nonsense. It is the glory, rather than the humiliation, of intelligence to repudiate the unintelligible or self-contradictory.
On the basis of this “epistemology” and “agnoiology” Ferrier proceeds to construct his “ontology.” Self-conscious mind, the ultimate element in knowledge, is also the ultimate element in existence. Repudiating the errors of subjective idealism, he finds himself compelled to accept absolute or objective idealism. The individual ego, along with the universe of his thought, is not independent. “The only independent universe which any mind or ego can think of is the universe in synthesis with some other mind or ego.” And since one such other mind is sufficient to account for the universe of our experience, we are warranted in inferring that there is only one. Ferrier thus summarizes the argument which yields “this theistic conclusion”:
Speculation shows us that the universe, by itself, is the contradictory; that it is incapable of self-subsistency, that it can exist only cum alio, that all true and cogitable and non-contradictory existence is a synthesis of the subjective and the objective; and then we are compelled, by the most stringent necessity of thinking, to conceive a supreme intelligence as the ground and essence of the Universal Whole. Thus the postulation of the Deity is not only permissible, it is unavoidable. Every mind thinks, and must think of God (however little conscious it may be of the operation which it is performing), whenever it thinks of anything as lying beyond all human observation, or as subsisting in the absence or annihilation of all finite intelligences.
The ethical implications of such an idealism are strikingly suggested in the Philosophy of Consciousness, where the parallelism between the functions of self-consciousness in the intellectual and in the moral spheres is made clear, and it is shown that “just as all perception originates in the antagonism between consciousness and our sensations, so all morality originates in the antagonism between consciousness and the passions, desires, or inclinations of the natural man.” It is in this refusal to accept the guidance of the natural passions and inclinations, this “direct antithesis” of the “I” to the “natural man,” that our moral freedom consists. What is this supreme act by which man asserts his supremacy over nature, within and without himself?
What is it but the act of consciousness, the act of becoming “I,” the act of placing ourselves in the room which sensation and passion have been made to vacate? This act may be obscure in the extreme, but still it is an act of the most practical kind, both in itself and in its results. . . . For what act can be more vitally practical than the act by which we realize our existence as free personal beings? and what act can be attended by a more practical result than the act by which we look our passions in the face, and, in the very act of looking at them, look them down?
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Last updated: April 16, 2001 | Originally published: