Johann Gottlieb Fichte is one of the major figures in German philosophy in the period between Kant and Hegel. Initially considered one of Kant’s most talented followers, Fichte developed his own system of transcendental philosophy, the so-called Wissenschaftslehre. Through technical philosophical works and popular writings Fichte exercised great influence over his contemporaries, especially during his years at the University of Jena. His influence waned towards the end of his life, and Hegel’s subsequent dominance relegated Fichte to the status of a transitional figure whose thought helped to explain the development of German idealism from Kant’s Critical philosophy to Hegel’s philosophy of Spirit. Today, however, Fichte is more correctly seen as an important philosopher in his own right, as a thinker who carried on the tradition of German idealism in a highly original form.
Fichte was born on May 19, 1762 to a family of ribbon makers. Early in life he impressed everyone with his great intelligence, but his parents were too poor to pay for his schooling. Through the patronage of a local nobleman, he was able to attend the Pforta school, which prepared students for a university education, and then the universities of Jena and Leipzig. Unfortunately, little is known about this period of Fichte’s life, but we do know that he intended to obtain a degree in theology, and that he had to break off his studies for financial reasons around 1784, without obtaining a degree of any sort. Several years of earning his living as an itinerant tutor ensued, during which time he met Johanna Rahn, his future wife, while living in Zurich.
In the summer of 1790, while living in Leipzig and once again in financial distress, Fichte agreed to tutor a university student in the Kantian philosophy, about which he knew very little at the time. His immersion in Kant’s writings, according to his own testimony, revolutionized his thinking and changed his life, turning him away from a deterministic view of the world at odds with human freedom towards the doctrines of the Critical philosophy and its reconciliation of freedom and determinism.
More wandering and frustration followed. Fichte decided to travel to Königsberg to meet Kant himself, and on July 4, 1791 the disciple had his first interview with the master. Unfortunately for Fichte, things did not go well, and Kant was not especially impressed by his visitor. In order to prove his expertise in the Critical philosophy, Fichte quickly composed a manuscript on the relation of the Critical philosophy to the question of divine revelation, an issue that Kant had yet to address in print. This time, Kant was justifiably impressed by the results and arranged for his own publisher to bring out the work, which appeared in 1792 under the title An Attempt at a Critique of all Revelation.
In this fledgling effort Fichte adhered to many of Kant’s claims about morality and religion by thoughtfully extending them to the concept of revelation. In particular, he took over Kant’s idea that all religious belief must ultimately withstand critical scrutiny if it is to make a legitimate claim on us. For Fichte, any alleged revelation of God’s activity in the world must pass a moral test: namely, no immoral command or action, i.e., nothing that violates the moral law, can be attributed to Him. Although Fichte himself did not explicitly criticize Christianity by appealing to this test, such a restriction on the content of a possible revelation, if consistently imposed, would overturn some aspects of orthodox Christian belief, including, for example, the doctrine of original sin, which states that everyone is born guilty as a result of Adam and Eve’s disobedience in the Garden of Eden. This element of Christian theology, which is said to be grounded in the revelations contained in the Bible, is hardly compatible with the view of justice underwritten by the moral law. Attentive readers should have instantly gleaned Fichte’s radical views from the placid Kantian prose.
For reasons that are still mysterious, Fichte’s name and preface were omitted from the first edition of An Attempt at a Critique of all Revelation, and thus the book, which displayed an extensive and subtle appreciation of Kant’s thought, was taken to be the work of Kant himself. Once it became known that Fichte was the author, he instantly became a philosophical figure of importance; no one whose work had been mistaken for Kant’s, however briefly, could be rightfully denied fame and celebrity in the German philosophical world.
Fichte continued working as a tutor while attempting to fashion his philosophical insights into a system of his own. He also anonymously published two political works, “Reclamation of the Freedom of Thought from the Princes of Europe, Who Have Oppressed It Until Now” and Contribution to the Rectification of the Public’s Judgment of the French Revolution. It became widely known that he was their author; consequently, from the very beginning of his public career, he was identified with radical causes and views.
In October 1793 he married his fiancée, and shortly thereafter unexpectedly received a call from the University of Jena to take over the chair in philosophy that Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1758-1823), a well-known exponent and interpreter of the Kantian philosophy, had recently vacated. Fichte arrived in Jena in May 1794.
In his years at Jena, which lasted until 1799, Fichte published the works that established his reputation as one of the major figures in the German philosophical tradition. Fichte never exclusively saw himself as an academic philosopher addressing the typical audience of fellow philosophers, university colleagues, and students. Instead, he considered himself a scholar with a wider role to play beyond the confines of academia, a view eloquently expressed in “Some Lectures Concerning the Scholar’s Vocation,” which were delivered to an overflowing lecture hall shortly after his much anticipated arrival in Jena. One of the tasks of philosophy, according to these lectures, is to offer rational guidance towards the ends that are most appropriate for a free and harmonious society. The particular role of the scholar — that is, of individuals such as Fichte himself, regardless of their particular academic discipline — is to be a teacher of mankind and a superintendent of its never-ending progress towards perfection.
Throughout his career Fichte alternated between composing, on the one hand, philosophical works for scholars and students of philosophy and, on the other hand, popular works for the general public. This desire to communicate to the wider public — to bridge the gap, so to speak, between theory and praxis — inspired his writings from the start. In fact, Fichte’s passion for the education of society as a whole should be seen as a necessary consequence of his philosophical system, which continues the Kantian tradition of placing philosophy in the service of enlightenment, i.e., the eventual liberation of mankind from its self-imposed immaturity. To become mature, according to Kant’s way of thinking, which Fichte had adopted, is to overcome our willing refusal to think for ourselves, and thus to accept responsibility for failing to think and act independently of the guidance of external authority.
Fichte called his philosophical system the Wissenschaftslehre. The usual English translations of this term, such as “science of knowledge,” “doctrine of science,” or “theory of science,” can be misleading, since today these phrases carry connotations that can be excessively theoretical or too reminiscent of the natural sciences. Therefore, many English-language commentators and translators prefer to use the German term as the untranslated proper name that designates Fichte’s system as a whole.
Another potential source of confusion is that Fichte’s book from 1794/95, whose full title is Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre, is sometimes simply referred to as the Wissenschaftslehre. Strictly speaking, this is incorrect, since this work, as its title indicates, was meant as the foundations of the system as a whole; the other parts of the system were to be written afterwards. Much of Fichte’s work in the remainder of the Jena period attempted to complete the system as it was envisioned in the 1794/95 Foundations.
Before moving to Jena, and while he was living in the house of his father-in-law in Zurich, Fichte wrote two short works that presaged much of the Wissenschaftslehre that he devoted the rest of his life to developing. The first of these was a review of a skeptical critique of Kantian philosophy in general and Reinhold’s so-called Elementarphilosophie (“Elementary Philosophy”) in particular. The work under review, an anonymously published polemic called Aenesidemus, which was later discovered to have been written by Gottlob Ernst Schulze (1761-1833), and which appeared in 1792, greatly influenced Fichte, causing him to revise many of his views, but did not lead him to abandon Reinhold’s concept of philosophy as rigorous science, an interpretation of the nature of philosophy that demanded that philosophical principles be systematically derived from a single foundational principle known with certainty.
Reinhold had argued that this first principle was what he called the “principle of consciousness,” namely, the proposition that “in consciousness representation is distinguished through the subject from both object and subject and is related to both.” From this principle Reinhold attempted to deduce the contents of Kant’s Critical philosophy. He claimed that the principle of consciousness was a reflectively known fact of consciousness, and argued that it could lend credence to various Kantian views, including the distinction between the faculties of sensibility and understanding and the existence of things in themselves. Schulze responded by offering skeptical objections against the legitimacy of Kant’s (and thus Reinhold’s) concept of the thing in itself (construed as the causal origin of our representations) and by arguing that the principle of consciousness was neither a fundamental principle (since it was subject to the laws of logic, in that it had to be free of contradiction) nor one known with certainty (since it originated in merely empirical reflection on the contents of consciousness, which reflection Schulze, following David Hume, persuasively argued could not yield a principle grounded on indubitable evidence).
Fichte, to his consternation, found himself in agreement with much of Schulze’s critique. Although he was still eager to support the Kantian system, Fichte, as a result of reading Schulze, came to the conclusion that the Critical philosophy needed new foundations. Yet the search for new foundations, in Fichte’s mind, was never equivalent to a repudiation of the Kantian philosophy. As Fichte would frequently claim, he remained true to the spirit, if not the letter, of Kant’s thought. His review of Schulze’s Aenesidemus provides one especially tantalizing hint about how he would subsequently attempt to remain within the spirit of Kant’s thought while attempting to reconstruct it from the ground up: philosophy, he says, must begin with a first principle, as Reinhold maintained, but not with one that expresses a mere fact, a Tatsache; instead, Fichte countered, it must begin with a fact/act, a Tathandlung, that is not known empirically, but rather with self-evident certainty. The meaning and purpose of this new first principle would not become clear to his readers until the publication of the 1794/95 Foundations.
In addition to his review of the Schulze book, and still prior to his arrival in Jena, Fichte sketched out the nature and methodology of the Wissenschaftslehre in an essay entitled “Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre,” which was intended to prepare his expectant audience for his classes and lectures. Here Fichte sets out his conception of philosophy as the science of science, i.e., as Wissenschaftslehre. The Wissenschaftslehre is devoted to establishing the foundation of individual sciences such as geometry, whose first principle is said to be the task of limiting space in accordance with a rule. Thus the Wissenschaftslehre seeks to justify the cognitive task of the science of geometry, i.e., its systematic efforts at spatial construction in the form of theorems validly deduced from axioms known with self-evident certainty. The Wissenschaftslehre, which itself is a science in need of a first principle, is said to be grounded on the Tathandlung first mentioned in the Aenesidemus review. The precise nature of this fact/act, with which the Wissenschaftslehre is supposed to begin, is much debated, even today. Yet it is the essential core of the Jena Wissenschaftslehre in general and the 1794/95 Foundations in particular.
In the 1794/95 Foundations Fichte expresses the content of the Tathandlung in its most general form as “the I posits itself absolutely.” Fichte is suggesting that the self, which he typically refers to as “the I,” is not a static thing with fixed properties, but rather a self-producing process. Yet if it is a self-producing process, then it also seems that it must be free, since in some as yet unspecified fashion it owes its existence to nothing but itself. This admittedly obscure starting point is subject to much scrutiny and qualification as the Wissenschaftslehre proceeds. In more modern language, and as a first approximation of its meaning, we can understand the Tathandlung as expressing the concept of a rational agent that constantly interprets itself in light of normative standards that it imposes on itself, in both the theoretical and practical realms, in its efforts to determine what it ought to believe and how it ought to act. (Fichte’s indebtedness to the Kantian notion of autonomy in the form of self-imposed lawfulness should be obvious to anyone familiar with the Critical philosophy.)
Given the difficulty of the notion, unfortunately, Fichte’s Tathandlung has perplexed his readers from its first appearance. The principle of the self-positing I was initially interpreted along the lines of Berkeley’s idealism, and thus as claiming that the world as a whole is somehow the product of an infinite mind. This interpretation is surely mistaken, even though one can find passages that seem to support it. More important, though, is the question of the epistemic status of the principle. Is it known with the self-evident certainty that Fichte, following Reinhold, claims must ground any attempt at systematic knowledge? Furthermore, how does it serve as a basis for deducing the rest of the Wissenschaftslehre?
Fichte’s method is sometimes said to be phenomenological, restricting itself to what we can discover by means of reflection. Yet Fichte does not claim that we simply find the fully formed Tathandlung residing somewhere within us; instead, we construct it in order to explain ourselves to ourselves, to render intelligible to ourselves our normative nature as finite rational beings. Thus the requisite reflection is not empirical but transcendental, i.e., an experimental postulate adopted for philosophical purposes. That is, the principle is presupposed as true in order to make sense of the conditions for the possibility of our ordinary experience.
Such a method leaves open the possibility of other explanations of our experience. Fichte claims, however, that the alternatives can actually take only one form. Either, he says, we can begin (as he does) with the I as the ground of all possible experience, or we can begin with the thing in itself outside of our experience. This dilemma involves, as he puts it, choosing between idealism and dogmatism. The former is transcendental philosophy; the latter, a naturalistic approach to experience that explains it solely in causal terms. As Fichte famously said in the first introduction to the Wissenschaftslehre from 1797, the choice between the two depends on the kind of person one is, because they are said to be mutually exclusive yet equally possible approaches.
If, however, such a choice between starting points is possible, then the principle of the self-positing I lacks the self-evident certainty that Fichte attributed to it in his earlier essay on the concept of the Wissenschaftslehre. There are, in fact, those who do not find it at all self-evident, namely, the dogmatists. Fichte clearly thinks that they are mistaken in their dogmatism, yet he offers no direct refutation of their position, claiming only that they cannot demonstrate what they hope to demonstrate, namely, that the ground of all experience lies solely in objects existing independently of the I. The dogmatist position, Fichte implies, ignores the normative aspects of our experience, e.g., warranted and unwarranted belief, correct and incorrect action, and thus attempts to account for our experience entirely in terms of our causal interaction with the world around us. Presumably, however, those who begin with a disavowal of normativity — as the dogmatists do, because they are that kind of person — can never be brought to agree with the idealists. There is thus an argumentative impasse between the two camps.
Fichte’s remarks about systematic form and certainty in “Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre” give the impression that he intends to demonstrate the entirety of the Wissenschaftslehre from the principle of the self-positing I through a chain of logical inferences that merely set out the implications of the initial principle in such a way that the certainty of the first principle is transferred to the claims inferred from it. (The method of Spinoza’s Ethics comes to mind, but this time with only a single premise from which to begin the proofs.) Yet this hardly seems to be Fichte’s actual method, since he constantly introduces new concepts that cannot be plausibly interpreted as the logical consequences of the previous ones. In other words, the deductions in the Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre are more than merely analytical explications of the consequences of the original premise. Instead, they both articulate and refine the initial principle of the self-positing I in accordance with the demands made on the idealist who is attempting to clarify the nature of the self-positing I by means of reflection.
After Fichte postulates the self-positing I as the explanatory ground of all experience, he then begins to complicate the web of concepts required to make sense of this initial postulate, thereby carrying out the aforementioned construction of the self-positing I. The I posits itself insofar as it is aware of itself, not only as an object but also as a subject, and finds itself subject to normative constraints in both the theoretical and practical realms, e.g., that it must be free of contradiction and that there must be adequate reasons for what it believes and does. Furthermore, the I posits itself as free, since these constraints are ones that it imposes on itself. Next, by means of further reflection, the I becomes aware of a difference between “representations accompanied by a feeling of necessity” and “representations accompanied by a feeling a freedom” — that is, a difference between representations of what purports to be an objective world existing apart from our representations of it and representations that are merely the product of our own mental activity. To recognize this distinction in our representations, however, is to posit a distinction between the I and the not-I, i.e., the self and whatever exists independently of it. In other words, the I comes to posit itself as limited by something other than itself, even though it initially posits itself as free, for in the course of reflecting on its own nature the I discovers limitations on its activity.
Our understanding of the nature of this limitation is made increasingly more complex through further acts of reflection. First, the I posits a check, an Anstoß, on its theoretical and practical activity, in that it encounters resistance whenever it thinks or acts. This check is then developed into more refined forms of limitation: sensations, intuitions, and concepts, all united in the experience of the things of the natural world, i.e., the spatio-temporal realm ruled by causal laws. Moreover, this world is found to contain other finite rational beings. They too are free yet limited, and the recognition of their freedom places further constraints on our activity. In this way the I posits the moral law and restricts its treatment of others to actions that are consistent with respect for their freedom. Thus, by the end of Fichte’s deductions, the I posits itself as free yet limited by natural necessity and the moral law: its freedom becomes an infinite task in which it seeks to make the world conform to its normative standards, but only by doing so in an appropriately moral fashion that allows other free beings to do the same for themselves.
Fichte’s writings during the rest of the Jena period attempt to fill out and refine the entire system. The Foundations of Natural Right Based on the Wissenschaftslehre (1796/97) and The System of Ethical Theory Based on the Wissenschaftslehre (1798) concern themselves with political philosophy and moral philosophy, respectively. The task of the former work is to characterize the legitimate constraints that can be placed on individual freedom in order to produce a community of maximally free individuals who simultaneously respect the freedom of others. The task of the latter work is to characterize the specific duties of rational agents who freely produce objects and actions in the pursuit of their goals. These duties follow from our general obligation to determine ourselves freely, i.e., from the categorical imperative.
Besides filling out projected portions of the system, Fichte also began to revise the foundations themselves. Since he considered the mode of presentation of the Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre unsatisfactory, he began drawing up a new version in his lectures, which were given three times between 1796 and 1799, but which he never managed to publish. These lectures, which in some respects are superior to the Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre, were published posthumously and are now known as the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo.
Prior to publishing any systematic presentation of his philosophy of religion, Fichte became embroiled in what is now known as the Atheismusstreit, the atheism controversy. In an essay from 1798 entitled “On the Basis of Our Belief in a Divine Governance of the World” Fichte argued that religious belief could be legitimate only insofar as it arose from properly moral considerations — a view clearly indebted to his book on revelation from 1792. Furthermore, he claimed that God has no existence apart from the moral world order. Because neither view was orthodox at the time, Fichte was accused of atheism and ultimately forced to leave Jena.
Two open letters, both from 1799 and written by philosophers whom Fichte fervently admired, compounded his troubles. First, Kant disavowed the Wissenschaftslehre for mistakenly having tried to infer substantive philosophical knowledge from logic alone. Such an inference, he claimed, was impossible, since logic abstracted from the content of knowledge and thus could not produce a new object of knowledge. Second, Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi accused the Wissenschaftslehre of nihilism: that is, of producing reality out of mere mental representations, and thus in effect from nothingness. Whether or not these criticisms were just (and Fichte certainly denied that they were), they further damaged Fichte’s philosophical reputation.
In 1800 Fichte settled in Berlin and continued to philosophize. He was no longer a professor, because there was no university in Berlin at the time of his arrival. To earn a living, he published new works and gave private lectures. The Berlin years, while productive, represent a decline in Fichte’s fortunes, since he never regained the degree of influence among philosophers that he had enjoyed during the Jena years, although he remained a popular author among non-philosophers. His first major Berlin publication was a popular presentation of the Wissenschaftslehre designed to answer his critics on the question of atheism. Known as The Vocation of Man, it appeared in 1800 and is probably Fichte’s greatest literary production. (It seems, although this is never explicitly stated anywhere in the book, that much of it was inspired by the personally stinging critique of Jacobi’s open letter.)
Fichte continued to revise the Wissenschaftslehre, yet he published very little of the material developed in these renewed efforts to perfect his system, mostly because he feared being misunderstood as he had been during the Jena years. His reluctance to publish gave his contemporaries the false impression that he was more or less finished as an original philosopher. Except for a cryptic outline that appeared in 1810, his Berlin lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre, of which there are numerous versions, only appeared posthumously. In these manuscripts Fichte typically speaks of the absolute and its appearances, i.e., a philosophically suitable stand-in for a more traditional notion of God and the community of finite rational beings whose existence is grounded in the absolute. As a result, Fichte is sometimes said to have taken a religious turn in the Berlin period.
In 1806 Fichte published two lecture series that were well-received by his contemporaries. The first, The Characteristics of the Present Age, employs the Wissenschaftslehre for the purposes of the philosophy of history. According to Fichte, there are five stages of history in which the human race progresses from the rule of instinct to the rule of reason. The present age, he says, is the third age, an epoch of liberation from instinct and external authority, out of which humanity will ultimately progress until it makes itself and the world it inhabits into a fully self-conscious representative of the life of reason. The second, The Way Towards the Blessed Life, which is sometimes said to be a mystical work, treats of morality and religion in a popular format.
Another famous series of lectures, Addresses to the German Nation, given in 1808 during the French occupation, was intended as a continuation of The Characteristics of the Present Age, but exclusively for a German audience. Here Fichte envisions a new form of national education that would enable the German nation, not yet in existence, to reach the fifth and final age outlined in the earlier lecture series. Once again, Fichte demonstrated his interest in larger matters, and in a manner perfectly consistent with his earlier insistence from the Jena period that the scholar has a cultural role to play.
When the newly founded Prussian university in Berlin opened in 1810, Fichte was made the head of the philosophy faculty; in 1811 he was elected the first rector of the university. He continued his philosophical work until the very end of his life, lecturing on the Wissenschaftslehre and writing on political philosophy and other subjects. When the War of Liberation broke out in 1813, Fichte canceled his lectures and joined the militia. His wife Johanna, who was serving as a volunteer nurse in a military hospital, contracted a life-threatening fever. She recovered, but Fichte fell ill with the same ailment. He died on January 29, 1814.
Although Fichte’s importance for the history of German philosophy is undisputed, the nature of his legacy is still very much debated. He has sometimes been seen as a mere transitional figure between Kant and Hegel, as little more than a philosophical stepping stone along Spirit’s path to absolute knowledge. This understanding of Fichte was encouraged by Hegel himself, and no doubt for self-serving reasons. Nowadays, however, Fichte is studied more and more for his own sake, in particular for his theory of subjectivity, i.e., the theory of the self-positing I, which is rightly seen as a sophisticated elaboration of Kant’s claim that finite rational beings are to be interpreted in theoretical and practical terms. The level of detail that Fichte provides on these matters exceeds that found in Kant’s writings. This fact alone would make Fichte’s work worthy of our attention. Yet perhaps the most persuasive testament to Fichte’s greatness as a philosopher is to be found in his relentless willingness to begin again, to start the Wissenschaftslehre anew, and never to rest content with any prior formulation of his thought. Although this leaves his readers perpetually dissatisfied and desirous of a definitive statement of his views, Fichte, true to his publically declared vocation, makes them into better philosophers through his own example of restless striving for the truth.
(Publication dates during Fichte’s lifetime are given in brackets.)
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 1, 2005 | Originally published: