Marsilio Ficino was a Florentine philosopher, translator, and commentator, largely responsible for the revival of Plato and Platonism in the Renaissance. He has been widely recognized by historians of philosophy for his defense of the immortality of the soul, as well as for his translations of Plato, Plotinus, and the Hermetic corpus from Greek to Latin. Ficino is considered the most important advocate of Platonism in the Renaissance, and his philosophical writings and translations are thought to have made a significant contribution to the development of early modern philosophies.
The Platonic Theology is Ficino’s most original and systematic philosophical treatise. It is a lengthy and encyclopedic defense of the immortality of the soul against what he considered the growing threats of Epicureanism and Averroism. While arguing for immortality, Ficino articulates those positions that are most characteristic of his philosophy. He first provides his own restructuring of the Neoplatonic hierarchy of being. This metaphysical structure is used to ensure the dignity and immortality of the soul by situating it at a privileged midpoint between God and prime matter. However, this hierarchy also has negative consequences for the qualitative character of human existence on account of the soul’s proximity to matter. Finally, the Platonic Theology lays down the basic principles of Ficino’s animistic natural philosophy, according to which a World Soul is imminent in the material world, imparting motion, life, and order.
In addition to the Platonic Theology, Ficino also composed extensive commentaries on Plato and Plotinus, wrote a practical medical treatise, and carried on a voluminous correspondence with contemporaries across Europe. There are noteworthy elements in his writings that are less traditional and orthodox by some contemporary philosophical standards. For example, he was deeply influenced by the Hermetic tradition, and describes a species of knowledge, or natural magic, that draws down the intellectual and moral virtues of the heavens to the terrestrial world. Ficino also endorses an ancient theological tradition that included, to name a few, Hermes Trismegistus, Pythagoras, and Orpheus among its ranks. He held that this pagan tradition espoused a pious philosophy that in fact presaged and confirmed Christianity.
Marsilio Ficino was born in Figline, not far from Florence, in 1433. He was the son of a physician, and Cosimo de’Medici—one of the richest and most powerful patrons of the fifteenth century—was among his father’s patients. While the precise details of his early life and education remain largely unclear to us today, it can safely be said that he studied Scholastic philosophy and medicine at the University of Florence, and that he was exposed to the burgeoning educational movement of Italian Humanism. Ficino’s earliest philosophical writings are largely Scholastic in their consideration of metaphysical, logical, and natural philosophical questions. In particular, Thomas Aquinas had a strong influence on significant aspects of his early thought, and this influence is thought to have persisted in his later philosophical writings.
The biographical contours of Ficino’s early life become clearer in the 1450s. He lectured on Plato’s Philebus; he also taught for a short time at the university in Florence, and privately as a tutor. As a young man Ficino fell under the influence of the Roman poet Lucretius. A manuscript copy of his didactic Epicurean poem, On the Nature of Things, was rediscovered in a monastery in 1417. After its recovery the poem was copied, disseminated, and eventually found its way into print and vernacular languages. Ficino was among the first generation of philosophers with direct access to the actual text of On the Nature of Things, which is thought to have played an important role in the development of early modern philosophy and science. During the late 1450s, Ficino composed a short commentary on Lucretius, the first since antiquity, as well as a treatise on pleasure. In this treatise he praises the Epicurean definition of pleasure as the removal of pain from the body and disturbance from the soul, and argues that Epicureanism is superior to the vulgar hedonism of someone like Aristippus. Ficino suggests that he experienced an intellectual or spiritual crisis during this time, and as a result ultimately rejected Epicurus and Lucretius as incompatible with deeply held philosophical and religious commitments. In a letter, Ficino reports that he burned his youthful commentary on Lucretius. Despite this Epicurus and Lucretius left an enduring stamp on Ficino’s thought that is visible in the mature philosophical writings, and historians of Renaissance philosophy are still assessing this influence today.
During the 1450s Ficino began to study Greek. In time, his knowledge of classical Greek culminated in one of his most lasting philosophical and scholarly achievements and contributions—his translation of Plato’s complete works into Latin. In 1462, Cosimo de’Medici commissioned Ficino to translate a manuscript copy of Plato’s extant writings. Around the same time, Cosimo also gave him the proceeds from a small property, as well as a villa in Careggi, not far from Florence. The conditions of the 1460s provided Ficino with the perfect opportunity to fully dedicate himself to translating Plato’s complete writings into Latin. His edition marked the first time that Plato’s extant corpus was translated into a Western language. Ficino’s work on Plato, however, was quickly interrupted when Cosimo requested that he also translate the Corpus Hermeticum into Latin. At the time, the Hermetic corpus was believed by many to be an ancient collection of theological writings that contained sacred wisdom. It was, however, written in the early years of Christianity. In 1464, Ficino read his translations of Plato’s dialogues to Cosimo as the aging patron lay dying.
In the late 1460s, after completing his translation of Plato, Ficino started working on his Platonic Theology: On the Immortality of the Soul. This book was finished in 1474, but it did not find its way into print until 1482. The Platonic Theology is Ficino’s longest and most systematic philosophical work. In 1473, he was ordained a priest, and after completing his Platonic Theology, dedicated himself primarily to translation, commentary, and correspondence. During this time Ficino also wrote the bulk of his commentaries on Plato’s dialogues. The last two decades of Ficino’s life were especially productive. In the 1480s, he translated the Enneads of the second-century Neoplatonist Plotinus, and also wrote commentaries on them. An edition of Plotinus was published in 1492. During this time Ficino completed his Three Books on Life, a medical and astrological treatise. After its 1489 publication it became one of his most popular and influential books. The third book presents Ficino’s theory of natural magic, which has since become the definitive Renaissance consideration of the subject.
Throughout his life Ficino carried on a steady correspondence with philosophers, poets, and politicians across Europe. This choice of philosophical expression shows the influence that Humanism had on him. In many letters, Ficino clarifies his understanding of certain Platonic concepts, such as poetic furor; but on a whole his correspondence is not strictly philosophical in nature, at least not by academic standards today. Even so, it contains information that is central to an accurate appreciation of his thought. Ficino conceived of philosophy as a way of life that purified and prepared those who practice it correctly for a life well lived. Ficino’s correspondence contains a good deal of practical advice, and he is often found giving counsel on how to cope with the deaths of children, spouses, and friends, or on how to extend one’s life; he also lends sundry medical advice, and even discusses the astrological placement of planets that contribute to one’s character traits. The letters serve both to clarify the content of his philosophy, as well as to shed a different light on what he perceived his role to be as a philosopher and an advocate of Platonism. These sources teach us that Ficino did not define philosophy narrowly. Instead, he saw himself as a doctor of sorts that was concerned with questions that concerned the health of bodies, minds, and souls. This practical concern is clearly displayed in his correspondence, and his Three Books on Life. Ficino edited and published his correspondence in 1494. He died in 1499.
In the fourteenth century, the poet and Humanist Francesco Petrarch praised Plato as the prince of philosophers. In so doing, Petrarch turned to Plato as an antidote to Scholastic Aristotelianism, which at the time dominated the medieval university curriculum. During the Middle Ages the bulk of Plato’s dialogues—except for the Phaedo, Meno, and parts of the Parmenides and Timaeus—were inaccessible to Western philosophers because they were not available in Latin. Consequently, knowledge of Plato’s philosophy at this time was largely indirect and incomplete. Following Petrarch’s lead, early fifteenth-century Humanists (such as Leonardo Bruni) saw the importance of studying classical Greek, and they translated, among other things, a handful of Plato’s dialogues into Latin.
Ficino’s translation represents the fulfillment of these early Humanist aspirations for a Latin edition of Plato. It is difficult to overstate the significance of this achievement, or the impact that it had on the development of early modern philosophies. His Latin translation of Plato enriched the sources available to philosophers in the West, and thereby changed the form and content of philosophy. Ficino largely finished his translation of Plato’s complete works in the 1460s, but they did not appear in print until 1484. The first edition included Ficino’s short descriptions or summaries of what he considered the key arguments of the dialogues; a 1494 edition was expanded to include his lengthy commentaries on Plato’s Symposium, Philebus, Phaedrus, Timaeus, Parmenides, Sophist, and Republic Book VIII. Eventually Ficino’s commentary on the Symposium—an unorthodox dialogue itself loosely inspired by the original—became one of his most popular and influential treatments of Plato. In it he identified Plato’s theory of love with Christian love, and argued that the proper love of another person is in fact preparation for the love of God. He invented the phrase Platonic love, and his interpretation was especially influential in the sixteenth century. His Timaeus commentary is significant because it represents the first consideration of the dialogue in its entirety since antiquity; medieval philosophers only had access to roughly half of the dialogue, and Calcidius’ commentary was necessarily truncated. Ficino’s translations of Plato’s complete works went through many printings and were used by philosophers and scholars for centuries. They continue to be recognized for their precision and fidelity to the original Greek.
Through his translations and commentaries, as well as his Platonic Theology, Ficino played a central role in the Renaissance revival of Platonism. In the second half of the fifteenth century, he stood at the center of a group of intellectuals that were drawn specifically to Plato and Platonism, and more generally to classical antiquity. As a result of his advocacy, historians of Renaissance philosophy for a long time thought that Ficino founded and headed a formal Platonic Academy in Florence that was inspired by Plato’s school in ancient Athens. However, the precise nature of Florence’s Academy remains unclear today, and some are skeptical that any such academy ever really existed. It seems unlikely that Ficino headed a formal educational institution in any real sense. More plausible is the hypothesis that Ficino’s occasional reference to the revival of Plato’s academy in Florence actually designated the presence of a manuscript copy of Plato’s dialogues in Florence, to Plato’s teachings and philosophy, and his own efforts to revive Plato in Florence through his translations and commentaries. Whether or not Ficino actually headed a Platonic Academy in Florence, he was nonetheless instrumental as an advocate of Platonism during the Renaissance.
Ficino’s philosophy is indebted to a wide variety of philosophical sources and traditions. Although his thought is eclectic, he does not generally seek to bring distinct and apparently incompatible views into accord or harmony with one another. His work is generally a blend of traditional philosophies, both ancient and medieval, and ideas that are drawn from the less-orthodox Neoplatonic and Hermetic traditions. The influences of Platonism, Neoplatonism, and Scholasticism are particularly prominent.
Like many of his contemporaries, Ficino believed that Hermes Trismegistus was an ancient Egyptian theologian and philosopher of sacred and divine wisdom. In the preface to his translation of the Corpus Hermeticum, Ficino explains that Hermes “foresaw the ruin of the old religion, the rise of the new faith, [and] the coming of Christ.” In fact, Ficino believed in a single ancient theological tradition (prisca theologia) that stretched back to Hermes in ancient Egypt and included Pythagoras, Orpheus, Philolaus, and Plato, to name a few, among its ranks. This ancient tradition, he argues, espoused a pious philosophy (pia philosophia) in which religious and philosophical truths coincide. The advent of Christianity brought about the fullest and clearest expression of this pious philosophy, though vestiges of it can be found much earlier. Over the course of the history of philosophy, according to Ficino, the fortune of the pious philosophy has waxed and waned, and there are periods during which it is hardly present at all. He considered Plato an especially effective advocate of the pious philosophy; in the preface to the Platonic Theology, he explains that no matter what subject Plato discusses “he quickly brings it round, and in a spirit of utmost piety, to the contemplation and worship of God.”
The Platonic Theology is Marsilio Ficino’s philosophical magnum opus. Its overall aim is to defend the immortality of the soul, and to this end Ficino avails himself of a wide variety of arguments. For Ficino, this question is at the heart of human self-interest and well-being. In the first chapter, he argues that if human beings were merely mortal, then there would be “no animal more miserable than man.” Ficino’s core argument is that the natural human desire for immortality must be vindicated by an afterlife. Were it not, this desire would be empty, vain, and this would call into question both the perfection of nature and God’s wisdom and goodness.
While arguing for the soul’s immortality Ficino elaborates on many of those positions and arguments that are distinctive of his philosophy. He presents and defends the basic principles of his metaphysics. While he is deeply indebted to earlier metaphysical traditions, especially the Neoplatonic and Scholastic traditions, elements of these traditions are generally adapted to his own philosophical aims and purposes. Ficino also presents his case for the inherent dignity of humanity. This defense depends in large part on his own restructuring of the Neoplatonic hierarchy of being, according to which the soul is located centrally between God and matter. The soul’s metaphysical position also ensures its immortality. Ficino argues that the soul’s troubled psychological condition is an unfortunate side effect of this hierarchy. He detects a disconnect between the soul’s divinity and the sundry demands and problems that the body causes for it. While the soul is immortal and occupied a privileged place on the great chain of being, its psychological condition is one of exile, longing, and confusion regarding its own nature. Finally, Ficino argues for his vitalistic natural philosophy according to which matter requires the presence of something incorporeal—namely soul—for it to be substantial and real.
The Platonic Theology is a rich and challenging book. Its structure and content may produce confusion and frustration in some contemporary readers. There is an overarching logical structure to the book, but Ficino chooses not to clearly state many of his central assumptions and themes, and the route he takes to his conclusions can often appear circuitous. Ficino frequently utilizes metaphysical and epistemological assumptions, but he does not in every case define or defend them. This is not to say, however, that his views are merely asserted or that his reasoning is flawed in some significant way. Many of his assumptions are generally embedded in earlier philosophical traditions, and thus his views and arguments have to be placed in the proper historical context in order to be appreciated for their rigor and coherence. Ficino thought that philosophy done properly required an ongoing conversation with ancient philosophies. A familiarity with earlier philosophies is therefore necessary in order to fully appreciate and assess the arguments of the Platonic Theology.
Ficino’s metaphysics is a blend of elements drawn from Platonism, Neoplatonism, and medieval Scholasticism. Broadly speaking, he maintains a Platonic division between the intelligible and sensible realms or between being and becoming. Throughout the Platonic Theology, he is found employing the hylomorphic terminology of the Scholastics in his detailed analysis of the nature of things. Ficino embraces and uses the metaphysical hierarchy developed by the Neoplatonist Plotinus, according to which the progressive levels of being emanate from a single source.
In the preface, Ficino explains that a central aim of the Platonic Theology is to demonstrate to materialist philosophers that matter is less real than those incorporeal entities (such as souls and forms) that transcend the senses. To accomplish this aim Ficino relies primarily on Plato’s dialogues, because in his estimation they most successfully demote the reality of the material world, while at the same time grounding and elevating the metaphysical priority of souls and forms. Furthermore, he believes that Platonism provides the most solid philosophical foundation for Christianity. Throughout the Platonic Theology, Ficino embraces the metaphysical distinction, prominent in Plato’s dialogues, between being and becoming or between the intelligible and sensible realms. He argues that the former is more real than the latter, and is therefore more worthy of our enduring attention, devotion, and study. Along these lines he maintains that forms are the perfect archetypes of all material things and exist unchangeably in the divine mind. They are in fact the genuine cause of the sensible qualities and properties of the material world. By contrast, the world of matter is shadowy and deceptive. It engenders confusion and imprisons the minds of many people.
Ficino’s metaphysics is overwhelmingly Platonic. But his theory of material substances is indebted to Scholasticism for many of its most salient features. While Ficino’s philosophy is clearly otherworldly—in the sense that he maintains the existence and metaphysical priority of realities apart from the material world—this does not prevent him from speculating about the metaphysics of matter and body in the early books of the Platonic Theology. In fact, he believes that doing so is in keeping with the broader aims of the book. By and large, Ficino analyzes material substances along traditional hylomorphic lines, according to which they are constituted by three principles: matter, form, and privation. Matter functions as the passive substrate of the forms that are active in making something what it is, and privation is what a substance can potentially become. The matter of a thing is relative to the level of organization under consideration; the matter of a statue is marble, but the marble itself is not without its own form and matter. When all qualities, both substantial and accidental, are stripped from a substance there is at bottom a single formless prime matter that is one and the same for all things. He holds that prime matter exists in a chaotic and confused state of potency. For Ficino, it is something that is ontologically basic and epistemically impenetrable. It is therefore difficult, if not impossible, to say anything directly about it other than that it must exist as the substratum of form. Here Ficino is echoing Plotinus who compared understanding matter to the eye seeing darkness.
Even though Ficino employs the basic terms of the Scholastics, he makes significant modifications to this framework. These changes are consistent with his broader philosophical commitments and the overall objectives of the Platonic Theology. First, it is noteworthy that he embraces a theory of seminal reasons, according to which seeds are spread throughout matter, and are the cause of things coming to be at appointed times. Unlike the Scholastics, Ficino judges that the qualities or properties of material things are protean, not self-sufficient, unstable, and parasitic on incorporeal forms for any reality and causal efficacy in the world of matter. Here his underlying Platonism becomes apparent. Ficino says that material forms are corrupted and contaminated when they are embedded in the “bosom” of matter. He poetically describes material qualities as “mere shadows that come and go like the reflections of lofty trees in a rushing stream” (I.III.15). Ficino sees the basic elements of the world as existing in a constant and chaotic state of change, and he holds that whatever stability they exhibit is on account of their cause, that is, their incorporeal archetypes. According to Ficino, this is not merely true of the elements, but of all qualities of material things across the board, both those that are substantial and those that are accidental. In this way, Ficino traces back all of the qualities of this world to something eternal and incorporeal as their cause, and this is the basic unit of reality for him. He accepts a metaphysical principle that there is a first in each genus (primum) that is the fullest and most perfect expression of any particular species quality. It does not include anything that does not properly belong to that genus. The first in each genus is ultimately the cause of every particular expression of that quality. Ficino, therefore, demotes the reality of material forms or qualities while at the same time buttressing the reality of incorporeal forms. Although he analyzes material substances along hylomorphic lines, he at the same time alters this framework in an effort to ground his Platonic metaphysics, and ultimately the immortality of the soul.
There are prominent Neoplatonic elements at the core of Ficino’s metaphysics. He inherited from Plotinus a particular approach to metaphysics that is a hierarchical superstructure, with distinct levels or hypostases, all of which draw their being from an overflowing singular source. The source of all being is the One for Plotinus and God for Ficino. He considers all being to be a progressive emanation from the divine, and although each hypostasis is distinct, what is above serves as a dynamic bridge to what is below. Everything in Ficino’s cosmos has its own unique place and degree of perfection, beginning with God at the summit and descending through the celestial spheres, angels, and souls, all the way down to the elements of the terrestrial sphere. In it there is nothing that is vain or superfluous, and Ficino thinks that everything is drawn to its good or end by a natural appetite.
Ficino generally recognizes five distinct levels of reality. But he at times changes the precise arrangement and structure of the hypostases of this hierarchy. At the top of the hierarchy is God, which is the source of all being and perfection. The first hypostasis that God produces is angelic mind. It contains the archetypes and forms of all things in a timeless and immutable state. These forms are the essences of all possible entities, and they are responsible for the qualities and properties of material things. Next in this progression comes the rational soul, which imparts motion and vitality to the cosmos. Ficino posits a World Soul (anima mundi) that is immanent in all of nature, and individual souls that animate sundry entities in the world, including the celestial spheres, living creatures, and even the elements. Mind is eternal and unmoving; soul is likewise eternal, but differs because it is in a perpetual state of motion. Soul stands at the metaphysical node or bond between what is above and below; while it is drawn to forms and the divine above, it is responsible for the governance of what comes below. Beneath rational soul is the hypostasis of quality, which is representative of the material forms found in nature. The patterns of qualities are grounded in the second hypostasis, mind; the source of its motion and alteration comes from soul. Finally, the hierarchy of being is extinguished with the lowest level of reality—body or corporeal matter. Ficino defines body as matter that is extended in length, breadth, and depth. It functions as the bearer of qualities, but contributes nothing of its own to the nature of things.
Even though Ficino generally marks a distinction between being and becoming, or between the incorporeal and corporeal, he is no simple dualist. His view of soul, and the role that it plays in the material world, is fundamentally different from, for example, the strict dualism of the seventeenth-century philosopher René Descartes. Matter and soul are entirely distinct from one another, according to Descartes, and these two basic substances share no qualities in common. In his treatise on physics, The World, Descartes distinguishes himself from earlier approaches to natural philosophy when he explains that he uses the word “nature” to “signify matter itself,” and not “some goddess or any other sort of imaginary power” (AT XI 37). According to Descartes, a natural philosopher does not need to appeal to anything other than matter in order to properly explain the natural world. On the contrary, according to Ficino, the material world is not something that can be adequately explained by turning to matter and motion alone; nature is an active power that suffuses matter and provides it with its life, activity, and order. On this account, nature is a dynamic force operating on material things from within, and this is the proper or genuine cause of things changing, as well as their generation and corruption. Soul, therefore, has a paramount role to play in Ficino’s natural philosophy.
Like Plato and his Neoplatonic interpreters, Ficino makes competing claims about the relative goodness of the material world. In his Timaeus, Plato argues that the sensible world is on a whole good and beautiful because it is modeled on eternal forms. In other dialogues, such as the Phaedo and Republic, the sensible world is a shadowy and deceptive prison. Plotinus recognizes this tension in Plato and comments on it in his Enneads. Ficino inherits this ambiguity about the goodness of the world, even if negative appraisals are more frequent and prominent in the Platonic Theology than positive ones. Like Plato, Ficino asserts that the creator is a benevolent and wise architect, and that these qualities are reflected in God’s creation; however, he also maintains that the world of matter is shadowy, evil, and to some degree unreal. Furthermore, Ficino blames matter and body for the mind’s tendency to be confused and deceived about what is real and good. On a whole, therefore, Ficino’s overall assessment of the material world—at least as far as the human condition is concerned—is negative.
In his metaphysics, Ficino is not drawn to austere and desert-like frameworks, and he was not reductionistic in his thinking. As such, he belongs to a tradition of metaphysicians, including the seventeenth-century Platonist G. W. Leibniz, that embrace a rich and expansive ontology. Ficino lays out a tapestry of entities that comprise the world. In nature alone he countenances the existence of matter, qualities, and a cavalcade of souls, including a World Soul, that impart motion and vital powers to all aspects of the material world. Ficino claims that nature is in fact replete with souls; there are souls that belong to the elements, to non-human animals, as well as a soul that is responsible for the growth of rocks and trees from the earth’s surface.
In the Platonic Theology, Ficino does not address epistemological issues as directly or with the same degree of frequency as he does metaphysical ones. Nonetheless, the broad contours of a view can be sketched by paying close attention to the occasional discussion of the origin, nature, and value of knowledge. Throughout this work Ficino makes scattered remarks about the mind’s capabilities, what exactly it apprehends when it knows, and the effect that knowledge has on those who possess it. Generally these comments arise when Ficino is either discussing the nature and powers of the human mind and distinguishing them from the body, or when he speculates about the divine mind and draws a comparison with finite minds.
Ficino holds that knowledge is rooted in forms, not matter. However, the metaphysics of matter described above has certain implications for what exactly stands as the object of knowledge. He argues that the degradation of forms in matter requires that the mind grasps something other than sensible forms when it knows. If it did not, he argues, then knowledge would not be stable and fixed; instead, it would vary and change as the qualities of material things do. Rather, when the mind knows it apprehends intelligible forms, and not the sensible forms that include the individual traits that are distinctive of particular objects. These forms are stable and unchanging, and as such Ficino claims that they produce stable and unchanging knowledge.
Knowledge does not, according to Ficino, come about in stages, or as a result of a gradual process. The mind does not take gradual steps and build upon its experiences to arrive at universals. On the contrary, he describes knowledge as coming about in an instantaneous flash, and not in a progressive or abstractive manner. Ficino claims that philosophical reflection on the nature of things prepares and purifies the mind of falsehood until it is ready to receive the clarity of truth. This arrival is simple and immediate. Ficino explains that “speculative virtue does not proceed stage by stage from one part of itself to another, but blazes forth wholly and suddenly” (VIII.III.6). Ficino even holds that intelligible forms are distinct from, and discontinuous with, sensible forms, even if our experience of particular material things can be the root cause of the mind’s coming to know something. Furthermore, he makes some interesting suggestions about the existence of primary truths that contain other truths within them, and he claims that the knowledge of one primary truth can elicit knowledge of others. While Ficino mentions that such primary truths exist, he does not elaborate as to what exactly these truths are or what one would look like.
There are several Platonic epistemic themes that are prominent in the Platonic Theology. Ficino maintains that the mind is nourished by truth, and he sees it as edifying of the overall condition of the human soul. He also claims that there is much to recommend the Platonic doctrine of reminiscence, even if he rejects the transmigration of souls as heretical. Also, his description of learning calls to mind Plato’s Theaetetus, where Socrates describes himself as a midwife of sorts. In this vein, Ficino holds that the mind already has within itself the intelligible forms that it will, if it is diligent, come to know, or remember. These forms exist latently in the mind, and learning is a process of drawing out from the mind what is, in a certain sense, already there.
The metaphysical hierarchy outlined in the above section on metaphysics has significant philosophical consequences for both the dignity of the rational soul, and the qualitative character of the human condition. Ficino argues that the soul’s location on the chain of being lends to it a privileged position on the hierarchy of being, and is therefore responsible for its dignity and uniqueness. In different contexts Ficino changes the precise structure of this pentadic hierarchy, but the soul’s centrality is a consistent theme. This is an alteration of Plotinus’ original hierarchy and ensures the soul’s dignity and immortality. The soul is situated at the precise center of the hierarchy standing midway between God above and matter below. Ficino explains the structure of his metaphysics in the following way:
We would do well to call soul the third and middle essence, as the Platonists do, because it is the mean for all and the third from both directions. If you descend from God, you will find soul at the third level down; or at the third level up, if you ascend from body.
In the same chapter he continues:
But the third essence set between them is such that it cleaves to the higher while not abandoning the lower; and in it, therefore the higher and the lower are linked together… So by a natural instinct it ascends to the higher and descends to the lower. In ascending it does not abandon the things below it; in descending, it does not relinquish the things above it. (III.II.1-2)
The soul is the “fitting knot” or “node” that binds the upper half of the hierarchy with the lower. On account of its place in the hierarchy, Ficino explains that the soul is at one and the same time drawn to what is above, as well as responsible for the governance of nature below. Further, Ficino thinks that it shares some properties in common with what is above and below, and as a result it is perfectly well-suited to serve as the bridge between the upper and the lower halves of the hierarchy. The soul is eternal and immortal because it shares in divinity above. It also suffuses all of nature and lends to its motion and vitality. Ficino sees the soul as charged with the governance of the material world, and is intimately responsible for its potential well-being. This is a unique and privileged metaphysical role for it. He argues that the soul is not connected to any distinct part of the body, but communicates its life-giving power throughout.
The soul’s centrality in the great chain of being ensures its dignity and immortality. However, it is also responsible for its wretchedness and depravity. The soul’s proximity to the body has a negative effect on its ability to truly appreciate its own nature and immortality. Individual souls are by and large overwhelmed with the governance of their bodies, and the material world assaults them with violent motions and sensations. As a result the soul may fail to recognize its own nature and divinity. The conditions of embodiment also frustrate its search for truth. Metaphysically speaking, it functions as the node between the upper and the lower, but in practice it is wedded so tightly with matter that it naturally, Ficino believes, comes to the conclusion that it is not distinct from it. This is the cause of the common sense materialism that most people uncritically accept, and that says something is not real unless it is a body. A pivotal consequence of this situation is that the soul forgets its own privileged nature and divinity, and in many cases concludes that it is nothing distinct from matter. Thus, there is a disconnect in Ficino’s philosophy between the metaphysical nature of the soul, and its subjective experience when joined with matter. This is the cause, according to Ficino, of the wretchedness of the human condition, which is characterized by a certain confusion regarding what is real and worthy of its pursuit.
The primary aim of the Platonic Theology is of course to demonstrate the immortality of the soul. Ficino provides a plurality of arguments across the eighteen books of this work. He argues that the soul’s immortality is a consequence of its position on the metaphysical hierarchy. He also provides arguments that rest upon the metaphysical and epistemological foundations of the Platonic Theology. Still other arguments are polemical and aim at refuting relevant and uneliminated alternatives, such as the positions of Epicurus and Averroes. Epicurus and Averroes—with the former denying immortality, and the latter claiming that it was one and the same for all—were growing in popularity in some academic circles in fifteenth-century Italy.
First and foremost, Ficino argues that the natural appetite for immortality entails post-mortem existence for the soul. He starts with the assumption that our primary goal is to ascend to a spiritual union with God, and he holds that this is a basic and natural desire shared and acted on by most human beings. If these efforts were to go unfulfilled, Ficino concludes that they would be otiose, vain, and even perverse. Perhaps more importantly, this would stand in direct violation of the perfection of nature and the wisdom of God. Thus, Ficino concludes that the natural desire for immortality must be vindicated in an actual afterlife.
In addition, in the Platonic Theology Ficino puts forward two prominent argument types that draw upon the nature and powers of the human mind, and on his theory of matter and body. He aims to show that the rational powers of the soul all support immortality and that these essential functions are in no way dependent upon matter and body. He argues that there is a correspondence or likeness between incorporeal entities and the soul. The intellect knows best when it does not depend upon the body or the senses whatsoever, and instead experiences an immediate union with forms. Ficino says that “when the soul despises corporeals and when the senses have been allayed and the clouds of phantasmata dissipated … then the intellect discerns truly and is at its brightest” (IX.II.2). Ficino takes this as evidence that the soul did not originate with the body. Instead, he argues that the soul is ineluctably drawn to things divine, and its union with incorporeals comes most naturally to it. He says that the soul was born for the contemplation of things divine, and through them it is enriched and perfected. Both the soul’s correspondence to incorporeals and the pull that they have on it are indicative of its underlying nature—like things incorporeal, it is immortal.
Ficino also aims to show that there are dissimilarities between the soul and matter. He argues that the essential functions of the mind are distinct from the body, and further that body cannot in any way give rise to them. These arguments aim to refute materialists who think that matter can give rise to the soul’s essential functions. Ficino argues that the soul’s most important operations are inconsistent with the basic conditions of corporeality. In fact, the body, the senses, and the passions all conspire to impede and frustrate the soul in its search for knowledge and goodness. Much like Plato in the Phaedo, Ficino argues that the soul’s overall condition improves the farther it is removed from the material world, and the soul knows best when it does not draw upon the senses. These dissimilarities establish, Ficino thinks, the soul’s essential otherness from matter and body. Ficino’s metaphysics of matter is also tailored to provide support for immortality. He provides what he calls a “Platonic” definition of body, according to which it is composed of matter and extension. Both matter and extension are passive and inert, and cannot give rise in any way to the essential functions of the soul. Therefore, Ficino concludes that it is only on account of the presence of something incorporeal, namely forms and souls, that material things are at all substantial.
Ficino did not compose a systematic treatise on ethics. Nonetheless, his familiarity with classical Greek philosophy means that ethical considerations are central to many of his philosophical works, and he often comes around to discussing human virtues and well-being. Ficino does not generally place an emphasis on the rightness of actions, or on duties or obligations for that matter. Instead, he focuses on the health and development of the whole person, which is consistent with what is today called virtue ethics. Ficino marks the traditional distinction between intellectual and moral virtues. The speculative virtues concern, for instance, the understanding of things divine, the knowledge of nature, and the craftsman’s ability to produce artifacts. This species of virtue is acquired through learning and speculation, and it is characterized by an intellectual state of clarity. The moral virtues come about through custom and habit, and their domain is human desires and appetites. Ficino holds that the end of moral virtues is to purify the soul and to ultimately release it from the sometimes overwhelming demands made by the body. Thus, moral virtue produces a state of soul that governs desires and appetites so that they do not take control of the soul, thereby leading to an incontinent or intemperate character. In the end, both the speculative and moral virtues are consistent with Ficino’s broader aspirations as a Christian Platonist. For him the virtues are prerequisites that prepare the soul for its inner ascent up the hierarchy of being, ultimately uniting it with God.
Ficino’s theory of love plays a central role in his ethics. He defines love as the desire for beauty. Love originates with God, and it is the link or bond that all things share in common. Here Ficino follows the patterns left by Plato and Plotinus. Beautiful things ignite or inspire the soul with love. When an individual thing is loved properly, the soul ascends progressively from love of the particular to the universal. The lover, therefore, turns inwardly to the soul from the corporeal world, and thus ultimately finds its end in God. However, it is possible for the soul to love improperly and become fixated on beautiful objects. This results in a life of confusion and wretchedness. Thus, for Ficino, the proper application of love lies at the heart of human happiness.
Ficino left an enduring impression on the history of Western philosophy. His philosophical writings, and his translations of Platonic and Hermetic texts, exercised both a direct and indirect influence on the form and content of philosophy in subsequent centuries. The Platonic Theology was instrumental in elevating the defense of the immortality of the soul to philosophical prominence in the early modern period. It contributed to the Lateran Council of 1512 requiring philosophers to defend the immortality of the soul and the existence of God. In the letter of dedication to his Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes refers to the Lateran Council to explain, in part, the proofs of God’s existence and immortality found therein. Ficino’s influence can also be seen in many of the most noteworthy philosophers of the sixteenth century, most notably Giordano Bruno, and Francesco Patrizi da Cherso, who held a chair of Platonic philosophy at the University of Ferrara. He indirectly influenced generations of philosophers who encountered Platonism and Hermeticism through his translations and commentaries.
The fortune of Ficino’s philosophical legacy has waxed and waned over the centuries. His influence on intellectual life in the sixteenth century was especially strong, but his brand of Christian Platonism was certainly not without its critics in subsequent centuries. The sixteenth-century theologian and historian Johannes Serranus criticized Ficino’s mode of translating and commenting on Plato’s dialogues, which he thought lacked clarity, brevity, and precision. The self-proclaimed Platonist G. W. Leibniz complains that Ficino’s definitions lack the rigor of Plato’s, and he says that his Neoplatonism incorporates too many pagan elements and is therefore prone to heresy. In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, G. W. F. Hegel gives Ficino a minor and subordinate role to play in the development of modern philosophy. Hegel argues that Ficino’s revival of Platonic philosophy was ultimately a misguided and childish fascination with a dead philosophy. Perhaps more importantly, however, is the fact that Ficino’s philosophy stands in stark contrast to the methods and explanations employed by the new science in the seventeenth century. Hobbes and Descartes, for example, wanted to explain nature in purely materialistic and mechanical terms. The new philosophy and science, therefore, repudiates the vital core of Ficino’s metaphysics, especially his belief in a World Soul and his vitalistic natural philosophy. Hobbes outright rejects an incorporeal soul, and Descartes completely expels it from nature. Both philosophers, therefore, aspired to explain nature in such a way that it did not include many of the core features of the Ficino’s thought.
For a longtime Ficino remained a marginal figure and a footnote in histories of philosophy. It was not until nearly the middle of the twentieth century, when Paul Oskar Kristeller published his seminal book, The Philosophy of Marsilio Ficino, that historians of philosophy started to re-examine and reconsider Ficino’s importance to the history of Renaissance and early modern philosophies. Kristeller’s book examined the formal structure of Ficino’s philosophy, and he painted a picture of a sophisticated and systematic metaphysician. More recently a number of articles and books have been published on other aspects of Ficino’s thought. Since Kristeller, later scholars—such as D. P. Walker, Frances Yates, and Michael J. B. Allen—have focused less on the systematic and formal philosophy, and more on the magical and creative elements of Ficino’s thought. The critical examination of Ficino, and an assessment of his influence, continues today.
James G. Snyder
U. S. A.
Last updated: February 27, 2012 | Originally published: