How is it that we can be moved by what we know does not exist, namely the situations of people in fictional stories? The so-called “paradox of emotional response to fiction” is an argument for the conclusion that our emotional response to fiction is irrational. The argument contains an inconsistent triad of premises, all of which seem initially plausible. These premises are (1) that in order for us to be moved (to tears, to anger, to horror) by what we come to learn about various people and situations, we must believe that the people and situations in question really exist or existed; (2) that such “existence beliefs” are lacking when we knowingly engage with fictional texts; and (3) that fictional characters and situations do in fact seem capable of moving us at times.
A number of conflicting solutions to this paradox have been proposed by philosophers of art. While some argue that our apparent emotional responses to fiction are only “make-believe” or pretend, others claim that existence beliefs aren’t necessary for having emotional responses (at least to fiction) in the first place. And still others hold that there is nothing especially problematic about our emotional responses to works of fiction, since what these works manage to do (when successful) is create in us the “illusion” that the characters and situations depicted therein actually exist.
In a much-discussed 1975 article, and in a series of “Replies to my Critics” written over the next two decades, Colin Radford argues that our apparent ability to respond emotionally to fictional characters and events is “irrational, incoherent, and inconsistent” (p. 75). This on the grounds that (1) existence beliefs concerning the objects of our emotions (for example, that the characters in question really exist; that the events in question have really taken place) are necessary for us to be moved by them, and (2) that such beliefs are lacking when we knowingly partake of works of fiction. Taking it pretty much as a given that (3) such works do in fact move us at times, Radford’s conclusion, refreshing in its humility, is that our capacity for emotional response to fiction is as irrational as it is familiar: “our being moved in certain ways by works of art, though very ‘natural’ to us and in that way only too intelligible, involves us in inconsistency and so incoherence” (p. 78).
The need for existence beliefs is supposedly revealed by the following sort of case. If what we at first believed was a true account of something heart-wrenching turned out to be false, a lie, a fiction, etc., and we are later made aware of this fact, then we would no longer feel the way we once did—though we might well feel something else, such as embarrassment for having been taken in to begin with. And so, Radford argues, “It would seem that I can only be moved by someone’s plight if I believe that something terrible has happened to him. If I do not believe that he has not and is not suffering or whatever, I cannot grieve or be moved to tears” (p. 68). Of course, what Radford means to say here is: “I can only be rationally moved by someone’s plight if I believe that something terrible has happened to him. If I do not believe that he has not and is not suffering or whatever, I cannot rationally grieve or be moved to tears.” Such beliefs are absent when we knowingly engage with fictions, a claim Radford supports by presenting and then rejecting a number of objections that might be raised against it.
One of the major objections to his second premise considered by Radford is that, at least while we are engaged in the fiction, we somehow “forget” that what we are reading or watching isn’t real; in other words, that we get sufficiently “caught up” in the novel, movie, etc. so as to temporarily lose our awareness of its fictional status. In response to this objection, Radford offers the following two considerations: first, if we truly forgot that what we are reading or watching isn’t real, then we most likely would not feel any of the various forms of pleasure that frequently accompany other, more “negative” emotions (such as fear, sadness, and pity) in fictional but not real-life cases; and second, the fact that we do not “try to do something, or think that we should” (p. 71) when seeing a sympathetic character being attacked or killed in a film or play, implies our continued awareness of this character’s fictional status even while we are moved by what happens to him. This second consideration—an emphasis on the behavioral disanalogies between our emotional responses to real-life and fictional characters and events—is one that crops up repeatedly in the arguments of philosophers such as Kendall Walton and Noel Carroll, whose positive accounts are nevertheless completely opposed to one another.
Finally, Radford thinks there can be no denying his third premise, that fictional characters themselves are capable of moving us—as opposed to, say, actual (or perhaps merely possible) people in similar situations, who have undergone trials and tribulations very much like those in the story. So his conclusion that our emotional responses to fiction are irrational appears valid and, however unsatisfactory, at the very least non-paradoxical. Summarizing his position in a 1977 follow-up article, with specific reference to the emotion of fear, Radford writes that existence beliefs “[are] a necessary condition of our being unpuzzlingly, rationally, or coherently frightened. I would say that our response to the appearance of the monster is a brute one that is at odds with and overrides our knowledge of what he is, and which in combination with our distancing knowledge that this is only a horror film, leads us to laugh—at the film, and at ourselves for being frightened” (p. 210).
Since the publication of Radford’s original essay, many Anglo-American philosophers of art have been preoccupied with exposing the inadequacies of his position, and with presenting alternative, more “satisfying” solutions. In fact, few issues of The British Journal of Aesthetics, Philosophy, or The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism have come out over the past 25 years which fail to contain at least one piece devoted to the so-called “paradox of emotional response to fiction.” As recently as April 2000, Richard Joyce writes in a journal article that “Radford must weary of defending his thesis that the emotional reactions we have towards fictional characters, events, and states of affairs are irrational. Yet, for all the discussion, the issue has not.been properly settled” (p. 209). It is interesting to note that while virtually all of those writing on this subject credit Radford with initiating the current debate, none of them have adopted his view as their own. At least in part, this must be because what Radford offers is less the solution to a mystery (how is it that we can be moved by what we know does not exist?) than a straightforward acceptance of something mysterious about human nature (our ability to be moved by what we know does not exist is illogical, irrational, even incoherent).
To date, three basic strategies for resolving the paradox in question have turned up again and again in the philosophical literature, each one appearing in a variety of different forms (though it should be noted, other, more idiosyncratic solutions can also be found). It is to these strategies, and some of the powerful criticisms that have been levied against them, that we now briefly turn.
Pretend theorists, most notably Kendall Walton, in effect deny premise (3), arguing that it is not literally true that we fear horror film monsters or feel sad for the tragic heroes of Greek drama. As noted above, Walton’s defense of premise (2) also rests on a playing up of the behavioral disanalogies between our responses to real-life versus fictional characters and events. But unlike Radford, who looks at real-life cases of emotional response and the likelihood of their elimination when background conditions change in order to defend premise (1), Walton offers nothing more than an appeal to “common sense”: “It seems a principle of common sense, one which ought not to be abandoned if there is any reasonable alternative, that fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger” (1978, pp. 6-7).
According to Walton, it is only “make-believedly” true that we fear horror film monsters, feel sad for the Greek tragic heroes, etc. He admits that these characters move us in various ways, both physically and psychologically—the similarities to real fear, sadness, etc. are striking—but regardless of what our bodies tell us, or what we might say, think, or believe we are feeling, what we actually experience in such cases are only “quasi-emotions” (e.g., “quasi-fear”). Quasi-emotions differ from true emotions primarily in that they are generated not by existence beliefs (such as the belief that the monster I am watching on screen really exists), but by “second-order” beliefs about what is fictionally the case according to the work in question (such as the belief that the monster I am watching on screen make-believedly exists. As Walton puts it, “Charles believes (he knows) that make-believedly the green slime [on the screen] is bearing down on him and he is in danger of being destroyed by it. His quasi-fear results from this belief” (p. 14). Thus, it is make-believedly the case that we respond emotionally to fictional characters and events due to the fact that our beliefs concerning the fictional properties of those characters and events generates in us the appropriate quasi-emotional states.
What has made the Pretend Theory in its various forms attractive to many philosophers is its apparent ability to handle a number of additional puzzles relating to audience engagement with fictions. Such puzzles include the following:
Despite its novelty, as well as Walton’s heroic attempts at defending it, the Pretend Theory continues to come under attack from numerous quarters. Many of these attacks can be organized under the following two general headings:
Walton introduces and supports his theory with reference to the familiar games of make-believe played by young children—games in which globs of mud are taken to be pies, for example, or games in which a father, pretending to be a vicious monster, will stalk his child and lunge at him at the crucial moment: “The child flees, screaming, to the next room. But he unhesitatingly comes back for more. He is perfectly aware that his father is only ‘playing,’ that the whole thing is ‘just a game,’ and that only make-believedly is there a vicious monster after him. He is not really afraid” (1978, p. 13). Such games rely on what Walton calls “constituent principles” (e.g., that whenever there is a glob of mud in a certain orange crate, it is make-believedly true that there is a pie in the oven) which are accepted or understood to be operating. However, these principles need not be explicit, deliberate, or even public: “one might set up one’s own personal game, adopting principles that no one else recognizes. And at least some of the principles constituting a personal game of make-believe may be implicit” (p. 12). According to Walton, just as a child will experience quasi-fear as a result of believing that make-believedly a vicious monster is coming to get him, moviegoers watching a disgusting green slime make its way towards the camera will experience quasi-fear as a result of believing that, make-believedly, they are being threatened by a fearsome creature. In both cases, it is this quasi-fear which makes it the case that the respective game players are make-believedly (not really) afraid.
To the extent that one is able to identify significant disanalogies with familiar games of make-believe, then, Walton’s theory looks to be in trouble. One such disanalogy concerns our relative lack of choice when it comes to (quasi-)emotional responses to fiction films and novels. Readers and viewers of such fictions, the argument goes, don’t seem to have anything close to the ability of make-believe game-playing children to control their emotional responses. On the one hand, we can’t just turn such responses off—refuse to play and prevent ourselves from being affected—like kids can. As Noel Carroll writes in his book, The Philosophy of Horror, “if it [the fear produced by horror films] were a pretend emotion, one would think that it could be engaged at will. I could elect to remain unmoved by The Exorcist; I could refuse to make believe I was horrified. But I don’t think that that was really an option for those, like myself, who were overwhelmedly struck by it” (1990, p. 74).
On the other hand, Carroll also points out that as consumers of fiction we aren’t able to just turn our emotional responses on, either: “if the response were really a matter of whether we opt to play the game, one would think that we could work ourselves into a make-believe dither voluntarily. But there are examples [of fictional works] which are pretty inept, and which do not seem to be recuperable by making believe that we are horrified. The monsters just aren’t particularly horrifying, though they were intended to be” (p. 74). Carroll cites such forgettable pictures as The Brain from Planet Arous and Attack of the Fifty Foot Woman as evidence of his claim that some fictional texts simply fail to generate their intended emotional response.
Another proposed disanalogy between familiar examples of make-believe game-playing and our emotional engagement with fictions focuses on the phenomenology of the two cases. The objection here is that, assuming the accuracy of Walton’s account when it comes to children playing make-believe, it is simply not true to ordinary experience that consumers of fictions are in similar emotional states when watching movies, reading books, and the like. David Novitz, for one, notes that “many theatre-goers and readers believe that they are actually upset, excited, amused, afraid, and even sexually aroused by the exploits of fictional characters. It seems altogether inappropriate in such cases to maintain that our theatre-goers merely make-believe that they are in these emotional states” (1987, p. 241). Glenn Hartz makes a similar point, in stronger language:
My teenage daughter convinces me to accompany her to a “tear-jerker” movie with a fictional script. I try to keep an open mind, but find it wholly lacking in artistry. I can’t wait for it to end. Still, tears come welling up at the tragic climax, and, cursing, I brush them aside and hide in my hood on the way to the car. Phenomenologically, this description is perfectly apt. But it is completely inconsistent with the Make-Believe Theory, which says emotional flow is always causally dependent on make-believe. [H]ow can someone who forswears any imaginative involvement in a series of fictional events.respond to them with tears of sadness? (1999, p. 572)Carroll too argues that “Walton’s theory appears to throw out the phenomenology of the state [here 'art-horror'] for the sake of logic” (1990, p. 74), on the grounds that, as opposed to children playing make-believe, when responding to works of fiction we do not seem to be aware at all of playing any such games.
Of course, Walton’s position is that the only thing required here is the acceptance or recognition of a constituent principle underlying the game in question, and this acceptance may well be tacit rather than conscious. But Carroll thinks that it “strains credulity” to suppose that not only are we unaware of some of the rules of the game, but that “we are completely unaware of playing a game. Surely a game of make-believe requires the intention to pretend. But on the face of it, consumers of horror do not appear to have such an intention” (pp. 74-75). Although he disagrees with Walton’s Pretend Theory on other grounds, Alex Neill offers a powerful reply to objections which cite phenomenological disanalogies. In his words, what philosophers such as Novitz, Hartz, and Carroll miss “is that the fact that Charles is genuinely moved by the horror movie.is precisely what motivates Walton’s account”:
By labeling this kind of state ‘quasi-fear,’ Walton is not suggesting that it consists of feigned or pretended, rather than actual, feelings and sensations. .Rather, Walton label’s Charles’s physiological/psychological state ‘quasi-fear’ to mark the fact that what his feelings and sensations are feelings and sensations of is precisely what is at issue. .On his view, we can actually be moved by works of fiction, but it is make-believe that we are moved to is fear. (1991, pp. 49-50)Suffice to say, the question whether objections to Walton’s Pretend Theory on the grounds of phenomenological difference are valid or not continues to be discussed and debated.
In arguing that Walton’s quasi-emotions are unnecessary theoretical entities, some philosophers have pointed to cases of involuntary reaction to visual stimuli—the so-called “startle effect” in film studies terminology—where the felt anxiety, repulsion, or disgust is clearly not make-believe, since these reactions do not depend at all on beliefs in the existence of what we are seeing. Simo Säätelä for example, argues that “fear is easy to confuse with being shocked, startled, anxious, etc. Here the existence or non-existence of the object can hardly be important. When we consider fear [in fictional contexts] this often seems to be a plausible analysis—it is simply a question of a mistaken identification of sensations and feelings. Thus no technical redescription in terms of make-believe is needed” (1994, p. 29). One problem with turning this objection into a full-blown theory of emotional response to fiction in its own right, as both S„„tel„ and Neill have suggested doing, is that there seem to be at least some cases of fearing fictions where the startle effect is not involved. Another problem is that it is not at all clear what equivalents to the startle effect are available in the case of emotions such as, say, pity and regret.
A similar objection to Walton’s quasi-emotional states has been put forward by Glenn Hartz. He argues not that our responses to fiction are independent of belief, to be understood on the model of the startle effect, but that they are pre-conscious: that real (as opposed to pretend) beliefs which are not consciously entertained are automatically generated by certain visual stimuli. These beliefs are inconsistent with what the spectator—fully aware of where he is and what he is doing—explicitly avows. As Hartz puts it, “how could anything as cerebral and out-of-the-loop as ‘make believe’ make adrenaline and cortisol flow?” (1999, p. 563).
Thought theories boldly deny premise (1), the old and established thesis, traceable as far back as Aristotle and central to the so-called “Cognitive Theory of emotions,” (see Theories of Emotion) that existence beliefs are a necessary condition of (at the very least rational) emotional response. At the heart of the Thought Theory lies the view that, although our emotional responses to actual characters and events may require beliefs in their existence, there is no good reason to hold up this particular type of emotional response as the model for understanding emotional response in general. What makes emotional response to fiction different from emotional response to real world characters and events is that, rather than having to believe in the actual existence of the entity or event in question, all we need do is “mentally represent” (Peter Lamarque), “entertain in thought” (Noel Carroll), or “imaginatively propose” (Murray Smith) it to ourselves. By highlighting our apparent capacity to respond emotionally to fiction—by treating this as a central case of emotional response in general—the thought theorist believes he has produced hard evidence in support of the claim that premise (1) stands in need of modification, perhaps even elimination.
Even before the first explicit statement of the Thought Theory in a 1981 article by Lamarque, a number of philosophers rejected existence beliefs as a requirement for emotional response to fictions. Instead, they argued that the only type of beliefs necessary when engaging with fictions are “evaluative” beliefs about the characters and events depicted; beliefs, for example, about whether the characters and events in question have characteristics which render them funny, frightening, pitiable, etc. Eva Schaper, for example, in an article published three years before Lamarque’s, writes that:
We need a distinction.between the kind of beliefs which are entailed by my knowing that I am dealing with fiction, and the kind of beliefs which are relevant to my being moved by what goes on in fiction. .[B]eliefs about characters and events in fiction.are alone involved in our emotional response to what goes on. (1978, p. 39, 44)
More recently, but again without reference to the Thought Theory, R.T. Allen argues that, “A novel.is not a presentation of facts. But true statements can be made about what happens in it and beliefs directed towards those events can be true or false. .Once we realize that truth is not confined to the factual, the problem disappears” (1986, p. 66).
Although the two are closely related, strictly-speaking this version of the Thought Theory should not be confused with what is often referred to as the “Counterpart Theory” of emotional response to fiction. As Gregory Currie explains, according to this latter theory, “we experience genuine emotions when we encounter fiction, but their relation to the story is causal rather than intentional; the story provokes thoughts about real people and situations, and these are the intentional objects of our emotions” (1990, p. 188). Walton himself provides an early statement of the Counterpart Theory: “If Charles is a child, the movie may make him wonder whether there might not be real slimes or other exotic horrors like the one depicted in the movie, even if he fully realizes that the movie-slime itself is not real. Charles may well fear these suspected dangers; he might have nightmares about them for days afterwards” (1978, p. 10). Some variations of this theory go so far as make their claims with reference to possible as opposed to real people and situations. Regardless, it is important to note that Counterpart theories have at least as much in common with Pretend theories as with Thought theories, since, like the former, they seem to require a modification of Radford’s third premise (it is not the fictional works themselves that move us, but their real or possible counterparts).
Somewhat surprisingly, the Thought Theory has generated relatively little critical discussion, a fact in virtue of which it can be said to occupy a privileged position today. In a 1982 article, however, Radford himself attacks it on the following grounds:
Lamarque claims that I am frightened by ‘the thought’ of the green slime. That is the ‘real object’ of my fear. But if it is the moving picture of the slime which frightens me (for myself), then my fear is irrational, etc., for I know that what frightens me cannot harm me. So the fact that we are frightened by fictional thoughts does not solve the problem but forms part of it. (pp. 261-62]
More recently, film-philosopher Malcolm Turvey criticizes the Thought Theory on the grounds that it appears to ignore the concrete nature of the moving image, instead hypothesizing a “mental entity as the primary causal agent of the spectator’s emotional response” (1997, p. 433). According to Turvey, because we can and frequently do respond to the concrete presentation of cinematic images in a manner that is indifferent to their actual existence in the world, and because there is nothing especially mysterious about this fact, no theory at all is needed to solve the problem of emotional response to fiction film.
Even if it is correct with respect to the medium of film, however, what we might call Turvey’s “concreteness consideration” does not stand up as a critique of the Thought Theory generally. In the case of literature, for example, the reader obviously does not respond emotionally to the words as they appear on the printed page, but rather to the mental images these words serve to conjure in his mind.
It is also debatable whether the Thought Theory cannot be revised so as to incorporate the concreteness consideration, by simply redefining the psychological attitude referred to by Carroll as “entertaining” in either neutral or negative terms. In order for us to be moved by a work of fiction, the revised theory would go, all we need do is adopt a nonassertive—though still evaluative—psychological attitude towards the images which appear before us on screen (while watching a film) or in our minds (when thinking about them later, or perhaps while reading about them in a book). Turvey himself makes a move in this direction when he writes that “the spectator’s capacity to ‘entertain’ a cinematic representation of a fictional referent does not require the postulation of an intermediate, mental entity such as a ‘thought’ or ‘imagination’ in order to be understood” (1997, p. 456).
Arguing on behalf of the Thought Theory, Murray Smith invites us to “imagine gripping the blade of a sharp knife and then having it pulled from your grip, slicing through the flesh of your hand. If you shuddered in reaction to the idea, you didn’t do so because you believed that your hand was being cut by a knife” (1995, p. 116). In part due to its intuitive plausibility, in part due to its ability to explain away certain behavioral disanalogies with real-life cases of emotional response (for example: although he frightens us, the reason we don’t run out of the theater when watching the masked killer head towards us on the movie screen is because we never stop believing for a moment that what we are watching is only a representation of someone who doesn’t really exist), few philosophers have sought to meet the challenge posed by the Thought Theory head on.
Perhaps the biggest problem for the Thought Theory lies in its difficulty justifying its own presuppositions. In his original article, Radford asks the following questions in order to highlight the mysterious nature of our emotional responses to fiction: “We are saddened, but how can we be? What are we sad about? How can we feel genuinely and involuntarily sad, and weep, as we do knowing as we do that no one has suffered or died?” (1977, p. 77). These are questions the Thought theorist will have a tough time answering to the satisfaction of anyone not already inclined to agree with him. That is to say, where the Thought theorist seems to run into trouble is in explaining just why it is the mere entertaining in thought of a fictional character or event is able to generate emotional responses in audiences.
Illusion theorists, of whom there seem to be fewer and fewer these days, deny Radford’s second premise. They suggest a mechanism—whether it be some loose concept of “weak” or “partial” belief, Samuel Taylor Coleridge’s famous “willing suspension of disbelief,” Freud’s notion of “disavowal” as adapted by psychoanalytic film theorists such as Christian Metz, or something else entirely—whereby existence beliefs are generated in the course of our engagement with works of fiction.
In Section 1, we came across one of the most powerful objections to have been levied against the Illusion Theory to date: the obvious behavioral disanalogies between our emotional responses to real-life versus fictional characters and events. Even when the existence beliefs posited by the Illusion theorist are of the weak or partial variety, Walton argues that
Charles has no doubts about the whether he is in the presence of an actual slime. If he half believed, and were half afraid, we would expect him to have some inclination to act on his fear in the normal ways. Even a hesitant belief, a mere suspicion, that the slime is real would induce any normal person seriously to consider calling the police and warning his family. Charles gives no thought whatever to such courses of action. (1978, p. 7)The force of this and related objections has led to a state of affairs in which Gregory Currie, in a lengthy essay on the paradox of emotional response to fiction, can devote all of two sentences to his dismissal of the Illusion Theory:
Hardly anyone ever literally believes the content of a fiction when he knows it to be a fiction; if it happens at moments of forgetfulness or intense realism in the story (which I doubt), such moments are too brief to underwrite our often sustained responses to fictional events and characters. Henceforth, I shall assume the truth of [Radford's second premise] and consider the [other] possibilities. (1990, pp. 188-89)Notice, however, that a tremendous amount of weight seems to be placed here on the word “literally.” Is it really true to the facts that when normal people—not philosophers or film theorists!—talk about the “believability” of certain books they have read and movies they have seen, the notions of belief and believable-ness they have in mind are metaphorical, or else simply confused or mistaken? And that everyday talk of being “absorbed by” fictions, “engaged in” them, “lost” in them, etc. can be explained away solely in terms of such non-belief dependent features of the fictions in question as their “vividness” and “immediacy”?
It certainly isn’t clear whether the Illusion Theory in any form can be salvaged as a possible solution to the paradox of emotional response to fiction. It isn’t even clear whether what we have here really qualifies as a “paradox” at all. As Richard Moran (1994) argues, with reference to what he takes to be non-problematic cases of emotional response to modal facts (things that might have happened to us but didn’t) and historical facts (things that happened to us in the past): “our paradigms of ordinary emotions exhibit a great deal of variety., and.the case of fictional emotions gains a misleading appearance of paradox from an inadequate survey of examples”(p. 79). What is clear, however, is that the various debates surrounding the topic of emotional response to fiction continue to rage in the philosophical literature.
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 9, 2009 | Originally published: