Filial Obligation

The question of what one should do for one’s parents is often urgent; a parent needs care in the near future, and the grown child must decide what kind of care to provide, whether and to what extent to finance the provision of care, and to what extent the child ought to sacrifice his happiness, wellbeing, financial security, guest bedroom, and so forth for the sake of his parent. These questions are made murkier by shifting family structures, varying closeness—both past and present—between the parent and child, and conflicting obligations, such as those to one’s own children or partner or both.  To make matters worse for those facing these questions, the problem is relatively new in the philosophical literature.

Despite the urgency of the problem, few philosophers have directly engaged with the question of filial obligations. Although several briefly mention this question and sketch a few initial considerations regarding it, only a handful of contemporary philosophers have attempted to articulate a theory of what one owes one’s parents. In what follows, five such theories are presented and critiqued: Debt Theory, Friendship Theory, Gratitude Theory, Special Goods Theory, and Gratitude for Special Goods Theory.

Table of Contents

  1. The Problem
  2. Debt Theory
    1. The View
    2. Criticism
  3. Friendship Theory
    1. The View
    2. Criticism
  4. Gratitude Theory
    1. The View
    2. Criticism
  5. Special Goods Theory
    1. The View
    2. Criticism
  6. Gratitude for Special Goods
    1. The View
    2. Criticism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Problem

Though the family is a well-established institution about which much has been said, the current state of the parent-child relationship is a relatively new phenomenon. First, the family structure itself has shifted so that there now exists a wide and often confusing array of family unit types. Social roles have become difficult to determine, as have the social obligations attached to and defined by those social roles. Second, life expectancy in most first world nations is considerably longer than it has been in the past, so caring for elderly parents has only recently become a long-term commitment. Third, the care required to reach, and possibly enjoy, that longer life expectancy is often expensive. Fourth, the birth rate has declined, such that each parent has, on average, fewer children to provide the necessary care than in previous times. In short, longer-living parents have fewer children who might share the increasing financial burden of caring for the aging parent for longer periods of time, and shifting family structures obscure rather than clarify the role each family member should play.

Despite its intuitive appeal, the idea that we might have special obligations to someone in virtue of our relationship with them is a philosophically problematic one. Filial obligations are a particularly puzzling subset of special obligations. If they exist, some of their likely features seem striking. For example, filial obligations are generally owed to people with whom one’s relationship is largely non-voluntary. Yet, obligations might arise from non-voluntary situations that do not involve a parent-child relationship. For instance, if you are the person uniquely situated to save the drowning toddler in the Shallow Pond example, you have a rather stringent obligation, though the relationship that has generated is non-voluntary. However, the parent-child relationship is not merely non-voluntary. Rather, for much of the relationship, voluntariness is asymmetrical; parents chose to enter into a parent-child relationship, whereas children (and presumably the drowning toddler, for that matter) did not make a similar choice. The current state of one’s relationship with one’s parents might be voluntary; the child might choose to engage (or not) with his or her parents, exchange benefits, and so forth. However, if one’s parents made tremendous sacrifices on one’s behalf, many of which one did not request and of which one was unaware, then one owes one’s parents something in response to benefits that one did not voluntarily seek and in many cases was not free to reject.

Furthermore, if we owe our parents something because they fed, clothed, and sheltered us, then it seems as though we have obligations in response to acts which were themselves morally required. Our parents are required to feed, clothe, and shelter us, at least for some time. Why would we owe anything in response? After paying taxes, we do not owe the state a “thank you” for the services it provides, nor does the state owe us a “thank you” for our tax dollars. How could moral obligations arise from provisions that are morally required of the benefactors and are not voluntarily sought or accepted by the beneficiary, particularly when the benefactors voluntarily chose to become obligated?

Moreover, filial obligations raise questions about distributive justice, both theoretical and practical. Theoretical questions arise because filial obligations seem to confer special advantages on individuals with children—or at least those concerned to fulfill such obligations—that childless individuals—or individuals with children less concerned to fulfill such obligations—do not similarly enjoy. Furthermore, these advantages compound an already existing advantage: the parent-child relationship is itself a benefit to both parties when all goes well.

Practical questions arise about how filial care ought to be distributed. Such care falls disproportionately on women, which seems to violate any reasonable demands of justice. For instance, if we consider equal opportunity as a guiding principle of justice, and filial care interferes with women’s access to and participation in the workforce, then filial care as it has been traditionally practiced violates this important demand of justice. Furthermore, insofar as women “perform the majority of housework chores and function as the primary parent for small children,” perhaps women are owed more; that is, filial obligations to one’s mother may be more extensive than those to one’s father (Jecker 2002).

2. Debt Theory

a. The View

According to Debt Theory, one owes repayment to one’s parent for whatever investment of resources the parent has made on one’s behalf, regardless of the parent’s needs or child’s ability, unless the parent releases the child from the debt.  According to Debt Theory, as articulated here, children have specific obligations to their parents: they must repay their parents’ “investment” in child rearing. Parents contribute resources to raising children, including time, money, energy, and so on. Each of these resources could have been devoted to something other than raising a child. Consequently, the parent has fewer resources than he or she would otherwise have. The child therefore owes repayment of the debt.

Because this views the parent-child relationship as analogous to the creditor-debtor relationship, the circumstances under which a child would not be required to repay the investment are similar to those under which a debtor might be released from his obligation of repayment to the creditor. For example, a parent might release his child from this obligation of repayment much like a creditor might release a debtor. However, as in the case of the creditor-debtor, neither the parent’s needs nor the child’s ability determine the content of the child’s obligation. The child owes repayment regardless of his ability to repay the “loan” and regardless of whether the parent needs to be repaid. Just as the debtor’s obligation of repayment is not contingent on an ongoing, mutually beneficial relationship, the child owes repayment regardless of the nature of his relationship with his parent. Filial obligations arise from and are determined by the parent’s investment in rearing his or her child.

b. Criticism

As stated, Debt Theory is quite simple and, perhaps as a consequence of this simplicity, many critics think it is wildly implausible. Philosophers who advance a particular account of filial obligations often begin by rejecting Debt Theory. However, much of the critical discussion about it focuses on problems with an unarticulated and undefended position.

Although Confucius, Aristotle, and Thomas Aquinas each discuss filial obligations in the language of debt repayment, the view is not that children owe repayment of a “loan.” Rather, given what parents do for children, including bringing them into existence, children owe them gratitude and piety. Jan Narveson (1987) offers an account of filial morality that resembles Debt Theory, but on his view, the reason children ought to repay their parents is that it is beneficial for them to behave in ways that make parental investments rational and thereby encourage parents to make such investments. Similarly, despite “debt” language present in both Jeffrey Blustein’s Parents and Children and Philip J. Ivanhoe’s “Filial Piety as a Virtue,” both offer accounts of Debt Theory where the debt is one of gratitude or respect rather than a straightforward debt of repayment. Furthermore, Blustein suggests that those who use the “owing idiom” in fact “confuse gratitude with indebtedness” (Blustein 1982). Li (1997) has also added to these views.

In line with Blunstein and Ivanhoe’s accounts, the historical models for Debt Theory are not versions of the theory articulated here. Rather, they more closely resemble Gratitude Theory. Nonetheless, Debt Theory often serves as a useful starting point in discussions about filial obligation. Jane English, who first articulated and endorsed Friendship Theory, and Simon Keller, who did the same for Special Goods Theory, both begin by offering objections to Debt Theory. This shapes the content of their preferred theories of filial obligation. They both argue that the Debt Theory of filial obligations makes a faulty analogy between the parent-child and creditor-debtor relationships, and that this analogy ignores morally relevant features of the parent-child relationship. Despite this, critics disagree on what, if any, relationship is more closely analogous to the parent-child relationship and what that analogy, or lack thereof, implies about our filial obligations.

3. Friendship Theory

a. The View

According to Friendship Theory, children ought to do for their parents what they would do for friends with whom they share a voluntary, caring relationship. These obligations depend upon the needs and abilities of both child and parent, as well as the current state of the relationship. If the parent and child do not share a voluntary, loving relationship, then the child has no filial obligations. According to Friendship Theory founder Jane English, the entire language of the Debt Theory is problematic, as children do not, strictly speaking, owe their parents anything. The parent-child relationship is unlike the creditor-debtor relationship in that it is characterized by feelings of love and voluntary friendship.

The source of obligation between friends does not usually arise from one friend being in debt to another friend. If, for example, one friend does a favor for the other, then the beneficiary of the favor owes repayment. However, English argues that favors generate debts, but favors are fundamentally different from what friends generally do for one another. Similarly, favors are fundamentally different from most of what parents do for their children.

Unlike creditors, friends are, or ought to be, motivated by care. Indeed, we would be troubled to discover that our friends were keeping track of what nice things they had done for us and what nice things we had done for them, keeping a watchful eye out for any imbalances that might arise. According to Friendship Theory, we ought to focus not solely on the cost to the parent or on the benefit to the child, but also on the relationship in which the benefit arises. Consider a case in which a parent invests in her child’s education. If the child has asked for this payment, then the investment is a favor and the child owes repayment. If, however, the parent simply wants a good education for her child and offers to pay, then the child does not incur a debt of repayment by accepting the parent’s offer. The parent’s investment is made out of care for the child, and although the child would do well to help her parent later, the child does not owe the parent anything. Furthermore, just as we would question the friend who does nice things for us with the expectation of repayment, we might question the parent who invests in her child with an eye on repayment later.  Unlike the creditor-debtor relationship, in which balance sheets are expected and appropriate, friendships are relationships where balance sheets that record kind acts would indicate the relationship’s failure. In this regard, the parent-child relationship is, or ought to be, more like a friendship than like a creditor-debtor relationship.

Returning to the case of the parent who pays for her child’s elite education, the difference between Debt Theory and Friendship Theory is clear. According to Debt Theory, the child owes repayment regardless of the parent’s financial situation. Just as a debtor owes a creditor regardless of the creditor’s financial situation, the child owes repayment for the expensive education, even if the parent’s financial investment did not constitute any significant sacrifice. On Debt Theory, if multibillionaire parents pay $200,000 for their child’s education, that child owes repayment, despite her parents’ staggering wealth. To put this in English’s own terms, if these parents do a “favor” for their child by paying $200,000, then the child owes repayment of the favor. Whether the favor constitutes a sacrifice is irrelevant in determining whether obligations arise from the favor. Yet, the degree of sacrifice might be relevant in determining the content of those obligations. Similarly, according to Debt Theory, the grown child’s abilities are irrelevant. If the child is unable to repay the parent, the child has simply defaulted on her obligations.

According to Friendship Theory, however, the multibillionaires’ child ought to be kind, express concern for, and generally continue a caring relationship with her parents, but the child need not contribute to their financial resources. For example, the child ought to call or visit her parents on their birthdays, or ensure that the relationship continues in some way. However, since her parents are financially capable of providing for their own care in old age, Friendship Theory tells us that the multibillionaires’ children do not have an obligation to provide such care. On this view, the needs, abilities, and resources of both parties shape the content of filial obligations.

According to Debt Theory, these obligations do not diminish or disappear if the parent-child relationship is terminated. The obligation of repayment might become stronger since the parent no longer enjoys benefits such as participating in the relationship, which she might have enjoyed if the relationship had continued. According to Friendship Theory, however, since the source of the obligations is not the investment but rather the relationship itself, filial obligations diminish or disappear if the relationship diminishes or disappears. To maintain that filial obligations exist without a voluntary, loving parent-child relationship is to ignore morally relevant differences between what the parent does for her child and what the creditor does for the debtor. Appropriately, the creditor acts with the expectation of repayment. The parent does not, or at least should not, act with this expectation.

b. Criticism

Two types of criticism arise in response to Friendship Theory. First, critics argue that focusing on the current state of a relationship to determine whether filial obligations arise makes those obligations too easily avoidable, thereby licensing filial ingratitude. Second, as with Debt Theory, the relationship analogy fails. Just as the parent-child relationship is different from the creditor-debtor relationship in morally significant ways, it also differs from friendships in morally significant ways.

The first type of objection challenges English’s claim that filial obligations diminish or disappear entirely when the relationship dissolves. Consequently, critics argue, filial obligations are too easily avoidable, and cases of filial ingratitude appear unproblematic. In his criticism of Friendship Theory, Simon Keller (2007) presents this objection as follows: “You cannot explain your failure to look after your parents by saying, ‘Look, they’re great people, and I’ll always value the times when we were close, but over the years we’ve taken different paths. I went my way, they went theirs, it seemed like the relationship wasn’t taking us where we wanted to go . . . things just aren’t the way they were.’ You are stuck with your filial duties, in a way that you are not stuck with your duties of friendship”. Although English embraces this conclusion, and argues that repayment after the relationship ends might indicate a lack of respect for the relationship, her critics find it a compelling reason to reject the entire model.

As stated, the second objection is that the parent-child relationship is different from a friendship in morally significant ways, and thus a theory of obligations between friends cannot serve as a theory of filial obligations. According to Joseph Kupfer (1990), not only is it unlikely that parents and children can be friends, it is undesirable. Parents and children cannot be friends because they are not equals within the relationship and they lack sufficient independence from one another to become equals. This lack is not, however, a problematic feature of the parent-child relationship. Rather, it is constitutive of a healthy parent-child relationship. Thus, rather than a friendship, the parent-child relationship is, or at least begins as, a relationship between unequal partners since parents shape who the child will become.

This history of unequal autonomy effectively eliminates any possibility that equality will be restored later in the relationship; that is, inequality begets further inequality. This is accomplished in two ways. First, the child’s self-concept is shaped by her history of unequal autonomy. Thus, the child’s self-concept is likely to include diminished autonomy with respect to the parent-child relationship. Second, the child’s history with her parent forms habits of deference and respect toward the parent. Just as the friend who has less autonomy in the context of the friendship, the grown child is less likely to make decisions, offer opinions, or resist the conclusions of the more autonomous partner in the relationship. Given this history, and the likely effect it has on the prospects for equal autonomy in the future, Kupfer concludes that parents and children cannot and should not be friends. Therefore, Friendship Theory is a poor model for filial obligations.

4. Gratitude Theory

a. The View

According to Gratitude Theory, one owes gratitude to one’s parent in response to the parent’s benevolence toward the child, so long as this gratitude serves to support rather than undermine relationships of mutual respect. Although this has not been defended as an independent theory of filial obligation, gratitude theorists suggest that it is the natural grounding of such obligation. Fred Berger (1975), for instance, develops an account of gratitude, and briefly considers how it applies to the case of grown children:

The sort of continual sacrifice and caring involved in a decent upbringing is not reciprocated to parents by a warm handshake at the legal age of independence. While the notion of gratitude to one’s parents can easily be overdone, it is clear enough that an adequate showing of gratitude to them cannot be made with mere verbal expressions … It is very hard to say just what is appropriate, and it may be that there can be no answer in the abstract … It is clear, however, that a handshake or kiss on the cheek normally will not do.

Given Berger’s own account of gratitude, as well as Claudia Card’s (1988), the Gratitude Theory provides five considerations that aim to determine when obligations of gratitude arise and what such obligations entail. The five considerations are as follows:

  1. Gratitude is a three-part relation: X is grateful to Y for Z.
  2. Gratitude is generally warranted in response to another’s benevolence.
  3. Gratitude is not something a benefactor has a right to, even though the beneficiary may owe it.
  4. The beneficiary’s debt of gratitude is a relatively informal obligation.
  5. Obligations associated with gratitude might be impossible to fulfill, though that does not imply that the obligation is itself overly demanding.

Before extending this theory to filial obligations, let us look briefly at each component.

First, gratitude is a three-part relation. Genuine gratitude is directed toward someone, and it is for something. One might be very glad to enjoy certain benefits, even when no one is responsible for providing them. Genuine gratitude, then, requires someone to whom one can be grateful.

Second, gratitude is in response to the motivations of another person, not only to the benefits or perceived benefits that person might provide. Berger (1975) articulates this consideration as follows: “Gratitude, then, does not consist in the requital of benefits but in a response to benevolence; it is a response to a grant of benefits (or the attempt to benefit us) which was motivated by a desire to help us.” To see why one might think that obligations of gratitude arise only in response to certain motivations, consider a case in which someone undertakes some action that benefits a friend, but this person does not foresee the benefit to her friend, and might have acted differently if she had foreseen this result. The friend does not owe gratitude for accidental benefits; if the person intended not to benefit her friend, gratitude seems inappropriate. Alternatively, if someone tries to benefit her friend but fails, the friend can be grateful for the effort, even though the effort yields no actual benefits.

Third, the benefactor has no right to gratitude, even if gratitude is owed. If a man is drowning and a passerby risks her life to save him, he certainly ought to be grateful to her. If he is not, she may rightfully feel that she has been mistreated, and third parties may rightfully judge him to be reprehensibly selfish. Even so, this Good Samaritan has no right to his gratitude such that she or third parties could require that he experience or express it or both.

Fourth, obligations of gratitude are relatively informal. Unlike debt repayment, the terms of these obligations are imprecise and flexible. In some cases, appropriate gratitude might be expressed with a “thank you,” whereas in others, gratitude might require greater sacrifice. Furthermore, obligations of gratitude may change over time if the relationship between the benefactor and beneficiary changes.

Fifth, the obligations might be ongoing and impossible to fulfill, but this does not mean that they are overly demanding. Consider again the case a passerby risking her own safety to rescue a drowning man. A mere “thank you” might not serve as a sufficient expression of his gratitude. This is the sort of case where it seems appropriate for him to say, “I can’t ever thank you enough.” Even if this is true, it does not mean that he owes the passerby lavish gifts, constant praise, or a first-born child. It means only that his gratitude ought to be ongoing. This is not necessarily a demanding obligation, however. Gratitude might require only that he thank her and continue to behave kindly toward her. On Berger’s view, expressions of gratitude need not be proportional to the benefits bestowed, for the motivation of the benefactor rather than the benefits themselves ground the obligation.

According to Gratitude Theory, the obligations one has to one’s parents are based on gratitude, and fulfilling those obligations serves as an expression of one’s gratitude. As in other moral relationships, gratitude in the parent-child relationship is not always appropriate. Parents who invest heavily in their child’s education might bestow substantial benefits on the child. However, the child may have no obligations of gratitude toward his parents if they sought to bestow such benefits exclusively for self-serving reasons. Berger cites fictional cases in which parents aim to keep their family in good social status and, driven by this aim, they try to secure as many benefits as possible for their child. Here, the child may feel grateful to his parents for these benefits. Nonetheless, the child does not owe gratitude. Because it is a response to benevolence, the child owes gratitude only if the parents attempt to bestow these benefits on the child for her benefit; the gratitude is in response to the parents’ motivations rather than the benefits themselves. When benevolent motivation is absent, there is no obligation of gratitude.

Gratitude Theory does not distinguish between those benefits the child voluntarily accepts and those the child does not. Blustein (1982) explains this feature of gratitude as follows:

That we did not request those services does not itself entail that we have no duty to show gratitude for them. Indeed, since gratitude is essentially a response to benevolence, it seems that we may have a duty to show gratitude (at some point) for benefits that we did not voluntarily accept but only received, and for benefits which, at the time they were provided, were judged to be benefits by the grantor alone, and not by the recipient.

Gratitude Theory does, however, distinguish between the lack of voluntary acceptance and a preference to not be the recipient of another’s generosity. In her discussion of Gratitude Theory, Card notes that gratitude may not be owed if the benefactor has disregarded the beneficiary’s wishes and cautions against confusing generosity with benevolence. Generosity, Card (1988) explains, “can be accompanied by insensitivity to others’ wishes with regard to becoming obligated” whereas “[g]enuine benevolence is incompatible with disregarding others’ willingness to become obligated. Those who lack such regard thereby lack respect.”

Furthermore, children may owe gratitude even for those benefits the parent was morally obligated to provide, such as food and shelter. After all, the parents need not provide food and shelter from a motive of duty. Rather, the parents may meet the child’s needs precisely because the parents have concern for the child’s wellbeing and want to benefit the child.

Appropriate expressions of gratitude are those that support rather than undermine the mutual respect necessary for moral relationships, and this constraint serves as an upper limit on the demands of such an obligation: whatever an obligation of gratitude requires of us, it cannot require that we forfeit our autonomy. Autonomy, according to Berger, entails broad control over the shape of our own lives. Berger (1975) offers the following justification for such a limit: “To treat someone as a person in his own right entails granting him the right to work out the plan of his life as he sees fit.” Mutual respect requires that both the parent and the child grant each other, and themselves, the right to work out the plans of their lives. Any infringement on or expectation that one will forfeit that right undermines respect within the relationship. In such a case, the parties neither see each other nor themselves as persons in their own right but rather as means to another’s ends. Because Berger considers mutual respect a necessary condition for moral relationships between persons, neither the expectation nor the expression of gratitude should undermine that respect, as doing so would harm the relationship.

Gratitude Theory is distinct from Friendship Theory in important ways, though many of the demands might overlap. As the filial ingratitude objection suggests, obligations of gratitude can extend beyond friendship, for even after a friendship dissolves, obligations of gratitude for past benevolence may persist. The basis for obligations of friendship is the friendship itself, whereas the basis for obligations of gratitude is benevolence. Although parents may behave benevolently toward their children because of a relationship that resembles a friendship, the friendship itself does not ground obligations of gratitude.

Returning to the example of those benefits the parent is required to provide, such as food and shelter, the difference between the two theories becomes clear. At the time that parents are morally obligated to provide such things—for instance, when the child is very young—a friendship might be forming such that in later years the two will have a relationship analogous to a friendship. At the moment, however, the child might be too young for the parent-child relationship to be comparable to even a non-ideal friendship. Although a friendship might form later, where obligations of friendship would then arise, the grounds for an obligation of gratitude might already be present. Whether or not a friendship later emerges between the two, the obligation of gratitude remains. Because the grounds for the obligations are distinct, so are the theories.

b. Criticism

Simon Keller and Brynn Welch each offer criticisms of Gratitude Theory. Consider the following example: two friends help a mutual friend move into a new house, but one finds moving enjoyable while the other finds it onerous. According to Keller, the beneficiary incurs a stronger or more extensive obligation of gratitude toward the friend who finds the process onerous. Analogously, a child owes more to a parent who sacrificed a great deal than she would owe to a parent whose sacrifice was less substantial. Keller finds this an unacceptable consequence of Gratitude Theory.

Keller also objects that filial obligations, unlike obligations of gratitude, are ongoing and open-ended, and if filial obligations were grounded in gratitude, we would have no gesture that would capture that gratitude. Sending a card or flowers seems laughably insufficient as a demonstration of gratitude. Expressions of such gratitude are made more difficult by the fact that we generally think that for most acts of benevolence, a card or flowers discharges our duty of gratitude; we have shown our appreciation for the benefactor’s benevolence, and nothing more is required of us.

Welch argues that Keller’s objections to Gratitude Theory are based on a mistaken or uncharitable interpretation of the view or both, and the theory can survive those objections. However, she argues that the theory does not offer any action-guiding principles and so cannot answer the question it seeks to answer: what do I owe my parents? This is not simply the claim that the theory does not specify the content of filial obligations, but rather it does not even tell us what sort of action is required. Gratitude Theory might require no action at all but only a certain emotional experience, namely the experience of being grateful to the benefactor. If the theory offers a range of possible expressions of gratitude, we will still require some guidance as to the appropriate range of actions; that is, we still need to know whether something like a thank-you or flowers would be appropriate, or whether something like paying for expensive medical care is required. If Gratitude Theory requires a particular emotional attitude, then it must answer well-known problems associated with requiring emotional experiences.

5. Special Goods Theory

a. The View

In response to what he sees as failures of Debt, Friendship, and Gratitude theories of filial obligation, Simon Keller offers Special Goods Theory. It has three conditions:

If (1) a parent needs some special good, (2) the parent has provided or currently provides special goods to the child, and (3) the child is able to provide the special good that the parent needs, then the child ought to provide that special good to the parent.

In contrast to the previous theories, Special Goods Theory of filial obligations focuses on the benefits to the child and the needs of the parent. Specifically, this theory states that the parent-child relationship is one that makes possible certain special goods. According to Keller (2006, 2007), special goods are those that “contribute to individual welfare, meaning that they are goods that benefit an individual, or that contribute to her well-being, or her best interests” and which “the parent can receive from no one (or almost no one) but the child, or the child can receive from no one (or almost no one) but the parent”. Generic goods, on the other hand, are those that can easily arise from other sources.

In making his case for Special Goods Theory, Keller (2007) states six intuitions about filial obligations and argues that his theory best explains those intuitions. He states them as follows:

  • “Filial duties are ongoing and open-ended; they are not duties that can be discharged once and for all.”
  • “The nature and extent of your filial duties do not vary with the exact nature or quantity of parental sacrifice involved in your upbringing; you do not have lesser filial duties for having been easy to raise.”
  • “Filial duties are not easily avoidable; the moral relationship from which they arise is not one that you choose to enter, nor one that you can simply choose to end.”
  • “But [filial duties] do vary with certain changes in your ongoing relationship with your parents; if your parents unreasonably disown you, for example, then your filial duties may not be what they were.”
  • “The demands made by filial duty do not extend so far that meeting them impedes your ability to exercise a reasonable amount of autonomous choice over the shape of your own life; you do not have filial duties to (for example) pursue a particular career, follow a particular religion, or give more financially than you can reasonably afford.”
  • “Filial duties can be, in a different respect, very demanding; if you can afford to pay for your parents’ medical care, for example, then filial duty can require you to do so, even if it is very expensive.”

Keller concludes from these intuitions that the parent-child relationship and, consequently, filial obligations, are unique. Unlike Debt theory and Friendship theory, Keller begins with the assumption that the parent-child relationship is not analogous to any other kind of relationship. The intuitions are worth discussing further, as Keller often appeals to them as justification for his theory of filial obligation.

First, Special Goods Theory can explain why filial obligations cannot be fulfilled once and for all. Satisfying the three conditions has no theoretical limit; consequently, the obligation can be ongoing. To determine a child’s filial obligations, we consider only whether the circumstances satisfy these three conditions; we do not consider whether these three conditions have been satisfied already. Fulfilling obligations in a particular instance does not preclude the continuous satisfaction of the conditions. Any time these conditions are satisfied, filial obligations arise, and the conditions can remain satisfied for as long as the parent is alive.

Second, Special Goods Theory explains why one does not have less extensive or fewer filial obligations for having been easy to raise. The extent of one’s obligations depends entirely on the three conditions being satisfied, not on the extent to which the third condition—that the child is able to provide the special good that the parent needs—is satisfied. Provided that a parent requires some special good and has in the past provided special goods to his or her children, and that the children enjoy reciprocal relationships with their parent, then any differences between what the children owe will result from differences in their abilities to provide for the parent.

Third, Special Goods Theory explains why we cannot easily escape filial obligations. Whether the conditions for filial obligations are satisfied is, to a large extent, out of our control. We cannot alter our parents’ needs, nor can we undo that they have previously provided us with special goods. Further, we cannot escape filial obligation simply by terminating the relationship. Doing so will not effect whether the conditions for filial obligations are satisfied.

Fourth, the nature of one’s relationship with one’s parents can shape the content of one’s filial obligations. Consider a case in which a mother has terminated her relationship with her child. Regardless of whether this action was justified, we can now reasonably make certain claims regarding her child’s filial obligations. For example, if the mother does not wish to speak to her child, then her child is no longer positioned to provide the good in question; that is, staying in touch with her mother. The child, however, may still have other filial obligations. Yet, these may also depend on the current nature of the relationship, for it can shape the content of the obligations.

Fifth, filial obligations are not so extensive as to impede one’s ability to exercise autonomy. The third condition of filial obligations is that one is uniquely positioned to provide certain goods. The theory does not include the further requirement that one positions oneself in order to provide such goods.

Finally, Special Goods Theory can explain why filial obligations can be demanding. The child has an obligation to provide expensive long-term care for the parent if the child can provide it and if the parent has provided special goods to the child in the past or at present. According to the conditions of this theory, the extent of the obligation depends on the extent of the need and the extent to which the child can provide the required special goods.

This theory can potentially generate a wide range of filial obligations, from virtually costless to oppressively demanding, for the three conditions could continue to be satisfied so long as the parent and child are alive. Nothing about discharging the obligation in a particular instance precludes the conditions from being satisfied again, thereby generating new obligations. Moreover, in societies that do not provide care for their ageing members, long-term care is a special good, for it is unlikely to be provided by a source outside of the relationship. In such a society, the child’s obligations might be extensive simply because of the parent’s needs. Importantly, though, this theory clearly tells us what our filial obligations are: we ought to provide our parents with the special goods they need, provided they have provided those goods to us in the past.

b. Criticism

According to Welch, Special Goods Theory does not respond appropriately to the relationship’s moral considerations, specifically those regarding what the parent deserves. Keller says that we owe our parents special goods in the context of reciprocity. According to Welch, there are three plausible interpretations of this restriction but none suffice to avoid his moral objection. The first interpretation is that parent-child relationships are, when things go well, reciprocal insofar as both the parent and child benefit from the relationship. At least, the child benefits during his early years and the parent in her later years. Yet, if Keller only means that the relationship is reciprocal in this minimal sense, he cannot justify his fourth intuition: filial obligations “vary with certain changes in your ongoing relationship with your parents; if your parents unreasonably disown you … then your filial duties may not be what they were.” If a reciprocal relationship requires only that the parent-child relationship is or was mutually beneficial, then so long as the parent has provided the benefits to the child in the past, the current state of the relationship is irrelevant except insofar as it affects a child’s ability to provide special goods to the parent. The current state of the relationship does not necessarily determine whether the relationship is reciprocal.

The second interpretation is that a reciprocal relationship might require ongoing reciprocity; that is, the parent and child enjoy a reciprocal relationship so long as each continues to benefit. This interpretation would justify the intuition in question, for if the relationship changes and is no longer reciprocal, then the child’s filial obligations would also change. This interpretation suggests, however, that filial obligations no longer exist once the parent cannot contribute to the relationship.

Welch argues that this is problematic by offering the following example: in a society in which care for elderly persons is the responsibility of private citizens, an elderly woman suffering from dementia requires medical care, and she has a wealthy daughter who can provide such care. Yet, because the mother is physically and mentally incapable of contributing goods to the relationship, the relationship is no longer reciprocal. The daughter is wondering whether she has an obligation to provide such care for her mother, since her mother needs the care, has provided care in the past, and the daughter can provide the care. It would seem remarkably callous of the daughter to think to herself, “I have no obligation to provide the care my mother needs because, despite her care for me in the past, she no longer contributes to a reciprocal relationship.” Welch argues that filial obligations do not disappear simply because the parent is currently unable to provide special goods to the child. Thus, although the current state of the relationship would, on this interpretation of Keller’s reciprocity, determine the daughter’s filial obligations, it would do so counter-intuitively.

According to Welch, Keller’s claim that filial obligations arise “within the context of a reciprocal relationship” cannot limit filial obligations in the way Keller suggests. Either the parent-child relationship is reciprocal so long as it is now or was mutually beneficial, or it is reciprocal only when the mutual benefits are ongoing. In the former case, the relationship’s current state would determine filial obligations only insofar as it effects what the child can provide. Here, filial obligations are theoretically unlimited, regardless of the current state of the relationship. In the latter case, filial obligations diminish or disappear if the parent is no longer able to provide special goods to the child, even if this inability is not by choice. Here, filial obligations are unreasonably limited because children have obligations to their parents only so long as the children continue to benefit.

Welch considers a third interpretation of Keller’s reciprocity limitation on filial obligations. One could say that the parent-child relationship is reciprocal so long as:

  1. a) The parent has provided special goods in the past, and continues to do so, or;
  2. b) The parent has not provided special goods in the past, but does so now, or;
  3. c) The parent has provided special goods in the past but now cannot provide them because, through no fault of her own, she is unable to do so.

This attempt to rescue the “reciprocal relationship” limitation on filial obligations appears ad hoc. Why think the relationship is no longer reciprocal only because parents fail to “make a reasonable effort to play their part in the relationship”? If parents fail to play their part—though perhaps not by choice—the relationship is no longer reciprocal. Thus, although the reason the relationship is no longer reciprocal is relevant for determining what obligations a grown child has, the “reciprocal relationship” limitation within Special Goods Theory cannot explain why. According to Welch, what is missing from the theory is a clear account of what changes in a relationship effect what filial obligations a child has and why.

Thus, Welch concludes that Special Goods Theory ignores morally relevant considerations, such as what the parent deserves, when surely, it is relevant to determining what one owes one’s parent. Facts about the relationship’s current state form not only what one can do for one’s parent, but also what one’s parent deserves to have done on her behalf. A mother who suffers from dementia does not deserve less because it renders her unable to contribute to the relationship, whereas a father who has unreasonably disowned his son arguably deserves less as a result of his choice to exit the relationship.

6. Gratitude for Special Goods

a. The View

Brynn Welch introduced Gratitude for Special Goods Theory in 2012, arguing that one has obligations of gratitude to provide special goods to one’s parent so long as the following four conditions are satisfied:

  • The parent needs some special good.
  • The child can position herself to provide the good.
  • The parent has provided and/or currently provides special goods to the child.
  • Expressing gratitude by providing the special good the parent needs would not undermine the mutual respect on which moral relationships are based.

Welch argues that Debt Theory and Special Goods Theory do not respond to the right features of a case—namely, features about the parent-child relationship itself—and Gratitude Theory and Friendship Theory fail to provide sufficient guidance for discharging one’s filial obligations. Gratitude for Special Goods Theory, however, avoids both of these problems.

According to Welch, this theory is responsive to considerations of the parent’s needs, the child’s ability, and what the parent deserves. Furthermore, the theory specifies the action necessary to discharge one’s filial obligations: one ought to provide the special good that the parent needs. Relying heavily on Berger’s and Card’s considerations regarding gratitude, and Keller’s articulation of special goods, Welch offers a blended theory.

Yet, Welch modifies Keller’s condition that the child be able to meet the parent’s need. Consider a situation where a grown child’s career path does not provide the means necessary to pay for her parent’s long-term care. If, however, the child has career opportunities that would make her able to meet her parent’s needs, then she has an obligation to pursue those opportunities (provided all other conditions for filial obligations are satisfied). On Gratitude for Special Goods Theory, in order to avoid filial obligations, the children must be both unable to meet current needs and to position themselves to meet those needs without undermining the mutual respect necessary for moral relationships. This way of modifying Keller’s condition prohibits us from using a narrow understanding of ability.

Furthermore, Welch argues that her theory of filial obligations is superior to Special Goods Theory because it responds appropriately to considerations of what the parent deserves. On Keller’s view, the past provision of goods and the ongoing reciprocal relationship ground the child’s obligation, whereas on Welch’s view, gratitude for the past provision of goods grounds the obligation. The difference, Welch argues, is that gratitude requires that both parties respect one another and themselves, and the provision of special goods is an appropriate expression of that respect. Thus, if the parent has provided special goods in the past but either done so with the expectation of repayment or has at some point come to treat the child as merely a means to an end, the child has no obligations of gratitude since gratitude might undermine rather than support relationships of mutual respect. The child might experience gratitude, but that gratitude is not required and might even be inappropriate.

According to Welch, this theory has several advantages over its predecessors. First, it responds to relevant considerations, such as the parent’s need, the child’s ability, and the past and current state of the relationship. Second, it specifies what we ought to do for our parents. Third, it explains the changes in the parent-child relationship that would change a grown child’s obligations to his parents. Specifically, any changes that undermine mutual respect would diminish or eliminate filial obligations; any changes that restore mutual respect would generate or strengthen filial obligations. Finally, it responds to the demands of justice and offers a moral argument for gender equality in care provisions for ageing parents.

Where earlier theories are concerned with meeting parents’ needs, or that there is repayment as in the case of Debt Theory, Gratitude for Special Goods Theory is concerned with the moral relationships in which these “transactions” take place. Theories focusing only on the goods themselves cannot explain what is wrong with the striking gender imbalance in the provision of these goods. Gratitude for Special Goods Theory can do just that, according to Welch. She argues that a son who either shifts the responsibility of parental care to his sister or wife has already failed to discharge his filial obligations. It does not simply matter that the goods are provided but also who provides them. The son owes his parents gratitude for the past provision of special goods; his wife does not. Similarly, when parental care falls exclusively, or almost exclusively, on female siblings, this indicates that male siblings are failing to discharge obligations. Again, that the parents’ needs are being met does not relieve the male siblings of their obligations of gratitude. Thus, Welch argues this theory is preferable to the previous theories.

b. Criticism

As the theory is the newest in the field, it has not yet received written criticism. Yet, there are two paths such criticism would likely take. First, its second condition—that the child is able to position herself to provide the required good—ignores the likely state of epistemic uncertainty under which the child will have to make decisions. If one is to choose a career based on what one anticipates one’s parents will need, this seems to require that one have access to information about future events. Will my parents live long, healthy lives, or succumb to illness during my college career? Will I be able to rely on my siblings, my spouse, and possibly my siblings’ spouses for assistance? The answers to these questions, and many like them, will shape the content of one’s filial obligations. Yet, they are questions that one cannot possibly know the answer in advance. The condition requires only that one be able to position oneself to provide the required good. The ability to so position oneself, however, depends on facts about the good in question that are likely to be unknown at the time one makes decisions about what career to pursue, where to live, what sort of family structure to create, and so forth. Thus, Welch’s theory seems to imply that children must make choices that will accommodate the maximum range of possible parental needs. Yet, it is unclear what such a choice would be.

A related but different objection is that the theory generates obligations that are too stringent. A grown child could, for example, position herself to provide special goods to her parents by forgoing having children of her own, thus freeing up time and money for her parents that would otherwise be spent on children. Does this person have an obligation to forego having children? Although Welch argues, following Card and Berger, that one is not required to sacrifice one’s serious interests, questions remain about what constitutes a legitimate serious interest. Is an interest in world travel serious enough that one may choose travel over providing special goods to one’s parents? If the answer is yes, then Gratitude for Special Goods Theory may face problems similar to those facing Friendship Theory: the child can simply opt out of filial obligations by cultivating other serious interests. If the answer is no, then Gratitude for Special Goods Theorists seem to be left with only two options: explain the morally relevant difference between one’s interest in child-rearing and one’s interest in world travel, or accept that one’s serious interests do not override one’s filial obligations. If Gratitude for Special Goods Theorists select the first option, they are likely to find themselves constructing a perfectionist account of interests. If they select the second, they are likely to find themselves endorsing overly demanding and counter-intuitive obligations.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Berger, Fred. “Gratitude,” Ethics, Vol. 85, No. 4 (1975), pp. 298-309.
    • Berger offers considerations regarding the role of gratitude in moral relationships, as well as the foundation of a gratitude theory of filial obligation.
  • Blustein, Jeffrey. Parents and Children: The Ethics of the Family, New York: Oxford University Press (1982).
    • The text includes brief descriptions of the obligations parents and children have to one another and possible grounds of those obligations.
  • Brighouse, Harry and Swift, Adam. “Legitimate Parental Partiality,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 37, No. 1 (2009), pp. 43-80.
    • The article contains an argument for balancing parental partiality against a concern for fair equality of opportunity. It also discusses the special goods that a parent-child relationship makes possible.
  • Brody, Elaine. Women in the Middle: Their Parent Care Years, 2nd edition. New York: Springer (2004).
    • Brody’s sociological work contains both quantitative and qualitative data about women who care for elderly parents and young children concurrently
  • Card, Claudia. “Gratitude and Obligation,” American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 25, No. 2 (1988), pp. 115-127.
    • The article considers the role of gratitude in moral relationships with an emphasis on many problematic instances of gratitude.
  • Chappell, Neena L. and Penning, Margaret J. “Family Caregivers: Increasing Demands in the Context of 21st Century Globalization?” in Cambridge Handbook for Age and Ageing, Malcolm L. Johnson, ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2005), pp. 455-462.
    • This chapter discusses effects of policy changes, economics, and health for caregivers.
  • Daniels, Norman. Am I My Parents’ Keeper? An Essay on Justice Between the Young and the Old, New York: Oxford University Press (1988).
    • The text presents Daniels’ historical and philosophical reflection on intergenerational justice with respect to health care.
  • Dixon, Nicholas. “The Friendship Model of Filial Obligations,” Journal of Applied Philosophy, Vol. 12, No. 1 (1995), pp. 77-87.
    • This article includes a defense of Friendship Theory of filial obligations against initial objections.
  • English, Jane. “What Do Grown Children Owe Their Parents?” in Having Children: Philosophical and Legal Reflections on Parenthood, Onora O’Neill and William Ruddick, eds. New York: Oxford University Press (1979), pp. 351-356.
    • The chapter presents the Friendship Theory of filial obligation.
  • Fitzgerald, Patrick. “Gratitude and Justice,” Ethics, Vol. 109, No. 1 (1998), pp. 119-153.
    • This article discusses how obligations of gratitude extend to politics.
  • Hardwig, John. “Is There A Duty to Die?” from Hastings Center Report 27, No. 2 (1997), reprinted in Ethical Issues in Modern Medicine: Contemporary Readings in Bioethics, 7th edition. Bonnie Steinbock, John D. Arras, and Alex John London, eds. New York: McGraw-Hill (2009), pp. 511-520.
    • This article argues that older individuals, namely those who will experience financial and emotional hardship from continued care, might have a societal obligation to die.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. “Filial Piety as a Virtue,” in Working Virtue: Virtue Ethics and Contemporary Moral Problems, Rebecca L. Walker and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds. Oxford: Clarendon Press (2007), pp. 297-312.
    • Here, Ivanhoe articulates piety as the appropriate attitude to have toward one’s parents.
  • Jecker, Nancy S. “Are Filial Duties Unfounded?” American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 26, No. 1 (1989), pp. 73-80.
    • In this article, Jecker discusses whether filial obligations can arise at all.
  • Jecker, Nancy S. “Taking Care of One’s Own: Justice and Family Caregiving,” Theoretical Medicine, Vol. 23 (2002), pp. 117-133.
    • Here, Jecker discusses justice, gender, and filial obligations.
  • Keller, Simon. “Four Theories of Filial Duty,” The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 56, No. 223 (2006), pp. 254-274.
    • This article introduces and articulates the Special Goods Theory of filial obligations.
  • Keller, Simon. The Limits of Loyalty, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2007).
    • Here, Keller discusses appropriate versus inappropriate loyalty. Also, theories of filial obligation are discussed at length.
  • Kupfer, Joseph. “Can Parents and Children Be Friends?” American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 27, No. 1 (1990), pp. 15-26.
    • Kupfer criticizes Jane English’s Friendship Theory, emphasizing the inequality of autonomy within the parent-child relationship and the lack of sufficient distance between the parent and child.
  • Narveson, Jan. “On Honoring our Parents,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 25, No. 1 (1987), pp. 65-78.
    • Here, Narveson argues that we ought to care for our parents because we want to make it rational for others to have and rear children.
  • Okin, Susan Moller. Justice, Gender, and the Family, United States: Basic Books (1989).
    • Okin discusses the causes and effects of gender inequality.
  • Sommers, Christina Hoff. “Filial Morality,” The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 83, No. 8 (1986), pp. 439-456.
    • This article argues that we ought to provide care for our parents because failure to do so violates the parent’s legitimate expectations.
  • Welch, Brynn. “A Theory of Filial Obligation,” Social Theory and Practice, Vol. 38, No. 4 (2012), pp. 717-737.
    • Welch discusses Gratitude and Special Goods Theory, and articulates and defends Gratitude for Special Goods Theory.

 

Author Information

Brynn F. Welch
Email: bwelch@ehc.edu
Emory & Henry College
U. S. A.