The French philosopher and historian Michel Foucault (1926-1984) does not understand ethics as moral philosophy, the metaphysical and epistemological investigation of ethical concepts (metaethics) and the investigation of the criteria for evaluating actions (normative ethics), as Anglo-American philosophers do. Instead, he defines ethics as a relation of self to itself in terms of its moral agency. More specifically, ethics denotes the intentional work of an individual on itself in order to subject itself to a set of moral recommendations for conduct and, as a result of this self-forming activity or “subjectivation,” constitute its own moral being.
The classical works of Foucault’s ethics are his historical studies of ancient sexual ethics in The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self, in addition to the late interviews “On the Genealogy of Ethics” and “The Ethics for the Concern of Self as a Practice of Freedom.” The publication of his final three lecture courses at the Collège de France in 1982-3 considerably enhance how those texts are to be understood and provide original resources. The Hermeneutics of the Subject provides greater insight into the ancient ethics of caring for self and how Foucault perceives it in relation to the history of philosophy. Both The Government of Self and Others and The Courage of Truth – his final courses, respectively – make it manifest that he considered the ancient ethical practice of parrhesia or frank-speech central to ancient ethics and, indeed, important to his own philosophical practice.
The significance of this so-called ‘ethical turn’ for Foucault’s philosophy is displayed in the controversial terms through which he ultimately expressed the purpose of his work. He lays claim to the spirit of the tradition of critical philosophy established by Immanuel Kant, and Foucault purports to exemplify this spirit by disclosing, or telling the truth about, the historical conditions of the contingent constraints that we impose on ourselves and, in doing so, opening possibilities for autonomous ethical relations. Foucault’s claim to the spirit of critical philosophy has received, and continues to receive, criticism and considerable discussion in the scholarly literature. Of central concern are the compatibility of his claim to critical philosophy as an ethical practice and his broader views about subjectivity, and whether his critical analysis of modern ethics is meant to be merely descriptive or also evaluative.
The primary focus of this article is the nature of ethics as Foucault conceives it, and it is unpacked by discussion of his published historical studies of ancient Greek and Roman ethics. The article then considers his treatment of the ancient ethical injunction of the care of the self and parrhesia, transitioning into a presentation of, and opinions about, his alleged ethical turn and the contentious role that ethics might play in his critical philosophy.
As important as ethics becomes in Foucault’s later thought, prior to 1981 he rarely touches on themes directly related to either ethics or morality. One rare, short, but not unimportant analysis occurs in The Order of Things. There, Foucault maintains that modern ethical thought attempts to derive moral obligations from human nature and yet modern thought also holds that human nature can never be, given the fact of human finitude, fully given to human knowledge. Consequently, modern thought is incapable of coherently formulating a set of moral obligations (OT 326-7; see also PPC 49). This argument is, essentially, one piece of his larger attack on modern humanism and its conception of the human being as subject, a being that supplies for itself the foundations of knowledge, value, and freedom. Discipline and Punish and the first volume of The History of Sexuality further this line of criticism, insisting on the historical constitution of the subject by discursive practices and techniques of power (see, for example, FL 67, PK 117, EW3 3-4, DP 30). In short, his writings through the 1970’s comprise a multifaceted attack on the modern notion of self-constitution.
It is surprising to many commentators, then, that by 1982 Foucault elaborated a framework for his work that grants self-constitution considerable importance. He explains his “history of thought” as a history of “focal points of experience,” the persistently occurring ways in which humans conceive and perceive themselves – as mad, diseased, sexual, and so forth. These focal points are studied along three axes: the axis of knowledge, or the rules of discursive practices that determine what counts as true or false; the axis of power, or the rationalities and techniques by which one governs the conduct of others; and the axis of ethics, or the practices of self through which an individual constitutes itself as a subject (GSO 1-5). Richard Bernstein aptly characterizes the scholarly reaction to Foucault’s introduction of ethics when the former states the ethical thematic seems to presume the concept of a self-constituting subject that latter’s earlier work sought to criticize (Bernstein 1994; see also Milchman and Rosenberg 2007).
Foucault never did articulate a clear position on the conceptual fit between his critique of the modern subject and his account of ethics. Nevertheless, he does provide some clues as to the nature of his mature position. Late in his life he admits that his earlier work was too insistent on the formation of subjectivity by discursive practices and power-relations (EW1 177, 225). Now, his focus is on the subject as both constituted and self-constituting, or the point at which discursive practices and power-relations dovetail with ethics. Of course, this does not decisively resolve the problem, but it does suggest a rereading of his earlier works more conducive to the notion of self-constitution. In fact, in later writings and interviews Foucault supports this interpretation when he explains that all the axes of analysis existed in a confused manner (EW1 262); he even retrospectively interprets his work as fitting one or more of those axes (EW1 202-5). By admitting that, first, all three axes of analysis existed in earlier works, and, second, that the goal of his work is to study the connection of knowledge and power with ethics, Foucault suggests that there is no ethical turn. Of course, this does not license the commentator to avoid the potentially problematic conceptual fit between Foucault’s mature conception of subjectivity and his earlier critique of the self-constituting subject. However, it does appear to be the case that Foucault is suggesting that he is best read backwards rather than forwards.
Whatever the case may be, Foucault’s introduction of ethics added an undeniable richness to his thought that also transformed how his earlier work is to be interpreted.
The most elaborate discussion of ethics that Foucault provides appears in Section Three of the Introduction to The Use of Pleasure. There, he designates ethics as one of the three primary areas of morality. In addition to ethics, morality consists of both a moral code and the concrete acts of moral agents. The former consists of the more or less explicitly formulated values and rules recommended to individuals by the “prescriptive agencies” (for example, family, church, work, and so forth) in which they participate. The latter refers to the actions of historically real persons insofar as those actions comply or fail to comply with, obey or resist, or respect or disrespect the values and rules prescribed to them by prescriptive agencies.
In addition to a moral code and the real behaviors of individuals, Foucault claims that morality also consists of a third area, namely, ethics. He commonly and pithily defines it as a relation of the subject to itself, but a more technical definition of ethics is the conduct required of an individual so as to render its own actions consistent with a moral code and standards of moral approval. For Foucault, conduct is a category that is broader than moral agency and includes both non-moral actions and the exercising of non-agential capacities (for example, attitudes, demeanor, and so forth). Ethical conduct, then, consists of the actions performed and capacities exercised intentionally by a subject for the purpose of engaging in morally approved conduct. Suppose, for example, that an individual adopts the prescription of sexual fidelity to her partner. In this case, ethics concerns not her morally satisfactory conduct that directly satisfies her duty of being faithful to her partner, but rather the conduct through which she enables or brings herself to behave in a way that is sexually faithful to her partner.
Consistent with his distinction between moral conduct and ethical conduct, Foucault also distinguishes between moral obligations and ethical obligations. A moral obligation is an imperative of a moral code that either requires or forbids a specific kind of conduct, whereas an ethical obligation is a prescription for conduct that is a necessary condition for producing morally approved conduct. Foucault understands morally approved conduct to be a wide category, as it does not designate just those acts that comply with a moral code – which is, he thinks, a manifestly modern conception of moral approval. As he is keen to show in his volumes on ancient sexuality, rigorously stylizing one’s daily existence according to self-imposed standards of conduct was at one time the measure of moral approval, and such approval was not limited to conformity to a moral code. In this regard, the moral valorization of conduct might be, as it was with the ancients, weighted toward the satisfaction of ethical obligations, or, as it is in modernity, weighted toward the satisfaction of the moral obligations that comprise a moral code.
On Foucault’s account, ethical relations are constituted by four formal elements, the contents of which are subject to historical variation: the ontological element or “ethical substance,” the deontological element or “mode of subjection,” the ascetic element or “ethical work,” and the teleological element or “telos.” His project in The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self is to articulate the sexual ethics in ancient Greece and Rome, respectively, by describing these elements and uncovering the primary ethical obligations for sexual conduct for both epochs. These ethical obligations are, Foucault contends, deducible by analyzing the four primary themes of sexual austerity expressed throughout all of Western history: the relation one has to one’s own body and health, wives and marriage, boys, and truth. Although these themes are occasionally mentioned below, the the focus of this section is on the four elements of ethical relations.
The ethical substance is the material or aspect of self that is morally problematic, taken as the object of one’s ethical reflection, and transformed in one’s ethical work. In The Use of Pleasure Foucault maintains that the ethical substance of ancient Greek sexual ethics – an ethics that was exclusively for men of the right inherited social status – was the aphrodisia or the broad range of acts, gestures, and contacts associated with pleasures to promote the propagation of the species and considered the inferior pleasures given their commonality with all animals. The intensity of the aphrodisia induced the majority of men to behave immoderately with regard to it, and since the moral telos of ancient Greek ethics was a moderate state in which a man had succeeded in mastering his pleasures, the immoderate man was considered by ethicists to be shameful and dishonorable for allowing the inferior part of his soul to enslave his superior part. It was also considered shameful for a man to experiment or delight in pleasures derived from the passive and subordinate rather than active and dominant role in sexual relations, the latter assigned by nature to men and the former assigned to those incapable of mastering themselves of their own power, namely, women and children. By violating these limits out of a failure to master himself, the Greek man put himself in the position of compromising his health, household, social standing, and political ambitions.
Foucault maintains in The Care of the Self that aphrodisia remains the ethical substance for Roman sexual ethics. But unlike the Greek ethicists before them, Roman ethicists conceived the aphrodisia as essentially and intrinsically dangerous rather than dangerous merely because of the fact that their intensity induces immoderate conduct. According to Foucault, Roman ethicists stipulated that although sexual acts are good by nature, since nature is perfect in its designs, those acts are nevertheless fraught with a dangerous and essential passivity that causes involuntary movements of the body and soul and expenditure of the life forces. Nature has, as it were, designed sex as good and beneficial but only on the condition that it conforms to its designs. Thus, although sexual acts themselves were not considered intrinsically bad, when one performed a sexual act without adequate attention to both its dangers and nature’s limits for it one risked exposing both body and soul to illnesses; indeed, acting without consideration for these dangers was a sign that the soul had already been corrupted. Foucault therefore asserts that the perception of the dangerous physical and spiritual effects of unrestrained sexual activity led to a moral and medical discourse about sex different in kind than that of ancient Greek ethical discourse. It focused more on moderated use as a means of achieving physical and spiritual health rather than excellence.
The mode of subjection is the way in which the individual establishes its relation to the moral code, recognizes itself as bound to act according to it, and is entitled to view its acts as worthy of moral valorization. The mode of subjection is, as Foucault refers to it, the ‘deontological’ or normative component of ethics. For example, consider the obligation to help someone in need. The Kantian holds that pure practical reason vis-à-vis the categorial imperative rationally requires the charitable act and it is praiseworthy to the extent that it is performed out of respect for reason. The practitioner of Islam, on the other hand, holds that the charitable act is morally valorized to the extent that it is produced out of respect for God’s will as revealed in sacred texts.
The mode of subjection for the ancient Greeks was a man’s free, permanent, and noble choice to fashion his life into a beautiful work according to a program of self-mastery. The notion of use (of pleasures) was what ancient Greeks used as a standard for measuring the beauty of a man’s work with regard to his sexual conduct. The use of pleasures refers to how a man managed or integrated pleasures into his life such that their use did not compromise but benefitted his health and social standing. Appropriate management submitted the use of pleasures to three strategies. The strategy of need demanded that desires for pleasures should arise from nature alone and be fulfilled neither extravagantly nor as a result of artifice. The strategy of timeliness required the distribution of pleasures at the right times of the day, year, and life so as to maintain the well-being of oneself, one’s wife, and potential offspring. The strategy of status demanded that a man use his pleasures consistent with his inherited status, purposes, and responsibilities.
Foucault maintains that ancient Greek sexual ethics was stricter than their moral code, as a man suffered little moral condemnation for his choice of sexual relations, provided he was neither passive nor partnered with someone under another man’s authority. But submitting oneself to this mode of subjection meant imposing ethical requirements on oneself that were not included in the moral code. In fact, submitting oneself to this rigorous sexual ethics was seen as a noble and fine choice precisely because it was not morally required.
The mode of subjection for ancient Roman sexual ethics is also an aesthetics of existence, but Foucault is also clear that it is more austere than the Greek ethics that preceded it. What this means is that Roman ethical obligations became stricter despite a loose moral code regarding sex. The increased austerity of this ethics is due in part to the perception of an intrinsic passivity of sexual acts, and also because the means of responding to this passivity required greater attention to the rationality of nature (which is not be understood according to the distinction between what is normal and abnormal). Roman ethicists conceived that the pleasures of sex were derived by involuntary and dangerous movements of the body and soul, and that seeking pleasure as the end of an act only furthered the possibility of corrupting both body and soul. Since for Roman ethicists nothing in nature seeks sexual pleasure as an end but only as a means to other natural goods (for example, procreation, health, spiritual well-being), they maintained that the pursuit of the aphrodisia as an end in itself could arise only from the distortion of the soul’s desires for pleasure. Consequently, the criterion by which Roman ethicists evaluated sexual conduct was whether it was born of desire conformed to the wisdom of nature. So, where the mode of subjection of ancient Greek sexual ethics was the use of pleasures, where proper use is exemplified as the strategic integration of the pleasures into one’s life, Roman ethicists understood that nature put universal features into the aphrodisia that were also the key to discovering the prescriptions for their use.
The ethical work consists of the self-forming activities meant to ensure one’s own subjection to a moral authority and transform oneself into an autonomous ethical agent. Foucault refers to these self-forming activities as practices or technologies of the self, and also in the ancient sense of askēsis, or ascetic practices. These practices are not to be conflated with an asceticism that strives for the goal of freeing oneself from all desires for physical pleasures. To be sure, all ascetic practices are, Foucault thinks, organized around principles of self-restraint, self-discipline, and self-denial. But not all ascetic practices aim at eliminating all of one’s desires for physical pleasures.
Foucault maintains that the ethical work to be performed in ancient sexual ethics is that of self-mastery. For the ancient Greeks, mastering oneself is an agonistic battle with oneself, where victory is achieved through careful use of the pleasures according to need, timeliness, and social status. Greek ethicists understood that this battle required regular training in addition to the knowledge of the things to which one ought to be attracted. The sort of training a man undertook was aimed at self-mastery through practices of self-denial and abstention, which taught him to satisfy natural needs at the right time consistent with his social status. The moral end of such practices was not to cultivate the attitude that abstention is a moral ideal, but rather to train him to become temperate and self-controlled. As such, successful self-mastery was exhibited by the man who did not suppress his desires, but authoritatively controlled them in a way that contributed to his excellence and the beauty of his life. Foucault suggests that this ideal is exemplified in the literature about the love of boys, which heroized the man who could express and maintain friendly love for a boy while at the same restraining his co-present erotic love
Foucault is clear in The Care of the Self that the ethical work in ancient Roman ethics is also self-mastery, and that the ethicists reconceived the nature of this kind of ethical work. Instead of an agonistic relationship in which a man struggles to subdue and enslave his desires for pleasures (rather than be subdued and enslaved by them) through their proper use, the work of self-mastery for Roman ethics was forcing the desires for pleasures into proper alignment with the designs of nature. While the same is true for ancient Greek ethics, the Roman ethicists emphasized it to such a degree that social status and, to an extent, sexual anatomy were abolished as being relevant factors in determining one’s ethical duties. What becomes essential for this ethics is grasping that all pleasures that are not internal to oneself originate in desires that might not be capable of satisfaction, and whenever one chooses to engage such desires one subjects oneself to physical and spiritual risk. In all things regarding the aphrodisia, then, careful attention must be paid to deciphering and testing which of one’s desires originate in nature, or maintain a consistency with nature, and which transgress the limits set by nature.
The intensification of the austerity of sexual ethics this change in self-mastery produced is emphasized in marital ethics. Greek men were not morally required to maintain sexual relations with only their wives, but a man’s sexual conduct was especially excellent when he restrained his sexual activity to his wife. For the Roman ethicists, however, a man failed to master himself if he pursued sexual relations with anyone other than his wife, for nature designed the man and woman to contribute to each other’s physical and spiritual well-being through their sexual activity together. Their joint spiritual well-being was considered integral to the harmony of the human community.
The telos of an ethics is the ideal mode or state of being toward which one strives or aspires in their ethical work. For the ancient Greeks the activity of self-mastery aimed at a state of moderation that was characterized as freedom in its fullest form, and it was understood as a man’s enslavement of his desires for pleasures to himself. A man’s domination of his desires was expressed in domestic and political metaphors: he must exhibit the constrained strategizing necessary for maintaining an orderly and stable rule over both his household or subordinates. The man who controlled his use of pleasures made himself personally prosperous – physically excellent and socially estimable – in the same way that a household or nation prospers as the result of the careful and skilled governance of a manager or ruler, and a man was not expected to be successful in managing his household or exercising political authority and influence without first achieving victory over his pleasures. The man who failed to master his pleasures and yet found himself in a position of authority over others was a candidate for tyranny, while the man who mastered his pleasures was considered the best candidate to govern.
Roman ethicists conceived the activity of self-mastery as aiming at a conversion of the self to itself, which they conceived as freedom in fullest form. Through the ethical work of self-mastery an individual conformed their desires to the rationality of nature, which resulted in a detachment from anything not given by nature as an appropriate object of desire. Roman ethicists did not understand the telos of self-mastery as the authority over pleasures that manifested itself in their strategic use, but rather it manifested itself as a disinterestedness and detachment from the pleasures such that one finds a non-physical, spiritual pleasure in belonging to the true self nature intends. Nature does not recommend the mere pursuit of pleasures; it recommends the pursuit of pleasures insofar as those acts are consistent with other ends that it wants met. Hence, the end of self-mastery is achieving a perfect consistency between one’s own desires and those that nature uses to promote its ends. For this reason the freedom achieved through self-mastery is an autonomy with regard to that which is within one’s control, namely, conforming oneself to nature.
A major theme that emerges in Foucault’s final volumes of The History of Sexuality and his lectures at the Collège de France is the ethical obligation to care for oneself. Foucault certainly claims in both those volumes that the care of self is foundational to ancient ethics (UP 73, 108, 211; CS 45-54), but curiously, and despite his titling of the third volume The Care of the Self, he does not provide significant discussion of the care of self in its generality. Yet his final three lecture courses at the Collège de France attest to the fact that not only did he have a definite view about the care of the self, it is central to the history of philosophy and critical philosophy that he articulated at the end of his life. This history emphasizes the integral relation between the care of self and the concern for truth, notably on display in the practice of parrhesia (frank-speech), as its central mode of expression.
The ancient notion of caring for oneself acquires prominence for Foucault in the first lecture of his 1981-2 course lecture at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject. For the ancients, Foucault claims, the care of the self was the foundational principle of all moral rationality. Today, however, caring for oneself is without moral content. By explaining the ancient conception of the care of the self and its connection to the Delphic prescription to know oneself, famously observed by Socrates, Foucault wishes to diagnose the exclusion of the care of the self by modern thought and consider whether, given his diagnosis, the care of the self might remain viable in modern ethics.
The exclusion of the care of the self is the result of a reconception of two ancient injunctions: care for oneself and know oneself. These two injunctions were originally expressed by Socrates – the exemplar par excellence, Foucault thinks, of the person who cares for himself – with the care of the self serving as the justification for the prescription to know oneself. According to Foucault, Socrates and ancient ethicists understood that caring for oneself was to exhibit an attitude not only toward oneself but also toward others and the world, attend to one’s own thoughts and attitudes in self-reflection and meditation, and engage in ascetic practices aimed at realizing an ideal state of being. The prescription to know oneself was the means through which one cared for oneself, and Socrates cared for his own soul and the souls of others by using the practice of dialectic to force the examination of the truth of his own thought and conduct and that of his interlocutors. The salient point for Foucault is that Socrates did not practice philosophy merely as a means of arriving at true propositions. Instead, his program was to use philosophy as a tool for examining and testing the consistency of the rational discourse he and his interlocutors employed to justify their lives and conduct. Foucault sees this as a philosophical activity that is fundamentally oriented to the care of the self, for truth is pursued in philosophy for its own good and the sake of ethical development. Philosophy is by Socrates’ lights a practice essential to one’s ethical development, for it is a spiritual commitment to the truth that requires self-disciplined attention to the character of one’s thinking.
Foucault therefore distinguishes between philosophy simpliciter and philosophy as a spiritual activity. Philosophy considers what enables, conditions, and limits the subject’s access to the truth. But philosophy as a spiritual activity – or philosophy undertaken according to the injunction to care for oneself – is philosophy conceived as ethical work that must be performed in order for an individual to gain access to the truth. This is not to say, of course, that philosophy as a spiritual activity does not seek to acquire knowledge of things as they are. Rather, it is to say that such knowledge requires right conduct in addition to the justification of a true belief.
The injunction to know oneself was therefore a demand to attend to one’s relationship to the truth as a function of caring for oneself. A decisive change occurs, however, with the “Cartesian moment” (HS 14). The kind of self-knowledge that René Descartes seeks in his Meditations on First Philosophy and Rules for the Direction of the Mind is self-evidence or that which would decisively determine the truth or falsity of a proposition through its apparent clarity and distinctness. Now, knowing oneself becomes merely a necessary epistemic, and not moral, condition for gaining access to the truth. (The Cartesian moment takes further hold, Foucault explains, in the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, who argues in his Critique of Pure Reason that features of the subject’s own thinking must be constitutive of the very possibility of knowledge.) Consequently, attending to oneself becomes judging the truth of a proposition, and self-knowledge is not a directive for spiritual and ethical development. In modernity philosophy is, for the most part (compare HS 28, where Foucault adds some qualification), not the activity of ethical transformation that aims at the existence transformed by truth.
The modern shift in the construal of self-knowledge as self-evidence required changes in moral rationality. Modern thought construes moral self-examination as the act of determining whether one’s intentions or acts are consistent with moral obligations. One’s moral existence is therefore reduced to whether or not one satisfies one’s moral obligations, which had the consequence that the care of the self is perceived as either amoral egoism (because it is unconcerned with the foundations of moral obligation) or melancholic withdrawal (because one cannot know one’s moral obligations). But this is predicated upon a fundamental misconception of the care of the self. The care of the self is the ethical transformation of the self in light of the truth, which is to say the transformation of the self into a truthful existence.
In the final two years of his life, Foucault began to focus his attention on a particular ancient practice of caring for the self, namely, parrhesia (alternatively, parresia) or frank-speech. Parrhesia is the courageous act of telling the truth without either embellishment or concealment for the purpose of criticizing oneself or another. This practice and its history are the objects of his final two lecture courses at the College de France, The Government of Self and Others and The Courage of Truth, in addition to a series of lectures, “Discourse and Truth” (compiled as Fearless Speech), given at the University of California, Berkeley in the fall of 1983. The chief object of concern is parrhesia as a practice of self that is centered on the relation of the subject to truth, and how through engaging in parrhesia one freely constitutes one’s subjectivity.
Foucault stipulates that there are five features of the parrhesiastic act. First, the speaker must express his own opinion directly; that is, he must express his opinion without (or by minimizing) rhetorical flourish and make it plain that it is his opinion. Second, parrhesia requires that the speaker knows that he speaks the truth and that he speaks the truth because he knows what he says is in fact true. His expressed opinion is verified by his sincerity and courage, which points to the third feature, namely, danger: it is only when someone risks some kind of personal harm that his speech constitutes parrhesia. Fourth, the function of parrhesia is not merely to state the truth, but to state it as an act of criticizing oneself (for example, an admission) or another. Finally, the parrhesiastes speaks the truth as a duty to himself and others, which means he is free to keep silent but respects the truth by imposing upon himself the requirement to speak it as an act of freedom (FS 11-20; see also GSO 66-7).
It is in Socrates, Foucault says, that the care of the self first manifests itself as parrhesia. (But not only Socrates; Foucault considers parrhesiastic practices throughout the ancient Greek and Roman epochs.) The essence of Socratic parrhesia is located in his focus on the harmony between the way one lives (Greek: bios) and the rational discourse or account (Greek: logos) one might or might not possess that would justify the way one lives. Socrates himself lived in a way that was in perfect conformity with his statements about how one ought to live, and those statements themselves were supported by a rigorous rational discourse defending their truth. Because Socrates bound himself in his conduct to his own philosophically explored standards, his interlocutors understood him to be truly free. Socrates’ harmony is the condition of his use of parrhesia in identifying and criticizing the lack of harmony in his interlocutors, with the aim of leading them to a life in which they will bind themselves in their own conduct to only those principles that they can put into a rational discourse. Socratic parrhesia therefore manifests the care of the self because its intent is ethical, for it urges the interlocutor to pursue knowledge of what is true and conform their conduct to the truth as ethical work.
Ethics and critique emerged nearly simultaneously as objects of Foucault’s interest (1981 and 1978, respectively). Whether or not that was accidental is an interesting area of scholarship. But Foucault explicitly links them together in the much discussed essay, “What is Enlightenment?”, explaining that his project is critical philosophy precisely because it contributes to our abilities to autonomously fashion and constitute ourselves. Thus, around Kant, Foucault combines critical philosophy and ethics, and that connection provides greater insight into just how Foucault conceives of ethics and the history of ethics in relation to his own project. But his self-alignment with the tradition of critical philosophy has become the most contentious issue in the scholarship. The criticisms are diverse, but all offer some version of the thesis that Foucault either rejects or lacks the normative criteria required for critique.
Late in his life Foucault often claimed to be a descendant of the tradition of critical philosophy established by Kant. However, it is evident that Foucault always maintained an interest in Kant’s philosophy, which is verified by his secondary thesis for his philosophy doctorate, a close reading of and commentary on Kant’s Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (see Foucault 2008). Additionally, Foucault casually aligns himself rather broadly with critical philosophy in two other works from the 1960’s, The Birth of the Clinic (1963) and The Order of Things (1966) (BC xix; OT 342). The received view of this period of his work, especially the secondary thesis and The Order of Things, is that it provides decisive evidence of his rejection of Kant’s attempt to place all rational conditions and constraints in the subject (for example, see Habermas 1986, Schmidt and Wartenburg 1994, Han 2002, Allen 2003). Although Kant disappears from Foucault’s work as an object of explicit discussion, there is some indirect evidence found throughout his explicitly ethical writings that strongly suggests that the self-constituting subject is his target (see again PK 117, EW3 3-4, DP 30).
Kant reappears in Foucault’s thought in the 1978 address “What is Critique?” and he remains an object of attention until Foucault’s death in 1984. In the later work Kant is no longer discussed seemingly negatively as the philosopher that grounds thought, action, and freedom in the subject’s self-legislated laws of reason, but rather the philosopher who in his 1784 essay “What is Enlightenment?” takes aim at the ways in which human beings arbitrarily constrain themselves in their present actuality. Foucault departs from the Kantian critical project insofar as he does not seek to provide an “analytics of truth,” which would guarantee autonomous thinking and acting in universal and necessary principles (see, for example, “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking,” 8:145, and Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, 4:431). Instead, he controversially claims to promote autonomy by engaging in a critical-historical ontology of the present, the purpose of which is to disclose the singular and arbitrary constraints that we impose upon ourselves so that we might, should we possess the courage, constitute ourselves differently. Or, as Foucault puts it, the goal is to determine “what is not or is no longer indispensable for the constitution of ourselves as autonomous subjects” (EW1 313). (For more locations where Foucault aligns himself with the tradition of critical philosophy see FS 169-173, GSO 1-39, PT 41-82, EW2 459).
The scholarship agrees that there is a prima facie incompatibility in Foucault’s treatment of Kant, but there is disagreement about whether it is more substantial. Jürgen Habermas (1986) maintains that Foucault’s alleged critique of the Kantian self-constituting subject cannot be squared with the conception of the self-constituting subject that emerges in his ethical writings. Allen (2003) disputes this view, maintaining that Foucault never rejects the notion of self-constitution, but rather rejects the uniquely modern conception of self-constitution as it appears in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy. A possible alternative is presented by Norris (1994), who claims that Foucault simply does not have a consistent position on the Kantian philosophy, but that need not necessarily diminish our appreciation of his later work. (It is relevant to this discussion that Foucault himself says he is not above changing his mind. See AK 17, where Foucault famously responds to critics about his perceived shiftiness by asserting his right to change his mind, which is echoed later in his life at UP 8-9. See also EW1 177, 225, and FL 465, where admits to changing his views about power and other concepts.)
The recent publication of Foucault’s lecture courses on parrhesia provide further material for his connection to the critical tradition. In his conclusion to his lectures at Berkeley on parrhesia Foucault very clearly connects parrhesia to the Kantian tradition of critical philosophy. He invokes again the distinction between two traditions of philosophy: the analytics of truth and the critical tradition. Instead of explaining the former as being merely Cartesian and Kantian, he explains it as a concern with the correct processes of reasoning in determining whether a statement is true (thus, Descartes and Kant exemplify a certain kind of analytics of truth, namely, that which grounds truth in the subject). On the other side is the critical tradition that is concerned with why it is important to tell the truth and who is entitled to speak it. He then goes on to say that the seminar on parrhesia is a part of his “genealogy of the critical attitude in Western philosophy” (FS 170), thus aligning parrhesia with Kantian critical philosophy. In doing so Foucault establishes that his critical philosophy is a practice of parrhesia in a similar manner to the Kantian practice of parrhesia. In “What is Enlightenment?” Kant engages in parrhesia when he encourages his contemporaries to use their own reason, consistent with universal law, of course, and refuse to merely rely on the authority of others, including the authority of the monarchy and state, as a guide to their use of reason (however, one must privately obey institutional authorities while publicly expressing one’s disagreement with them). Foucault understands his own critical activity as a form of parrhesia in a sense similar to that which Kant exemplifies in the essay on enlightenment. Disclosing the historicity and arbitrariness of the previously unquestioned constraints that we impose on ourselves is, Foucault thinks, a parrhesiastic act. Determining their precise relations is at the heart of interpreting the nature and scope of Foucault’s critical project. For more, see Flynn 1987, O’Leary 2002, McGushin 2007, and the ensuing subsection.
Ethics, Foucault says, is the form that freedom takes when it is informed by reflection, and by this he means that freedom consists in reflectively informed ascetic practices or practices of self. These informed practices are imbued with an attitude, ethos, or relationship to one’s ethical substance that Foucault understands as the activity of freedom (EW1 284). One reason that he focused on ethical work, then, is to discover how human beings freely make themselves into moral subjects of their own conduct through techniques or practices of self-restraint and self-discipline.
In The Government of Self and Others Foucault construes parrhesia as free practice of self par excellence. “Parrēsia,” Foucault says, “is the free courage by which one binds oneself in the act of telling the truth. Or again, parrhesia is the ethics of truth-telling as an action which is risky and free” (GSO 66). The language that Foucault uses to describe parrhesiastic freedom throughout this lecture hour is incredibly suggestive of its source: it is the language of Kantian self-legislation. For Kant, autonomy does not consist in giving oneself the moral law, since the moral law is a necessity of the rational will; rather, autonomy consists in binding oneself to the law by freely conforming one’s conduct to it (see, for example, Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals 4:31). This connection suggests that Foucault understands parrhesia as the supreme act of self-legislation and autonomy, where truth rather than moral law plays the normative role – a point already suggested in Foucault’s claims about the original meaning of the care of the self. That is to say, it seems that the truth is for Foucault a moral value or a good one ought to pursue. Parrhesia is the supreme act of self-legislation because the risk and danger involved in the act tests one’s self-discipline and courage in their commitment to the truth.
This casts more light on Foucault’s representation of his project as critical. Because autonomy is conceived as binding oneself to the truth, truth becomes the practical goal of Foucaultian critique. This would entail that one is to pursue the truth in both its propositional and non-propositional (or existential forms) as the highest practice of self.
The chief objection to Foucault’s self-alignment with the critical tradition is not focused on his reading of Kant, but whether he has the philosophical resources to support a properly critical philosophy. When Kant engages in parrhesia by exhorting his peers to use their own reason he is not issuing merely an exhortation, but, per his moral philosophy, he is telling them that their own practical reason obligates the use of reason consistent with universal law. In this regard, Kant’s parrhesia flows from, and his use of critique is grounded in, his analytics of truth. But Foucault intentionally steers clear of that project, which raises questions about the legitimacy and force of his critical philosophy. Now, while criticisms of Foucault’s philosophy are diverse (see especially Taylor 1986, Habermas 1986, Bernstein 1994, and Fraser 1994), a common complaint is that he owes his readers some explanation for why one ought to accept his evaluations of modern ethics.
But it is not at all obvious that Foucaultian critical philosophy is – despite the use of the term ‘critique’ – in the business of evaluation. It is true, as Bernstein (1994) points out, that Foucault very often uses a value-laden rhetoric. However, it is also true that his project is critical in the peculiar sense of the unmasking of some previously concealed practice or aspect of some practice as an activity of frank-speech. His rhetoric is therefore charged not because he has some hidden normative criteria already in hand (as Habermas 1990 alleges), but because, for example, certain individuals operate in a practice (say, penitential practices) under false opinions about its supposed noble goals (for example, defending society). To this end Foucault need only unmask the tensions and inconsistencies in a practice through his historical labors to make his project critical.
While such a maneuver is consistent with a purely descriptive interpretation of Foucault’s critical philosophy, there is a palpable sense in which he goes beyond mere unmasking to recommendation. For example, in an interview from 1984, “An Aesthetics of Existence,” Foucault states that moral approval (or mode of subjection) conceived merely as obedience to a moral code is not only disappearing but has disappeared, and “to this absence of morality corresponds, must correspond, the search for an aesthetics of existence” (PPC 49; see also OT 326-7). On the one hand, this appears to be a descriptive, historical statement of a matter of fact, namely, that the nature of moral approval has changed. On the other hand, some commentators (O’Leary 2002) interpret such statements as evaluations of modern ethics and recommendations for an alternative standard of moral approval exemplified by an aesthetics of existence. There is no doubt that Foucault commends those who might undertake an aesthetics or arts of existence (EW1 261), or those who voluntarily and rigorously elaborate their existence according to a set of self-imposed standards that aim at what they take to be the good, fine, and beautiful life. It is unclear, however, if Foucault is merely commending or also recommending an aesthetics of existence. Foucault’s critics see no binding or authoritative reason why one ought to pursue an aesthetics of existence instead of, say, egoism unless one has the resources for sorting out good, fine, and beautiful things. For this reason, critics (see Thacker 1993 in addition to those noted above) who interpret Foucault as recommending the aesthetics of existence find it to be an insufficiently articulated alternative to the alleged decline of modern morality.
Additionally, some criticism of Foucault’s ethical thought is based on a reading that empties the aesthetics of existence of its robust moral content. While Foucault does not always help himself out in playing up that content (see EW1 261), it is worth paying attention to the fact that an aesthetics of existence heeds the ancient injunction to care for oneself. This means it is ethically oriented by the care of the self and truth, such that one ought to fashion oneself in accordance with the life that one could reasonably maintain is truly fine and beautiful, and also that the practitioner of an aesthetics of existence demands of others, as he or she demands of himself or herself, that they provide a rational discourse for the life that they believe to be truly fine and beautiful. So, while Foucault is careful to say that a return to ancient Greek ethics – a male-oriented, class-centered ethics – is neither a solution to contemporary moral problems nor a remedy to the alleged decline of modern morality – and indeed expresses pessimism about its prospects (HS 251-2) – an aesthetics of existence properly reformulated to modernity might prove worthy of consideration as a mode of subjection. In the end, however, Foucault supplies only interesting suggestions and nothing too concrete. For this reason this area of Foucault’s thought, and its critical scope, remains hotly debated and a fruitful area of research. For a wide range of essays dealing with the manifold of issues related to ethics and critical philosophy in Foucault’s thought, see Norris 1994, Kelly ed. 1994, Ashenden and Owen ed. 1999, O’Leary 2002, and McGushin 2007.
Loyola Marymount University
U. S. A.
Last updated: September 27, 2011 | Originally published: