Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Michel Foucault: Political Thought

The work of twentieth-century French philosopher Michel Foucault has increasingly influenced the study of politics. This influence has mainly been via concepts he developed in particular historical studies that have been taken up as analytical tools; “governmentality” and ”biopower” are the most prominent of these. More broadly, Foucault developed a radical new conception of social power as forming strategies embodying intentions of their own, above those of individuals engaged in them; individuals for Foucault are as much products of as participants in games of power.

The question of Foucault’s overall political stance remains hotly contested. Scholars disagree both on the level of consistency of his position over his career, and the particular position he could be said to have taken at any particular time. This dispute is common both to scholars critical of Foucault and to those who are sympathetic to his thought.

What can be generally agreed about Foucault is that he had a radically new approach to political questions, and that novel accounts of power and subjectivity were at its heart. Critics dispute not so much the novelty of his views as their coherence. Some critics see Foucault as effectively belonging to the political right because of his rejection of traditional left-liberal conceptions of freedom and justice. Some of his defenders, by contrast, argue for compatibility between Foucault and liberalism. Other defenders see him either as a left-wing revolutionary thinker, or as going beyond traditional political categories.

To summarize Foucault’s thought from an objective point of view, his political works would all seem to have two things in common: (1) an historical perspective, studying social phenomena in historical contexts, focusing on the way they have changed throughout history; (2) a discursive methodology, with the study of texts, particularly academic texts, being the raw material for his inquiries. As such the general political import of Foucault’s thought across its various turns is to understand how the historical formation of discourses have shaped the political thinking and political institutions we have today.

Foucault’s thought was overtly political during one phase of his career, coinciding exactly with the decade of the 1970s, and corresponding to a methodology he designated “genealogy”. It is during this period that, alongside the study of discourses, he analysed power as such in its historical permutations. Most of this article is devoted to this period of Foucault’s work. Prior to this, during the 1960s, the political content of his thought was relatively muted, and the political implications of that thought are contested. So, this article is divided into thematic sections arranged in order of the chronology of their appearance in Foucault’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Foucault’s Early Marxism
  2. Archaeology
  3. Genealogy
  4. Discipline
  5. Sexuality
  6. Power
  7. Biopower
  8. Governmentality
  9. Ethics
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Foucault’s Early Marxism

Foucault began his career as a Marxist, having been influenced by his mentor, the Marxist philosopher Louis Althusser, as a student to join the French Communist Party. Though his membership was tenuous and brief, Foucault’s later political thought should be understood against this background, as a thought that is both under the influence of, and intended as a reaction to, Marxism.

Foucault himself tells us that after his early experience of a Stalinist communist party, he felt sick of politics, and shied away from political involvements for a long time. Still, in his first book, which appeared in 1954, less than two years after Foucault had left the Party, his theoretical perspective remained Marxist. This book was a history of psychology, published in English as Mental Illness and Psychology. In the original text, Foucault concludes that mental illness is a result of alienation caused by capitalism. However, he excised this Marxist content from a later edition in 1962, before suppressing publication of the book entirely; an English translation of the 1962 edition continues to be available only by an accident of copyright (MIP vii). Thus, one can see a trajectory of Foucault’s decisively away from Marxism and indeed tendentially away from politics.

2. Archaeology

Foucault’s first major, canonical work was his 1961 doctoral dissertation, The History of Madness. He gives here a historical account, repeated in brief in the 1962 edition of Mental Illness and Psychology, of what he calls the constitution of an experience of madness in Europe, from the fifteenth to the nineteenth centuries. This encompasses correlative study of institutional and discursive changes in the treatment of the mad, to understand the way that madness was constituted as a phenomenon. The History of Madness is Foucault’s longest book by some margin, and contains a wealth of material that he expands on in various ways in much of his work of the following two decades. Its historical inquiry into the interrelation of institutions and discourses set the pattern for his political works of the 1970s.

Foucault saw there as being three major shifts in the treatment of madness in the period under discussion. The first, with the Renaissance, saw a new respect for madness. Previously, madness had been seen as an alien force to be expelled, but now madness was seen as a form of wisdom. This abruptly changed with the beginning of the Enlightenment in the seventeenth century. Now rationality was valorized above all else, and its opposite, madness, was excluded completely. The unreasonable was excluded from discourse, and congenitally unreasonable people were physically removed from society and confined in asylums. This lasted until the end of the eighteenth century, when a new movement “liberating” the mad arose. For Foucault, however, this was no true liberation, but rather the attempt by Enlightenment reasoning to finally negate madness by understanding it completely, and cure it with medicine.

The History of Madness thus takes seriously the connection between philosophical discourse and political reality. Ideas about reason are not merely taken to be abstract concerns, but as having very real social implications, affecting every facet of the lives of thousands upon thousands of people who were considered mad, and indeed, thereby, altering the structure of society. Such a perspective represents a change in respect of Foucault’s former Marxism. Rather than attempt to ground experience in material circumstances, here it might seem that cultural transformation is being blamed for the transformation of society. That is, it might seem that Foucault had embraced idealism, the position that ideas are the motor force of history, Marxism’s opposite. This would, however, be a misreading. The History of Madness posits no causal priority, either of the cultural shift over the institutional, or vice versa. It simply notes the coincident transformation, without etiological speculation. Moreover, while the political forces at work in the history of madness were not examined by Foucault in this work, it is clearly a political book, exploring the political stakes of philosophy and medicine.

Many were convinced that Foucault was an idealist, however, by later developments in his thought. After The History of Madness, Foucault began to focus on the discursive, bracketing political concerns almost entirely. This was first, and most clearly, signalled in the preface to his next book, The Birth of the Clinic. Although the book itself essentially extends The History of Madness chronologically and thematically, by examining the birth of institutional medicine from the end of the eighteenth century, the preface is a manifesto for a new methodology that will attend only to discourses themselves, to the language that is uttered, rather than the institutional context. It is the following book in Foucault’s sequence, rather than The Birth of the Clinic itself, that carried this intention to fulfilment: this book was The Order of Things (1966). Whereas in The History of Madness and The Birth of the Clinic, Foucault had pursued historical researches that had been relatively balanced between studying conventional historical events, institutional change, and the history of ideas, The Order of Things represented an abstract history of thought that ignored almost anything outside the discursive. This method was in effect what was at that time in France called “structuralism,” though Foucault was never happy with this use of this term. His specific claims were indeed quite unique, namely that in the history of academic discourses, in a given epoch, knowledge is organized by an episteme, which governs what kind of statements can be taken as true. The Order of Things charts several successive historical shifts of episteme in relation to the human sciences.

These claims led Foucault onto a collision with French Marxism. This could not have been entirely unintended by Foucault, in particular because in the book he specifically accuses Marxism of being a creature of the nineteenth century that was now obsolete. He also concluded the work by indicating his opposition to humanism, declaring that “man” (the gendered “man” here refers to a concept that in English we have come increasingly to call the “human”) as such was perhaps nearing obsolescence. Foucault here was opposing a particular conception of the human being as a sovereign subject who can understand itself. Such humanism was at that time the orthodoxy in French Marxism and philosophy, championed the pre-eminent philosopher of the day, Jean-Paul Sartre, and upheld by the French Communist Party’s central committee explicitly against Althusser just a month before The Order of Things was published (DE1 36). In its humanist form, Marxism cast itself as a movement for the full realization of the individual. Foucault, by contrast, saw the notion of the individual as a recent and aberrant idea. Furthermore, his entire presumption to analyse and criticize discourses without reference to the social and economic system that produced them seemed to Marxists to be a massive step backwards in analysis. The book indeed seems to be apolitical: it refuses to take a normative position about truth, and accords no importance to anything outside abstract, academic discourses. The Order of Things proved so controversial, its claims so striking, that it became a best-seller in France, despite being a lengthy, ponderous, scholarly tome.

Yet, Foucault’s position is not quite as anti-political as has been imagined. The explicit criticism of Marxism in the book was specifically of Marx’s economic doctrine: it amounts to the claim that this economics is essentially a form of nineteenth century political economy. It is thus not a total rejection of Marxism, or dismissal of the importance of economics. His anti-humanist position was not in itself anti-Marxist, inasmuch as Althusser took much the same line within a Marxist framework, albeit one that tended to challenge basic tenets of Marxism, and which was rejected by the Marxist establishment. This shows it is possible to use the criticism of the category of “man” in a pointedly political way. Lastly, the point of Foucault’s “archaeological” method of investigation, as he now called it, of looking at transformations of discourses in their own terms without reference to the extra-discursive, does not imply in itself that discursive transformations can be explained without reference to anything non-discursive, only that they can be mapped without any such reference. Foucault thus shows a lack of interest in the political, but no outright denial of the importance of politics.

Foucault was at this time fundamentally oriented towards the study of language. This should not in itself be construed as apolitical. There was a widespread intellectual tendency in France during the 1960s to focus on avant-garde literature as being the main repository for radical hopes, eclipsing a traditional emphasis on the politics of the working class. Foucault wrote widely during this period on art and literature, publishing a book on the obscure French author Raymond Roussel, which appeared on the same day as The Birth of the Clinic. Given Roussel’s eccentricity, this was not far from his reflections on literature in The History of Madness. For Foucault, modern art and literature are essentially transgressive. Transgression is something of a common thread running through Foucault’s work in the 1960s: the transgression of madness and literary modernism is for Foucault directly implicated in the challenge he sees emerging to the current episteme. This interest in literature culminated in what is perhaps Foucault’s best known piece in this relation, ”What Is an Author?”, which combines some of the themes from his final book of the sixties, The Archaeology of Knowledge, with reflections on modern literature in challenging the notion of the human “author” of a work in whatever genre. All of these works, no matter how abstract, can be seen as having important political-cultural stakes for Foucault. Challenging the suzerainty of “man” can in itself be said to have constituted his political project during this period, such was the importance he accorded to discourses. The practical importance of such questions can be seen in The History of Madness.

Foucault was ultimately dissatisfied with this approach, however. The Archaeology of Knowledge, a reflective consideration of the methodology of archaeology itself, ends with an extraordinary self-critical dialogue, in which Foucault answers imagined objections to this methodology.

3. Genealogy

Foucault wrote The Archaeology of Knowledge while based in Tunisia, where he had taken a three-year university appointment in 1966. While the book was in its final stages, the world around him changed. Tunisia went through a political upheaval, with demonstrations against the government, involving many of his students. He was drawn into supporting them, and was persecuted as a result. Much better known and more significant student demonstrations occurred in Paris shortly afterwards, in May of 1968. Foucault largely missed these because he was in Tunis, but he followed news of them keenly.

He returned to France permanently in 1969. He was made the head of the philosophy department at a brand new university at Vincennes. The milieu he found on his return to France was itself highly politicized, in stark contrast to the relatively staid country he had left behind three years before. He was surrounded by peers who had become committed militants, not least his partner Daniel Defert, and including almost all of the colleagues he had hired to his department. He now threw himself into an activism that would characterize his life from that point on.

It was not long before a new direction appeared in his thought to match. The occasion this first became apparent was his 1970 inaugural address for another new job, his second in as many years, this time as a professor at the Collège de France, the highest academic institution in France. This address was published as a book in France, L’ordre du discours, “The Order of Discourse” (which is one of the multiple titles under which it has been translated in English). For the first time, Foucault sets out an explicit agenda of studying institutions alongside discourse. He had done this in the early 1960s, but now he proposed it as a deliberate method, which he called “genealogy.” Much of “The Order of Discourse” in effect recapitulates Foucault’s thought up to that point, the considerations of the history of madness and the regimes of truth that have governed scientific discourse, leading to a sketch of a mode of analysing discourse similar to that of The Archeology of Knowledge. In the final pages, however, Foucault states that he will now undertake analyses in two different directions, critical and “genealogical.” The critical direction consists in the study of the historical formation of systems of exclusion. This is clearly a turn back to the considerations of The History of Madness. The genealogical direction is more novel – not only within Foucault’s work, but in Western thought in general, though the use of the term “genealogical” does indicate a debt to one who came before him, namely Friedrich Nietzsche. The genealogical inquiry asks about the reciprocal relationship between systems of exclusion and the formation of discourses. The point here is that exclusion is not a fate that befalls innocent, pre-existing discourses. Rather, discourses only ever come about within and because of systems of exclusion, the negative moment of exclusion co-existing with the positive moment of the production of discourse. Now, discourse becomes a political question in a full sense for Foucault, as something that is intertwined with power.

“Power” is barely named as such by Foucault in this text, but it becomes the dominant concept of his output of the 1970s. This output comprises two major books, eight annual lecture series he gave at the Collège de France, and a plethora of shorter pieces and interviews. The signature concept of genealogy, combining the new focus on power with the older one on discourse, is his notion of “power-knowledge.” Foucault now sees power and knowledge as indissolubly joined, such that one never has either one without the other, with neither having causal suzerainty over the other.

His first lecture series at the Collège de France, now published in French as Leçons sur la volonté de savoir (“Lessons on the will to knowledge”), extends the concerns of “The Order of Discourse” with the production of knowledge. More overtly political material followed in the next two lecture series, between 1971 and 1973, both of which dealt with the prison system, and led up to Foucault’s first full-scale, published genealogy, 1975’s Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison.

4. Discipline

This research on prisons began in activism. The French state had banned several radical leftist groups in the aftermath of May 1968, and thousands of their members ended up in prisons, where they began to agitate for political rights for themselves, then began to agitate for rights for prisoners in general, having been exposed by their incarceration to ordinary prisoners and their problems. Foucault was the main organizer of a group formed outside the prison, in effect as an outgrowth of this struggle, the Groupe d’informations sur les prisons (the GIP – the Prisons Information Group). This group, composed primarily of intellectuals, sought simply to empower prisoners to speak of their experiences on their own account, by sending surveys out to them and collating their responses.

In tandem with this effort, Foucault researched the history of the prisons, aiming to find out something that the prisoners themselves could not tell him: how the prison system had come into being and what purpose it served in the broader social context. His history of the prisons turns out to be a history of a type of power that Foucault calls “disciplinary,” which encompasses the modern prison system, but is much broader. Discipline and Punish thus comprises two main historical theses. One, specifically pertaining to the prison system, is that this system regularly produces an empirically well-known effect, a layer of specialized criminal recidivists. This is for Foucault simply what prisons objectively do. Pointing this out undercuts the pervasive rationale of imprisonment that prisons are there to reduce crime by punishing and rehabilitating inmates. Foucault considers the obvious objection to this that prisons only produce such effects because they have been run ineffectively throughout their history, that better psychological management of rehabilitation is required, in particular. He answers this by pointing out that such discourses of prison reform have accompanied the prison system since it was first established, and are hence part of its functioning, indeed propping it up in spite of its failures by providing a constant excuse for its failings by arguing that it can be made to work differently.

Foucault’s broader thesis in Discipline and Punish is that we are living in a disciplinary society, of which the prison is merely a potent example. Discipline began not with the prisons, but originally in monastic institutions, spreading out through society via the establishment of professional armies, which required dressage, the training of individual soldiers in their movements so that they could coordinate with one another with precision. This, crucially, was a matter of producing what Foucault calls “docile bodies,” the basic unit of disciplinary power. The prison is just one of a raft of broadly similar disciplinary institutions that come into existence later. Schools, hospitals, and factories all combine similar methods to prisons for arranging bodies regularly in space, down to their minute movements. All combine moreover similar functions. Like the prison, they all have educational, economically productive, and medical aspects to them. The differences between these institutions is a matter of which aspect has primacy.

All disciplinary institutions also do something else that is quite novel, for Foucault: they produce a “soul” on the basis of the body, in order to imprison the body. This eccentric formulation of Foucault’s is meant to capture the way that disciplinary power has increasingly individualized people. Discipline and Punish begins with a vivid depiction of an earlier form of power in France, specifically the execution in 1757 of a man who had attempted to kill the King of France. As was the custom, for this, the most heinous of crimes in a political system focused on the person of the king, the most severe punishment was meted out: the culprit was publicly tortured to death. Foucault contrasts this with the routinized imprisonment that became the primary form of punishing criminals in the 19th century. From a form of power that punished by extraordinary and exemplary physical harm against a few transgressors, Western societies adopted a form of power that attempted to capture all individual behaviour. This is illustrated by a particular example that has become one of the best known images from Foucault’s work, the influential scheme of nineteenth century philosopher Jeremy Bentham called the “Panopticon,” a prison in which every action of the inmates would be visible. This serves as something of a paradigm for the disciplinary imperative, though it was never realized completely in practice.

Systems of monitoring and control nevertheless spread through all social institutions: schools, workplaces, and the family. While criminals had in a sense already been punished individually, they were not treated as individuals in the full sense that now developed. Disciplinary institutions such as prisons seek to develop detailed individual psychological profiles of people, and seek to alter their behaviour at the same level. Where previously most people had been part of a relatively undifferentiated mass, individuality being the preserve of a prominent or notorious few, and even then a relatively thin individuality, a society of individuals now developed, where everyone is supposed to have their own individual life story. This constitutes the soul Foucault refers to.

5. Sexuality

The thread of individualization runs through his next book, the first of what were ultimately three volumes of his History of Sexuality. He gave this volume the title The Will to Knowledge. It appeared only a year after Discipline and Punish. Still, three courses at the Collège de France intervene between his lectures on matters penitential and the book on sexuality. The first, Psychiatric Power, picks up chronologically where The History of Madness had left off, and applies Foucault’s genealogical method to the history of psychiatry. The next year, 1975, Foucault gave a series of lectures entitled Abnormal. These link together the studies on the prison with those on psychiatry and the question of sexuality through the study of the category of the abnormal, to which criminals, the mad, and sexual “perverts” were all assigned. Parts of these lectures indeed effectively reappear in The Will to Knowledge.

Like Discipline and Punish, the Will to Knowledge contains both general and specific conclusions. Regarding the specific problem of sexuality, Foucault couches his thesis as a debunking of a certain received wisdom in relation to the history of sexuality that he calls “the repressive hypothesis.” This is the view that our sexuality has historically been repressed, particularly in the nineteenth century, but that during the twentieth century it has been progressively liberated, and that we need now to get rid of our remaining hang-ups about sex by talking openly and copiously about it. Foucault allows the core historical claim that there has been sexual repressiveness, but thinks that this is relatively unimportant in the history of sexuality. Much more important, he thinks, is an injunction to talk about our sexuality that has consistently been imposed even during the years of repressiveness, and is now intensified, ostensibly for the purpose of lifting our repression. Foucault again sees a disciplinary technique at work, namely confession. This began in the Catholic confessional, with the Church spreading the confessional impulse in relation to sex throughout society in the early modern period. Foucault thinks this impulse has since been made secular, particularly under the auspices of institutional psychiatry, introducing a general compulsion for everyone to tell the truth about themselves, with their sexuality a particular focus. For Foucault, there is no such thing as sexuality apart from this compulsion. That is, sexuality itself is not something that we naturally have, but rather something that has been invented and imposed.

The implication of his genealogy of sexuality is that “sex” as we understand it is an artificial construct within this recent “device” (dispositif) of sexuality. This includes both the category of the sexual, encompassing certain organs and acts, and “sex” in the sense of gender, an implication spelt out by Foucault in his introduction to the memoirs of Herculine Barbin, a nineteenth century French hermaphrodite, which Foucault discovered and arranged to have published. Foucault’s thought, and his work on sexuality in particular, has been immensely influential in the recent “third wave” of feminist thought. The interaction of Foucault and feminism is the topic of a dedicated article elsewhere in this encyclopedia.

6. Power

The most general claim of The Will to Knowledge, and of Foucault’s entire political thought, is his answer to the question of where machinations such as sex and discipline come from. Who and what is it that is responsible for the production of criminality via imprisonment? Foucault’s answer is, in a word, “power.” That is to say that no one in particular is producing these things, but that rather they are effects generated by the interaction of power relations, which produce intentions of their own, not necessarily shared by any individuals or institutions. Foucault’s account of power is the broadest of the conclusions of The Will to Knowledge. Although similar reflections on power can be found in Discipline and Punish and in lectures and interviews of the same period, The Will to Knowledge gives his most comprehensive account of power. Foucault understands power in terms of “strategies” which are produced through the concatenation of the power relations that exist throughout society, wherever people interact. As he explains in a later text, “The Subject and Power,” which effectively completes the account of power given in The Will to Knowledge, these relations are a matter of people acting on one another to make other people act in turn. Whenever we try to influence others, this is power. However, our attempts to influence others rarely turn out the way we expect; moreover, even when they do, we have very little idea what effects our actions on others’ have more broadly. In this way, the social effects of our attempts to influence other people run quite outside of our control or ken. This effect is neatly encapsulated in a remark attributed to Foucault that we may know what we do, but we do not know what what we do does. What it does is produce strategies that have a kind of life of their own. Thus, although no one in the prison system, neither the inmates, nor the guards, nor politicians, want prisons to produce a class of criminals, this is nonetheless what the actions of all the people involved do.

Controversy around Foucault’s political views has focused on his reconception of power. Criticisms of him on this point invariably fail, however, to appreciate his true position or beg the question against it by simply restating the views he has rejected. He has been interpreted as thinking that power is a mysterious, autonomous force that exists independently of any human influence, and is so all-encompassing as to preclude any resistance to it. Foucault clearly states in The Will to Knowledge that this is not so, though it is admittedly relatively difficult to understand his position, namely that resistance to power is not outside power. The point here for Foucault is not that resistance is futile, but that power is so ubiquitous that in itself it is not an obstacle to resistance. One cannot resist power as such, but only specific strategies of power, and then only with great difficulty, given the tendency of strategies to absorb apparently contradictory tendencies. Still, for Foucault power is never conceived as monolithic or autonomous, but rather is a matter of superficially stable structures emerging on the basis of constantly shifting relations underneath, caused by an unending struggle between people. Foucault explains this in terms of the inversion of Clausewitz’s dictum that war is diplomacy by other means into the claim that “politics is war by other means.” For Foucault, apparently peaceful and civilized social arrangements are supported by people locked in a struggle for supremacy, which is eternally susceptible to change, via the force of that struggle itself.

Foucault is nevertheless condemned by many liberal commentators for his failure to make any normative distinction between power and resistance, that is, for his relativism. This accusation is well founded: he consistently eschews any kind of overtly normative stance in his thought. He thus does not normatively justify resistance, but it is not clear there is any inherent contradiction in a non-normative resistance. This idea is coherent, though of course those who think it is impossible to have a non-normative political thought (which is a consensus position within political philosophy) will reject him on this basis. For his part, he offers only analyses that he hopes will prove useful to people struggling in concrete situations, rather than prescriptions as to what is right or wrong.

One last accusation, coming from a particularly noteworthy source, the most prominent living German philosopher, Jürgen Habermas, should also be mentioned. This accusation is namely that Foucault’s account of power is “functionalist.” Functionalism in sociology means taking society as a functional whole and thus reading every part as having distinct functions. The problem with this view is that society is not designed by anyone and consequently much of it is functionally redundant or accidental. Foucault does use the vocabulary of “function” on occasion in his descriptions of the operations of power, but does not show any allegiance to or even awareness of functionalism as a school of thought. His position in any case is not that society constitutes a totality or whole via any necessity: functions exist within strategies that emerge spontaneously from below, and the functions of any element are subject to change.

7. Biopower

Foucault’s position in relation to resistance implies not so much that one is defeated before one begins as that one must proceed with caution to avoid simply supporting a strategy of power while thinking oneself rebellious. This is for him what has happened in respect of sexuality in the case of the repressive hypothesis. Though we try to liberate ourselves from sexual repression, we in fact play into a strategy of power which we do not realize exists. This strategy is for everyone to constitute themselves as “‘subjects’ in both senses of the word,” a process Foucault designates “subjection” (assujettissement). The two senses here are passive and active. On the one hand, we are subjected in this process, made into passive subjects of study by medical professionals, for example. On the other, we are the subjects in this process, having to actively confess our sexual proclivities and indeed in the process develop an identity based on this confessed sexuality. So, power operates in ways that are both overtly oppressive and more positive.

Sexuality for Foucault has a quite extraordinary importance in the contemporary network of power relations. It has become the essence of our personal identity, and sex has come to be seen as “worth dying for.” Foucault details how sexuality had its beginnings as a preoccupation of the newly dominant bourgeois class, who were obsessed with physical and reproductive health, and their own pleasure. This class produced sexuality positively, though one can see that it would have been imposed on women and children within that class quite regardless of their wishes. For Foucault, there are four consistent strategies of the device of sexuality: the pathologisation of the sexuality of women and children, the concomitant medicalization of the sexually abnormal “pervert,” and the constitution of sexuality as an object of public concern. From its beginning in the bourgeoisie, Foucault sees public health agencies as imposing sexuality more crudely on the rest of the populace, quite against their wishes.

Why has this happened? For Foucault, the main explanation is how sexuality ties together multiple “technologies of power”, namely discipline on the one hand, and a newer technology, which he calls “bio-politics,” on the other. In The Will to Knowledge, Foucault calls this combination of discipline and bio-politics together “bio-power,” though confusingly he elsewhere seems to use “bio-power” and “bio-politics” as synonyms, notably in his 1976 lecture series, Society Must Be Defended. He also elsewhere dispenses with the hyphens in these words, as it will in the present article hereafter.

Biopolitics is a technology of power that grew up on the basis of disciplinary power. Where discipline is about the control of individual bodies, biopolitics is about the control of entire populations. Where discipline constituted individuals as such, biopolitics does this with the population. Prior to the invention of biopolitics, there was no serious attempt by governments to regulate the people who lived in a territory, only piecemeal violent interventions to put down rebellions or levy taxes. As with discipline, the main precursor to biopolitics can be found in the Church, which is the institution that did maintain records of births and deaths, and did minister to the poor and sick, in the medieval period. In the modern period, the perception grew among governments that interventions in the life of the people would produce beneficial consequences for the state, preventing depopulation, ensuring a stable and growing tax base, and providing a regular supply of manpower for the military. Hence they took an active interest in the lives of the people. Disciplinary mechanisms allowed the state to do this through institutions, most notably perhaps medical institutions that allowed the state to monitor and support the health of the population. Sex was the most intense site at which discipline and biopolitics intersected, because any intervention in population via the control of individual bodies fundamentally had to be about reproduction, and also because sex is one of the major vectors of disease transmission. Sex had to be controlled, regulated, and monitored if the population was to be brought under control.

There is another technology of power in play, however, older than discipline, namely “sovereign power.” This is the technology we glimpse at the beginning of Discipline and Punish, one that works essentially by violence and by taking, rather than by positively encouraging and producing as both discipline and biopolitics do. This form of power was previously the way in which governments dealt both with individual bodies and with masses of people. While it has been replaced in these two roles by discipline and biopower, it retains a role nonetheless at the limits of biopower. When discipline breaks down, when the regulation of the population breaks down, the state continues to rely on brute force as a last resort. Moreover, the state continues to rely on brute force, and the threat of it, in dealing with what lies outside its borders.

For Foucault, there is a mutual incompatibility between biopolitics and sovereign power. Indeed, he sometimes refers to sovereign power as “thanatopolitics,” the politics of death, in contrast to biopolitics’s politics of life. Biopolitics is a form of power that works by helping you to live, thanatopolitics by killing you, or at best allowing you to live. It seems impossible for any individual to be simultaneously gripped by both forms of power, notwithstanding a possible conflict between different states or state agencies. There is a need for a dividing line between the two, between who is to be “made to live,” as Foucault puts it, and who is to be killed or simply allowed to go on living indifferently. The most obvious dividing line is the boundary between the population and its outside at the border of a territory, but the “biopolitical border,” as it has been called by recent scholars, is not the same as the territorial border. In Society Must Be Defended, Foucault suggests there is a device he calls “state racism,” that comes variably into play in deciding who is to receive the benefits of biopolitics or be exposed to the risk of death.

Foucault does not use this term in any of the works he published himself, but nevertheless does point in The Will to Knowledge to a close relationship between biopolitics and racism. Discourses of scientific racism that emerged in the nineteenth century posited a link between the sexual “degeneracy” of individuals and the hygiene of the population at large. By the early twentieth century, eugenics, the pseudo-science of improving the vitality of a population through selective breeding, was implemented to some extent in almost all industrialized countries. It of course found its fullest expression in Nazi Germany. Nevertheless, Foucault is quite clear that there is something quite paradoxical about such attempts to link the old theme of “blood” to modern concerns with population health. The essential point about “state racism” is not then that it necessarily links to what we might ordinarily understand as racism in its strict sense, but that there has to be a dividing line in modern biopolitical states between what is part of the population and what is not, and that this is, in a broad sense, racist.

8. Governmentality

After the publication of The Will to Knowledge, Foucault took a one-year hiatus from lecturing at the Collège de France. He returned in 1978 with a series of lectures that followed logically from his 1976 ones, but show a distinct shift in conceptual vocabulary. Talk of “biopolitics” is almost absent. A new concept, “governmentality,” takes its place. The lecture series of 1978 and 1979, Security, Territory, Population and The Birth of Biopolitics, center on this concept, despite the somewhat misleading title of the latter in this regard.

“Governmentality” is a portmanteau word, derived from the phrase “governmental rationality.” A governmentality is thus a logic by which a polity is governed. But this logic is for Foucault, in keeping with his genealogical perspective (which he still affirms), not merely ideal, but rather encompasses institutions, practices and ideas. More specifically, Foucault defines governmentality in Security, Territory, Population as allowing for a complex form of “power which has the population as its target, political economy as its major form of knowledge, and apparatuses of security as its essential technical instrument” (pp. 107–8). Confusingly, however, Foucault in the same breath also defines other senses in which he will use the term “governmentality.” He will use it not only to describe this recent logic of government, but as the longer tendency in Western history that has led to it, and the specific process in the early modern period by which modern governmentality was formed.

“Governmentality” is a slippery concept then. Still, it is an important one. Governmentality seems to be closely contemporaneous and functionally isomorphic with biopolitics, hence seems to replace it in Foucault’s thought. That said, unlike biopolitics, it never figures in a major publication of his – he only allowed one crucial lecture of Security, Territory, Population to be published under the title of “Governmentality,” in an Italian journal. It is via the English translation of this essay that this concept has become known in English, this one essay of Foucault’s in fact inspiring an entire school of sociological reflection.

What is the meaning of this fuzzy concept then? Foucault never repudiates biopower. During these lectures he on multiple occasions reaffirms his interest in biopower as an object of study, and does so as late as 1983, the year before he died. The meaning of governmentality as a concept is to situate biopower in a larger historical moment, one that stretches further back in history and encompasses more elements, in particular the discourses of economics and regulation of the economy.

Foucault details two main phases in the development of governmentality. The first is what he identifies as raison d’État, literally “reason of state.” This is the central object of study of Security, Territory, Population. It correlates the technology of discipline, as an attempt to regulate society to the fullest extent, with what was contemporaneously called “police.” This governmentality gave way by the eighteenth century to a new form of governmentality, what will become political liberalism, which reacts against the failures of governmental regulation with the idea that society should be left to regulate itself naturally, with the power of police applied only negatively in extremis. This for Foucault is broadly the governmentality that has lasted to this day, and is the object of study of The Birth of Biopolitics in its most recent form, what is called “neo-liberalism.” With this governmentality, we see freedom of the individual and regulation of the population subtly intertwined.

9. Ethics

The 1980s see a significant turn in Foucault’s work, both in terms of the discourses he attends to and the vocabulary he uses. Specifically, he focuses from now on mainly on Ancient texts from Greece and Rome, and prominently uses the concepts of “subjectivity” and “ethics.” None of these elements is entirely new to his work, but they assume novel prominence and combination at this point.

There is an article elsewhere in this encyclopedia about Foucault’s ethics. The question here is what the specifically political import of this ethics is. It is often assumed that the meaning of Foucault’s ethics is to retract his earlier political thought and thus to recant on that political project, retreating from political concerns towards a concern with individual action. There is a grain of truth to such allegations, but no more than a grain. While certainly Foucault’s move to the consideration of ethics is a move away from an explicitly political engagement, there is no recantation or contradiction of his previous positions, only the offering of an account of subjectivity and ethics that might enrich these.

Foucault’s turn towards subjectivity is similar to his earlier turn towards power: he seeks to add a dimension to the accounts and approach he has built up. As in the case of power, he does so not by helping himself to an available approach, but by producing a new one: Foucault’s own account of subjectivity is original and quite different to the extant accounts of subjectivity he rejected in his earlier work. Subjectivity for Foucault is a matter of people’s ability to shape their own conduct. In this way, his account relates to his previous work on government, with subjectivity a matter of the government of the self. It is thus closely linked to his political thought, as a question of the power that penetrates the interior of the person.

“Ethics” too is understood in this terms. Foucault does not produce an “ethics” in the sense that the word is conventionally used today to mean a normative morality, nor indeed does he produce a “political philosophy” in the sense that that phrase is conventionally used, which is to say a normative politics. “Ethics” for Foucault is rather understood etymologically by reference to Ancient Greek reflection on the ethike, which is to say, on character. Ancient Greek ethics was marked by what Foucault calls the “care of the self”: it is essentially a practice of fashioning the self. In such practices, Foucault sees a potential basis for resistance to power, though he is clear that no truly ethical practices exist today and it is by no means clear that they can be reestablished. Ethics has, on the contrary, been abnegated by Christianity with its mortificatory attitude to the self. This account of ethics can be found primarily in Foucault’s last three lecture series at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject, The Government of the Self and Others and The Courage of the Truth.

10. References and Further Reading

English translations of works by Foucault named above, in the order they were originally written.

a. Primary

    • Mental illness and psychology. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987.
    • The History of Madness. London: Routledge, 2006.
    • Birth of the Clinic. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • The Order of Things. London: Tavistock, 1970.
    • The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon, 1972.
    • "The order of discourse," in M. Shapiro, ed., Language and politics (Blackwell, 1984), pp. 108-138. Translated by Ian McLeod.
    • Psychiatric Power. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
    • Discipline and Punish. London: Allen Lane, 1977.
    • Abnormal. London: Verso, 2003.
    • Society Must Be Defended. New York: Picador, 2003.
    • An Introduction. Vol. 1 of The History of Sexuality. New York: Pantheon, 1978. Reprinted as The Will to Knowledge, London: Penguin, 1998.
    • Security, Territory, Population. New York: Picador, 2009
    • The Birth of Biopolitics. New York: Picador, 2010
    • "Introduction" M. Foucault, ed., Herculine Barbin: being the recently discovered memoirs of a nineteenth-century French hermaphrodite Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980, pp. vii-xvii. Translated by Richard McDougall.
    • “The Subject and Power,” J. Faubion, ed., Power. New York: New Press, 2000, pp. 326-348.
    • The Hermeneutics of the Subject. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
    • The Government of the Self and Others. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2010.
    • The Courage of the Truth. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2011.

The shorter writings and interviews of Foucault are also of extraordinary interest, particularly to philosophers. In French, these have been published in an almost complete collection, Dits et écrits, by Gallimard, first in four volumes and more recently in a two-volume edition. In English, Foucault’s shorter works are spread across many overlapping anthologies, which even between them omit much that is important. The most important of these anthologies for Foucault’s political thought are:

  • J. Faubion, ed., Power Vol. 3, Essential Works. New York: New Press, 2000.
  • Colin Gordon, ed., Power/Knowledge. Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980.

b. Secondary

  • Graham Burchell, Colin Gordon and Peter Miller (eds.), The Foucault Effect. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1991.
    • An edited collection that is a mixture of primary and secondary sources. Both parts of the book have been extraordinarily influential. If constitutes a decent primer on governmentality.
  • Gilles Deleuze, Foucault. Trans. Seán Hand. London: Athlone, 1988.
    • The best book about Foucault’s work, from one who knew him. Though predictably idiosyncratic, it is still a pointedly political reading.
  • David Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: A Critical Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
    • An excellent selection of critical essays, mostly specifically political.
  • Mark G. E. Kelly, The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • A comprehensive treatment of Foucault’s political thought from a specifically philosophical angle
  • John Rajchman, Michel Foucault: The Freedom of Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An idiosyncratic reading of Foucault that is particularly good at synthesising his entire career according to the political animus behind it.
  • Jon Simons, Foucault and the Political. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • The first work to focus on Foucault’s thought from a political introduction, this survey of his work serves well as a general introduction to the topic, though it necessarily lacks consideration of much that has appeared in English since its publication.
  • Barry Smart (ed.), Michel Foucault: Critical Assessments (multi-volume). London: Routledge, 1995.
    • Includes multiple sections on Foucault’s political thought.

Author Information

Mark Kelly
Email: markgekelly@gmail.com
Middlesex University
United Kingdom




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