Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Michel Foucault: Feminism

Poststructuralism and contemporary feminism have emerged as two of the most influential political and cultural movements of the late twentieth century. The recent alliance between them has been marked by an especially lively engagement with the work of French philosopher Michel Foucault. Although Foucault makes few references to women or to the issue of gender in his writings, his treatment of the relations between power, the body and sexuality has stimulated extensive feminist interest. Foucault’s idea that the body and sexuality are cultural constructs rather than natural phenomena has made a significant contribution to the feminist critique of essentialism. While feminists have found Foucault’s analysis of the relations between power and the body illuminating, they have also drawn attention to its limitations. From the perspective of a feminist politics that aims to promote women’s autonomy, the tendency of a Foucauldian account of power to reduce social agents to docile bodies seems problematic. Although many feminist theorists remain critical of Foucault’s questioning of the categories of the subject and agency on the grounds that such questioning undermines the emancipatory aims of feminism, others have argued that in his late work he develops a more robust account of subjectivity and resistance which, while not without its problems from a feminist perspective, nevertheless has a lot to offer a feminist politics. The affinities and tensions between Foucault’s thought and contemporary feminism are discussed below.

Table of Contents

  1. Background: Foucault’s Genealogy of Power, Knowledge and the Subject
  2. Between Foucault and Feminism: Convergence and Critique
  3. Power, the Body and Sexuality
  4. Subjectivity, Identity and Resistance
  5. Freedom, Power and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Background: Foucault’s Genealogy of Power, Knowledge and the Subject

In the works of his middle years – Discipline and Punish and The History of Sexuality, Vol. 1 – Foucault traces the emergence of some of the practices, concepts, forms of knowledge, social institutions and techniques of government which have contributed to shaping modern European culture. He calls the method of historical analysis he employs ‘genealogical’. Genealogy is a form of critical history in the sense that it attempts a diagnosis of ‘the present time, and of what we are, in this very moment’ in order ‘to question … what is postulated as self-evident … to dissipate what is familiar and accepted’ (Foucault 1988a: 265). What distinguishes genealogical analysis from traditional historiography is that it is ‘a form of history which can account for the constitution of knowledges, discourses, domains of objects etc. without having to make reference to a subject which is either transcendental in relation to the field of events or runs in its empty sameness throughout history’ (Foucault 1980: 149). Rather than assuming that the movement of history can be explained by the intentions and aims of individual actors, genealogy investigates the complex and shifting network of relations between power, knowledge and the body which produce historically specific forms of subjectivity. Foucault links his genealogical studies to a modality of social critique which he describes as a ‘critical ontology of the present’. In a late paper, he explains that an ontology of the present involves ‘an analysis of the historical limits that are imposed on us’ in order to create the space for ‘an experiment with the possibility of going beyond them’ (Foucault 1984: 50). Thus, genealogy is a form of social critique that seeks to determine possibilities for social change and ethical transformation of ourselves.

One of the central threads of Foucault’s genealogy of the present is an analysis of the transformations in the nature and functioning of power which mark the transition to modern society. Foucault’s genealogy of modern power challenges the commonly held assumption that power is an essentially negative, repressive force that operates purely through the mechanisms of law, taboo and censorship. According to Foucault, this ‘juridico-discursive’ conception of power (Foucault 1978: 82) has its origins in the practices of power characteristic of pre-modern societies. In such societies, he claims, power was centralized and coordinated by a sovereign authority who exercised absolute control over the population through the threat or open display of violence. From the seventeenth century onwards, however, as the growth and care of populations increasingly became the primary concerns of the state, new mechanisms of power emerged which centered around the administration and management of ‘life’. In the complex story that Foucault tells, this new form of ‘bio-power’ coalesced around two poles. One pole is concerned with the efficient government of the population as a whole and focuses on the management of the life processes of the social body. It involves the regulation of phenomena such as birth, death, sickness, disease, health, sexual relations and so on. The other pole, which Foucault labels ‘disciplinary power’, targets the human body as an object to be manipulated and trained. In Discipline and Punish Foucault studies the practices of discipline and training associated with disciplinary power. He suggests that these practices were first cultivated in isolated institutional settings such as prisons, military establishments, hospitals, factories and schools but were gradually applied more broadly as techniques of social regulation and control. The key feature of disciplinary power is that it is exercised directly on the body. Disciplinary practices subject bodily activities to a process of constant surveillance and examination that enables a continuous and pervasive control of individual conduct. The aim of these practices is to simultaneously optimize the body’s capacities, skills and productivity and to foster its usefulness and docility: ‘What was then being formed was a policy of coercions that act on the body, a calculated manipulation of its elements, its gestures, its behavior. The human body was entering a machinery of power that explores it, breaks it down and rearranges it…Thus, discipline produces subjected and practiced bodies, “docile” bodies’ (Foucault 1977: 138-9). It is not, however, only the body that disciplinary techniques target. Foucault presents disciplinary power as productive of certain types of subject as well. In Discipline and Punish he describes the way in which the central technique of disciplinary power – constant surveillance – which is initially directed toward disciplining the body, takes hold of the mind as well to induce a psychological state of ‘conscious and permanent visibility’ (Foucault 1977: 201). In other words, perpetual surveillance is internalized by individuals to produce the kind of self-awareness that defines the modern subject. With the idea that modern power operates to produce the phenomena it targets Foucault challenges the juridical notion of power as law which assumes that power is simply the constraint or repression of something that is already constituted. On Foucault’s account the transition to modernity entails the replacement of the law by the norm as the primary instrument of social control. Foucault links the importance assumed by norms in modern society to the development of the human or social sciences. In the first volume of The History of Sexuality he describes how, in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, sex and sexuality became crucial political issues in a society concerned with managing and directing the life of individuals and of populations. On Foucault’s account, the spread of bio-power is intimately connected to the social science discourses on sex and sexuality which proliferated during this period. These discourses, he claims, tended to understand sex as an instinctual biological and psychic drive with deep links to identity and, thus, with potentially far-reaching effects on the sexual and social behavior of individuals. The idea that the sexual drive could function in a normal, healthy manner or could be warped and perverted into pathological forms led to a project of classification of behavior along a scale of normalization and pathologization of the sexual instinct (Dreyfus & Rabinow 1982: 173). Once the social (and sexual) science categories of normalcy and deviancy were established, various political technologies aimed at treating and reforming ‘deviant’ behavior could be sanctioned as in the interests of both the individual and society. Thus, Foucault suggests that in modern society the behavior of individuals and groups is increasingly pervasively controlled through standards of normality which are disseminated by a range of assessing, diagnostic, prognostic and normative knowledges such as criminology, medicine, psychology and psychiatry. Modern individuals, moreover, become the agents of their own ‘normalization’ to the extent that they are subjected to, and become invested in, the categories, classifications and norms propagated by scientific and administrative discourses which purport to reveal the ‘truth’ of their identities. Modern disciplinary society can, therefore, dispense with direct forms of repression and constraint because social control is achieved by means of subtler strategies of normalization, strategies which produce self-regulating, ‘normalized’ individuals. It is Foucault’s insight into the productivity of the practices and technologies characteristic of normalizing bio-power that underpins his general conclusion that power in modern societies is a fundamentally creative rather than repressive force (Foucault 1977: 194). Above all, Foucault claims that modern regimes of power operate to produce us as subjects who are both the objects and vehicles of power. He explains that: ‘The individual is not to be conceived as a sort of elementary nucleus, a primitive atom, a multiple and inert material on which power comes to fasten or against which it happens to strike, and in so doing subdues or crushes individuals. In fact, it is already one of the prime effects of power that certain bodies, certain gestures, certain discourses, certain desires, come to be identified and constituted as individuals. The individual, that is, is not the vis-à-vis of power; it is … one of its prime effects.’ (Foucault 1980: 98). Foucault’s analysis of productive bio-power points to a complex interaction between modern forms of power and knowledge: ‘the exercise of power perpetually creates knowledge and, conversely, knowledge constantly induces effects of power’ (Foucault 1980: 52). For Foucault, power can be said to create knowledge in two related senses. Firstly, in the sense that particular institutions of power make certain forms of knowledge historically possible. In the case of the social sciences, for example, it is the refinement of disciplinary techniques for observing and analyzing the body in various institutional settings that facilitates the expansion of new areas of social research. Power can also be said to create knowledge in the sense that institutions of power determine the conditions under which scientific statements come to be counted as true or false (Hacking 1986). According to Foucault, then, ‘truth is a thing of this world: it is produced only by virtue of multiple forms of constraint. And it induces regular effects of power’ (Foucault 1980: 131). This description suggests that the production of ‘truth’ is never entirely separable from technologies of power. On the other hand, Foucault maintains that knowledge induces effects of power in so far as it constitutes new objects of inquiry – ‘objects’ like ‘the delinquent’, ‘the homosexual’ or ‘the criminal type’ – which then become available for manipulation and control (Rouse 1994: 97). For example, he claims that it is the knowledge generated by the human sciences which enables modern power to circulate through finer channels, ‘gaining access to individuals themselves, to their bodies, their gestures, and all their daily actions’ (Foucault 1980: 151). It is in order to signal the mutually conditioning operations of power and knowledge that Foucault speaks of regimes of ‘power/knowledge’ or ‘discourses’; that is, structured ways of knowing and exercising power.

2. Between Foucault and Feminism: Convergence and Critique

From the perspective of contemporary social and political theory, the originality of Foucault’s genealogies of power/knowledge resides in the challenge they pose to traditional ways of thinking about power. It is this challenge that has made Foucault’s work both a significant resource for feminist theory and generated heated debate amongst feminist social and political theorists. While there is broad agreement that Foucault’s redefinition of how we think about power in contemporary societies contains important insights for feminism, feminists remain divided over the implications of this redefinition for feminist theory and practice.

An analysis of power relations is central to the feminist project of understanding the nature and causes of women’s subordination. Drawing on the traditional model of power as repression, many types of feminist theory have assumed that the oppression of women can be explained by patriarchal social structures which secure the power of men over women. Increasingly, however, this assumption is being called into question by other feminists who are concerned to counter what they regard as the oversimplified conception of power relations this view entails, as well as its problematic implication that women are simply the passive, powerless victims of male power. In the context of this debate, Foucault’s work on power has been used by some feminists to develop a more complex analysis of the relations between gender and power which avoids the assumption that the oppression of women is caused in any simple way by men’s possession of power. On the basis of Foucault’s understanding of power as exercised rather than possessed, as circulating throughout the social body rather than emanating from the top down, and as productive rather than repressive (Sawicki 1988: 164), feminists have sought to challenge accounts of gender relations which emphasize domination and victimization so as to move towards a more textured understanding of the role of power in women’s lives. Foucault’s redefinition of power has made a significant and varied contribution to this project. Foucault’s notion that power is constitutive of that upon which it acts has enabled feminists to explore the often complicated ways in which women’s experiences, self-understandings, comportment and capacities are constructed in and by the power relations which they are seeking to transform. The idea that modern power is involved in producing rather than simply repressing individuals has also played a part in a controversial move within feminism away from traditional liberationist political orientations. Eschewing a liberationist political program which aims for total emancipation from power, Foucauldian-influenced feminism concentrates on exposing the localized forms that gender power relations take at the micro-political level in order to determine concrete possibilities for resistance and social change. In pursuing this project, feminist scholars have drawn on Foucault’s analysis of the productive dimension of disciplinary power which is exercised outside of the narrowly defined political realm in order to examine the workings of power in women’s everyday lives. Some feminists have also found Foucault’s contention that the body is the principal site of power in modern society useful in their explorations of the social control of women through their bodies and sexuality. Finally, feminists have taken up Foucault’s analytic of power/knowledge, with its emphasis on the criteria by which claims to knowledge are legitimated, in order to develop a theory which avoids generalizing from the experiences of Western, white, heterosexual, middle-class feminisms. Drawing on Foucault’s questioning of fixed essences and his relativist notion of truth, feminists have sought to create a theoretical space for the articulation of hitherto marginalized subject positions, political perspectives and interests. While there is considerable overlap between Foucault’s analytic of power/knowledge and feminist concerns, his work has also been subject to strong criticism by feminists. This more critical body of work takes issue with precisely those aspects of Foucault’s conception of power that Foucauldian feminists have found useful. The most commonly cited feminist objections center around two issues: his view of subjectivity as constructed by power and his failure to outline the norms which inform his critical enterprise. Nancy Fraser argues that the problem with Foucault’s claim that forms of subjectivity are constituted by relations of power is that it leaves no room for resistance to power. If individuals are simply the effects of power, mere ‘docile bodies’ shaped by power, then it becomes difficult to explain who resists power. Thus, Fraser finds Foucault’s assertion that power always generates resistance incoherent. She argues, moreover, that Foucault’s refusal to articulate independently justified norms which would enable him to distinguish acceptable from unacceptable forms of power means that he cannot answer crucial questions about why domination ought to be resisted. According to Fraser, ‘only with the introduction of normative notions could he begin to tell us what is wrong with the modern power/knowledge regime and why we ought to oppose it’ (Fraser 1989: 29). In Fraser’s view, Foucault’s normatively neutral stance on power limits the value of his work for feminism because it fails to provide the normative resources required to criticize structures of domination and to guide programs for social change. Echoing and extending Fraser’s criticisms, Nancy Hartsock contends that Foucault’s questioning of the categories of subjectivity and agency should be treated with suspicion by feminists. She asks: ‘Why is it that just at the moment when so many of us who have been silenced begin to demand the right to name ourselves, to act as subjects rather than objects of history, that just then the concept of subjecthood becomes problematic?’ (Hartsock 1990: 164). Like Fraser, Hartsock finds Foucault’s conception of modern power problematic in so far as it reduces individuals to ‘docile bodies’ rather than subjects with the capacity to resist power. She claims that Foucault’s understanding of the subject as an effect of power threatens the viability of a feminist politics because it denies the liberatory subject and, thus, condemns women to perpetual oppression. Hartsock argues, moreover, that Foucault’s rejection of the Enlightenment belief that truth is intrinsically opposed to power (and, therefore, inevitably plays a liberating role) undermines the emancipatory political aims of feminism. By insisting on the mutually conditioning operations of knowledge and power, Hartsock contends that Foucault denies the possibility of liberatory knowledge; that is, he denies the possibility that increased and better knowledge of patriarchal power can lead to liberation from oppression. For this reason she believes that his work is incompatible with the fundamentally emancipatory political orientation of feminism. These criticisms of Foucault are directed at the conception of the subject and power developed in his middle years. Some feminists have argued, however, that in his late work Foucault modifies his theoretical perspective in ways that make it more useful to the project of articulating a coherent feminist ethics and politics. Feminist responses to Foucault’s late work are discussed in the final section.

3. Power, the Body and Sexuality

There are a number of aspects of Foucault’s analysis of the relations between power, the body and sexuality that have stimulated feminist interest. Firstly, Foucault’s analyses of the productive dimensions of disciplinary powers which is exercised outside the narrowly defined political domain overlap with the feminist project of exploring the micropolitics of personal life and exposing the mechanics of patriarchal power at the most intimate levels of women’s experience. Secondly, Foucault’s treatment of power and its relation to the body and sexuality has provided feminist social and political theorists with some useful conceptual tools for the analysis of the social construction of gender and sexuality and contributed to the critique of essentialism within feminism. Finally, Foucault’s identification of the body as the principal target of power has been used by feminists to analyze contemporary forms of social control over women’s bodies and minds.

Rather than focusing on the centralized sources of societal power in agencies such as the economy or the state, Foucault’s analysis of power emphasizes micro level power relations. Foucault argues that, since modern power operates in a capillary fashion throughout the social body, it is best grasped in its concrete and local effects and in the everyday practices which sustain and reproduce power relations. This emphasis on the everyday practices through which power relations are reproduced has converged with the feminist project of analyzing the politics of personal relations and altering gendered power relations at the most intimate levels of experience ‘in the institutions of marriage, motherhood and compulsory heterosexuality, in the ‘private’ relations between the sexes and in the everyday rituals and regimens that govern women’s relationships to themselves and their bodies (Sawicki 1998: 93). Nancy Fraser notes that Foucault’s work gives renewed impetus to what is often referred to as ‘the politics of everyday life’ in so far as it provides ‘the empirical and conceptual basis for treating phenomena such as sexuality, the school, psychiatry, medicine and social science as political phenomena.’ She argues that because Foucault’s approach to the analysis of power sanctions the treatment of problems in these areas as political problems it ‘widens the arena within which people may collectively confront, understand and try to change the character of their lives’ (Fraser 1989: 26). One of Foucault’s most fertile insight into the workings of power at the micro-political level is his identification of the body and sexuality as the direct locus of social control. Foucault insists on the historical specificity of the body. It is this emphasis on the body as directly targeted and formed by historically variable regimes of bio-power that has made Foucault’s version of poststructuralist theory the most attractive to feminist social and political theorists. The problem of how to conceive of the body without reducing its materiality to a fixed biological essence has been one of the key issues for feminist theory. At a fundamental level, a notion of the body is central to the feminist analysis of the oppression of women because biological differences between the sexes are the foundation that has served to ground and legitimize gender inequality. By means of an appeal to ahistorical biological characteristics, the idea that women are inferior to men is naturalized and legitimized. This involves two related conceptual moves. Firstly, women’s bodies are judged inferior with reference to norms and ideals based on men’s physical capacities and, secondly, biological functions are collapsed into social characteristics. While traditionally men have been thought to be capable of transcending the level of the biological through the use of their rational faculties, women have tended to be defined entirely it terms of their physical capacities for reproduction and motherhood. In an effort to avoid this conflation of the social category of woman with biological functions (essentialism), earlier forms of feminism developed a theory of social construction based on the distinction between sex and gender. The sex/gender distinction represents an attempt by feminists to sever the connection between the biological category of sex and the social category of gender. According to this view of social construction, gender is the cultural meaning that comes to be contingently attached to the sexed body. Once gender is understood as culturally constructed it is possible to avoid the essentialist idea that gender derives from the natural body in any one way. However, while the distinction between ahistorical biological sexes and culturally constructed gender roles challenges the notion that a woman’s biological makeup is her social destiny, it entails a problematic dissociation of culturally constructed genders from sexed bodies. The effect of this dissociation is that the sexed body comes to be seen as irrelevant to an individual’s gendered cultural identity. It is this disconcerting consequence of drawing a distinction between sex and gender that has led some feminists to appropriate Foucault’s theory of the body and sexuality. In the first volume of The History of Sexuality, Foucault develops an anti-essentialist account of the sexual body, which, however, doesn’t deny its materiality. At the heart of Foucault’s history of sexuality is an analysis of the production of the category of sex and its function in regimes of power aimed at controlling the sexual body. Foucault argues that the construct of a supposedly ‘natural’ sex functions to disguise the productive operation of power in relation to sexuality: ‘The notion of sex brought about a fundamental reversal; it made it possible to invert the representation of the relationships of power to sexuality, causing the latter to appear, not in its essential and positive relation to power, but as being rooted in a specific and irreducible urgency which power tries as best it can to dominate’ (Foucault 1978: 155). Foucault’s claim here is that the relationship between power and sexuality is misrepresented when sexuality is viewed as an unruly natural force that power simply opposes, represses or constrains. Rather, the phenomenon of sexuality should be understood as constructed through the exercise of power relations. Drawing on Foucault’s account of the historical construction of sexuality and the part played by the category of sex in this construction, feminists have been able to rethink gender, not as the cultural meanings that are attached to a pregiven sex, but, in Judith Butler’s formulation, ‘as the … cultural means by which “sexed nature” or “a natural sex” is produced and established as…prior to culture’ (Butler 1990: 7). Following Foucault, Butler argues that the notion of a ‘natural’ sex that is prior to culture and socialization is implicated in the production and maintenance of gendered power relations because it naturalizes the regulatory idea of a supposedly natural heterosexuality and, thus, reinforces the reproductive constraints on sexuality. In addition to his anti-essentialist view of the body and sexuality, Foucault insists on the corporeal reality of bodies. He argues that this rich and complex reality is oversimplified by the biological category of sex which groups together in an ‘artificial unity’ a range of disparate and unrelated biological functions and bodily pleasures. Thus, in The History of Sexuality, Foucault explains that: ‘The purpose of the present study is in fact to show how deployments of power are directly connected to the body – to bodies, functions, physiological processes, sensations, and pleasures; far from the body having to be effaced, what is needed is to make it visible through an analysis in which the biological and the historical are not consecutive to one another … but are bound together in an increasingly complex fashion in accordance with the development of the modern technologies of power that take life as their objective. Hence I do not envisage a “history of mentalities” that would take account of bodies only through the manner in which they have been perceived and given meaning and value; but a “history of bodies” and the manner in which what is most material and most vital in them has been invested’ (Foucault 1978: 151-2). Because Foucault’s anti-essentialist account of the body is nevertheless attentive to the materiality of bodies it has been attractive to feminists concerned to expose the processes through which the female body is transformed into a feminine body. Thus, in claiming that the body is directly targeted and ‘produced’ by power and, thus, unknowable outside of its cultural significations, Foucault breaks down the distinction between a natural sex and a culturally constructed gender. Elizabeth Grosz argues that, unlike some other versions of poststructuralist theory which analyze the representation of bodies without due regard for their materiality, Foucault’s insistence on the corporeal reality of the body which is directly molded by social and historical forces avoids the traditional gendered opposition between the body and culture. For this reason, she believes that, while Foucault fails to consider the issue of sexual difference, his thought may contribute to the feminist project of exploring the relation between social power and the production of sexually differentiated bodies (Grosz 1994). Not all feminists, however, are comfortable with Foucault’s anti-naturalistic rhetoric. Kate Soper argues that by jettisoning the idea of a natural body, Foucault’s anti-essentialism might ‘lend itself to the forces of reaction in so far as it offers itself as a pre-emptive warning against any politics which aims at the removal of the constraining and distorting effects of cultural stereotyping’ (Soper 1993: 33). Here Soper articulates a common feminist concern about the potentially conservative political consequences of Foucault’s version of social constructivism. By contrast, Lois McNay argues that although Foucault’s model of the relation between the body and power precludes the view that the body and sexuality might be liberated from power, it leaves room for the possibility that existing forms of sexuality and gendered power relations might be transformed. According to McNay, Foucault’s history of sexuality ‘exposes the contingent and socially determined nature of sexuality and, thereby, frees the body from the regulatory fiction of heterosexuality and opens up new realms in which bodily pleasures can be explored’ (McNay 1992: 30). In another fruitful engagement with Foucault’s work on the body and power, feminist scholars have embraced the notion of normalizing-disciplinary power for its potential to shed light on the social control of women in a contemporary context. For example, Sandra Bartky’s appropriation of Foucault takes the form of a detailed examination of the subjection of the female body to disciplinary practices such as dieting, exercise and beauty regimens that produce a form of embodiment which conforms to prevailing norms of feminine beauty and attractiveness. On her account these disciplinary practices subjugate women, not by taking power away from them, but by generating skills and competencies that depend on the maintenance of a stereotypical form of feminine identity. Bartky suggests that women’s seemingly willing acceptance of the various norms and practices that promote their larger disempowerment is due to the fact that challenging ‘the patriarchal construction of the female body… may call into question that aspect of personal identity that is tied to the development of a sense of competence’ (Bartky 1988: 77; Sawicki 1994: 293). In a similar vein, Susan Bordo brings Foucauldian insights to bear in her analysis of predominantly female eating disorders such as anorexia nervosa and bulimia (Bordo 1988). Following Foucault, she argues that these disorders might be understood as disciplinary technologies of the body. The anorexic woman takes to an extreme the practices to which women subject themselves in their efforts to conform to cultural norms of an ideal feminine form. In the figure of the anorexic Bordo sees an association of power and self-control with the achievement of a potentially fatal slenderness. For Bordo, this association is a stark illustration of the way in which disciplinary power is linked to the social control of women. Disciplinary technologies are particularly effective forms of social control because they take hold of individuals at the level of their bodies, gestures, desires and habits to create individuals who are attached to and, thus, the unwitting agents of their own subjection. In other words, disciplinary power fashions individuals who ‘voluntarily’ subject themselves to self-surveillance and self-normalization. Thus, like Bartky, Bordo finds Foucault’s work useful to explain women’s collusion with patriarchal standards of femininity.

4. Subjectivity, Identity and Resistance

Although the use that Bartky and Bordo make of Foucault’s insights into the operation of normalizing disciplinary power is a corrective to his failure to recognize the gendered nature of disciplinary techniques, some feminists have argued that their work reproduces a problematic dimension of Foucault’s account of modern disciplinary power. Jana Sawicki explains that the problem faced by this kind of feminist appropriation of Foucault is its inability to account for effective resistance to disciplinary practices. Like Foucault, Bartky and Bordo envisage modern disciplinary power as ubiquitous and inescapable. Foucauldian power reduces individuals to docile and subjected bodies and thus seems to deny the possibility of freedom and resistance. According to Sawicki, ‘Bartky and Bordo have portrayed forms of patriarchal power that insinuate themselves within subjects so profoundly that it is difficult to imagine how they (we) might escape. They describe our complicity in patriarchal practices of victimization without providing suggestions about how we might resist it’ (Sawicki 1988: 293).

Feminist critics of Foucault like Nancy Hartsock argue that his failure to develop an adequate notion of resistance is a consequence of his reduction of individuals to effects of power relations. Hartsock echoes a widespread feminist concern that Foucault’s understanding of power reduces individuals to docile bodies, to victims of disciplinary technologies or objects of power rather than subjects with the capacity to resist (Hartsock 1990: 171-2). The problem for Hartsock and others is that without the assumption of a subject or individual that pre-exists its construction by technologies of power, it becomes difficult to explain who resists power? If there are no ready-made individuals with interests that are defined prior to their construction by power, then what is the source of our resistance? Some feminists have responded to these concerns by claiming that, although Foucault rejects the idea that resistance can be grounded in a subject or self who pre-exists its construction by power, he does not deny the possibility of resistance to power. In his later work Foucault explains that his theory of power implies both the possibility and existence of forms of resistance. According to Foucault: ‘there are no relations of power without resistances; the latter are all the more real and effective because they are formed right at the point where relations of power are exercised’ (Foucault 1980: 142). Foucauldian resistance neither predates the power it opposes nor issues from a site external to power. Rather it relies upon and grows out of the situation against which it struggles. Foucault’s understanding of resistance as internal to power refuses the utopian dream of achieving total emancipation from power. In the place of total liberation Foucault envisages more specific, local struggles against forms of subjection aimed at loosening the constraints on possibilities for action. He suggests that a key struggle in the present is against the tendency of normalizing-disciplinary power to tie individuals to their identities in constraining ways. It is, Foucault contends, because disciplinary practices limit the possibilities of what we can be by fixing our identities that the object of resistance must be ‘to refuse what we are’ – that is, to fracture the limitations imposed on us by normalizing identity categories. Foucault’s notion of resistance as consisting, at least in the first instance, in a refusal of fixed, stable or naturalized identity has been met with some suspicion by feminists. Many feminists are reluctant to abandon a commitment ‘to some essential, liberatory subject rooted in “women’s experience” (or nature), as the starting point for emancipatory theory’ (Sawicki 1994: 289). For Hartsock, Foucault’s perspective functions to preclude the possibility of feminist politics which, she claims, is necessarily an identity-based politics grounded in a conception of the identity, needs and interests of women. Some of the most exciting feminist appropriations of Foucault converge around this issue of identity and its role in politics. Judith Butler argues that Foucault’s work provides feminists with the resources to think beyond the strictures of identity politics. According to Butler, feminists should be wary of the idea that politics needs to be based on a fixed idea of women’s nature and interests. She argues that: ‘The premature insistence on a stable subject of feminism, understood as a seamless category of women, inevitably generates multiple refusals to accept the category. These domains of exclusion reveal the coercive and regulatory consequences of that construction, even when the construction has been elaborated for emancipatory purposes. Indeed, the fragmentation within feminism and the paradoxical opposition to feminism from “women” whom feminism claims to represent suggest the necessary limits of identity politics’ (Butler 1990: 4). Butler discerns at least two problems in the attempt to ground politics in an essential, naturalized female identity. She argues that the assertion of the category ‘woman’ as the ground for political action excludes, marginalizes and inevitably misrepresents those who do not recognize themselves within the terms of that identity. For Butler the appeal to identity both overlooks the differences in power and resources between, for example, third world and Western women, and tends to make these differences a source of conflict rather than a source of strength. She claims, moreover, that a feminist identity politics that appeals to a fixed ‘feminist subject,’ ‘presumes, fixes and constrains the very ‘subjects’ that it hopes to represent and liberate’ (Butler 1990: 148). In Foucault’s presentation of identity as an effect Butler sees new possibilities for feminist political practice, possibilities that are precluded by positions that take identity to be fixed or foundational. One of the distinct advantages of Foucault’s understanding of the constituted character of identity is, in Butler’s view, that it enables feminism to politicize the processes through which stereotypical forms of masculine and feminine identity are produced. Butler’s own work represents an attempt to explore these processes for the purposes of loosening the heterosexual restrictions on identity formation. In pursuing this project she argues that Foucault’s characterization of identity as constructed does not mean that it is completely determined or artificial and arbitrary. Rather, a Foucauldian approach to identity production demonstrates the role played by cultural norms in regulating how we embody or perform our gender identities. According to Butler, gender identity is simply ‘a set of repeated acts within a highly rigid regulatory frame that congeal over time to produce the appearance of substance, of a natural sort of being’ (Butler 1990: 33). The regulatory power of the norms that govern our performances of gender is both disguised and strengthened by the assumption that gendered identities are natural and essential. Thus, for Butler, one of the most important feminist aims should be to challenge dominant gender norms by exposing the contingent acts that produce the appearance of an underlying ‘natural’ gender identity. Against the claim that feminist politics is necessarily an identity politics, Butler suggests that: ‘If identities were no longer fixed as the premises of a political syllogism, and politics no longer understood as a set of practices derived from the alleged interests that belong to a set of ready-made subjects, a new configuration of politics would surely emerge from the ruins of the old’ (Butler 1990: 149). Butler envisages this new configuration of politics as an anti-foundational coalition politics that would accept the need to act within the tensions produced by contradiction, fragmentation and diversity. While Butler’s political vision emphasises strategies for resisting and subverting identity, Wendy Brown argues that contemporary feminism should be wary of both identity politics and the ‘politics of resistance’ associated with the work of Foucault and Butler. Brown argues that identity politics entails a commitment to the authenticity of women’s experiences which functions to secure political authority. At the same time, however, most feminists wish to acknowledge that feminine identity and experience are constructed under patriarchal conditions. Brown suggests that this inconsistency in feminist political thought – acknowledging social construction on the one hand and attempting to preserve a realm of authentic experience free from construction on the other – might be explained by the fact that feminists are reluctant to give up the claim to moral authority that the appeal to the truth and innocence of woman’s experience secures. By appealing to the silenced truth of women’s experience, feminists have been able to condemn the repressive effects of patriarchal power. For Brown the attempt to establish moral authority by asserting the hidden truth of women’s experience and identity represents a rejection of politics. She argues that this kind of move in feminism: ‘… betrays a preference for extrapolitical terms and practices: for Truth (unchanging and incontestable) over politics (flux, contest, instability); for certainty and security (safety; immutability, privacy) over freedom (vulnerability, publicity); for discoveries (science) over decisions (judgments); for separable subjects armed with established rights over unwieldy and shifting pluralities adjudicating for themselves and their future on the basis of nothing more than their own habits and arguments’ (Brown 1995: 37). Brown finds a similar failure to meet the challenges confronting contemporary politics in the ‘politics of resistance’ inspired by Foucault. As she sees it, the problem with resistance-as-politics is that it does not ‘contain a critique, a vision, or grounds for organized collective efforts to enact either… [resistance] goes nowhere in particular, has no inherent attachments and hails no particular vision’ (Brown 1995: 49). In light of these inadequacies, Brown calls for the politics of resistance to be supplemented by a political practices aimed at cultivating ‘political spaces for posing and questioning political norms [and] for discussing the nature of “the good” for women’ (Brown 1995: 49). The creation of such democratic spaces for discussion will, Brown argues, contribute to teaching us how to have public conversations with each other and enable us to argue from our diverse perspectives about a vision of the common good (“what I want for us”) rather than from some assumed common identity (“who I am”).

5. Freedom, Power and Politics

The key problems identified by feminist critics as preventing too close a convergence between Foucault’s work and feminism – his reduction of social agents to docile bodies and the lack of normative guidance in his model of power and resistance – are indirectly addressed by Foucault in his late work on ethics. Whereas in his earlier genealogies Foucault emphasized the processes through which individuals were subjected to power, in his later writings he turned his attention to practices of self-constitution or ‘practices of freedom’ which he called ethics.

The idea of practicing freedom is central to Foucault’s exploration and analysis of the ethical practices of Antiquity. It refers to the ways in which individuals in Antiquity were led to exercise power over themselves in the attempt to constitute or transform their identity and behavior in the light of specific goals. What interests Foucault about these ethical practices and ancient ‘arts of existence’ is the kind of freedom they presuppose. He suggests that the freedom entailed in practicing the art of self-fashioning consists neither in resisting power nor in seeking to liberate the self from regulation. Rather, it entails the active and conscious arrogation of the power of regulation by individuals for the purposes of ethical and aesthetic self-transformation. In her reflections on Foucault’s positive account of freedom, Sawicki notes that it offers a more affirmative alternative to his earlier emphasis on the reactive strategy of resistance to normalization (Sawicki 1998: 104). For the late Foucault, individuals are still understood to be shaped by their embeddedness in power relations, which means that their capacities for freedom and autonomous action are necessarily limited. However, he suggests that by actively deploying the techniques and models of self-formation that are ‘proposed, suggested, imposed’ upon them by society (Foucault 1988b: 291), individuals may creatively transform themselves and in the process supplant the normalization operating in pernicious modern technologies of the self (Sawicki 1998: 105). Sawicki sees a link between Foucault’s notion of practices of freedom and Donna Haraway’s call for a cyborg politics that emphasizes the conscious creation of marginalized subjects capable of resisting domination. In a more critical vein, feminists like Jean Grimshaw and McNay argue that Foucault’s promising turn to a more active model of subjectivity still leaves crucial issues unresolved. In Grimshaws formulation, Foucault evades the vital question of ‘when forms of self-discipline or self-surveillance can … be seen as exercises of autonomy or self-creation, or when they should be seen, rather, as forms of discipline to which the self is subjected, and by which autonomy is constrained’ (Grimshaw 1993: 66; McNay 1992: 74). In response to this criticism, Moya Lloyd suggests that it is Foucault’s earlier notion of genealogy as critique which allows us to distinguish between autonomous practices of the self and technologies of normalization. For Lloyd, the Foucauldian practice of critique – a practice which involves the effort to recognize, decipher and problematize the ways in which the self is produced – generates possibilities for alternative practices of the self and, thus, for more autonomous experiments in self-formation. Lloyd explains that ‘it is not the activity of self-fashioning in itself that is crucial. It is the way in which that self-fashioning, when allied to critique, can produce sites of contestation over the meanings and contours of identity, and over the ways in which certain practices are mobilized’ (Lloyd: 1988: 250). With the introduction of a notion of freedom in his late work, Foucault also clarifies the normative grounds for his opposition to certain forms of power. In his discussion of ethics, Foucault suggests that individuals are not limited to reacting against power, but may alter power relationships in ways that expand their possibilities for action. Thus, Foucault’s work on ethics can be linked to his concern to counter domination, that is, forms of power that limit the possibilities for the autonomous development of the self’s capacities. By distinguishing power relations that are mutable, flexible and reversible, from situations of domination in which resistance is foreclosed, Foucault seeks to encourage practices of liberty ‘that will allow us to play … games of power with as little domination as possible’ (Foucault 1988b: 298). Sawicki argues that Foucault’s notion of practices of freedom has the potential to broaden our understanding of what it is to engage in emancipatory politics. In Foucault’s conception of freedom as a practice aimed at minimizing domination, Sawicki discerns an implicit critique of traditional emancipatory politics which tends to conceive of liberty as a state free from every conceivable social constraint. Following Foucault, Sawicki argues that the problem with this notion of emancipation is that it does not go far enough: ‘Reversing power positions without altering relations of power is rarely liberating. Neither is it a sufficient condition of liberation to throw off the yoke of domination’ (Sawicki 1998: 102). If, as Foucault suggests, freedom exists only in being exercised and is, thus, a permanent struggle against what will otherwise be done to and for individuals, it is dangerous to imagine it as a state of being that can be guaranteed by laws and institutions. By insisting that liberation from domination is not enough to guarantee freedom, Foucault points to the importance of establishing new patterns of behaviour, attitudes and cultural forms that work to empower the vulnerable and, in this way, to ensure that mutable relations of power do not congeal into states of domination. Thus, for Sawicki, the value of Foucault’s late work for feminism consists in the conceptual tools that it provides to think beyond traditional emancipatory theories and practices.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bartky, S., ‘Foucault, femininity and the modernization of patriarchal power’ in I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds), Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Bordo, S., ‘Anorexia Nervosa: Psychopathology as the Crystallization of Culture’ in I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds) Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Brown, W., ‘Postmodern Exposures, Feminist Hesitations’ in States of Injury: power and freedom in late modernity, Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1995.
  • Butler, J., Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity, NY: Routledge, 1990.
  • Butler, J., Bodies that Matter: On the Discursive Limits of “Sex”, NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Diamond, I. & Quinby, L., (eds.) Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • Dreyfus, H. and Rabinow, P., Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Sussex: The Harvester Press, 1982.
  • Foucault, M., Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison, trans. A. Sheridan, Harmondsworth: Peregrine, 1977.
  • Foucault, M., The History of Sexuality, translated by R. Hurley, Penguin Books, 1978.
  • Foucault, M., ‘Body/Power’ and ‘Truth and Power’ in C. Gordon (ed.) Michel Foucault: Power/Knowledge, U.K.: Harvester, 1980.
  • Foucault, M., ‘The subject and power’ in H. Dreyfus and P. Rabinow, Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1982.
  • Foucault, M., ‘What is Enlightenment?’ in The Foucault Reader, P. Rabinow (ed.) NY: Pantheon, 1984a.
  • Foucault, M., ‘On the genealogy of ethics: an overview of work in progress’ in The Foucault Reader, P. Rabinow (ed.) NY: Pantheon, 1984b.
  • Foucault, M., Politics, Philosophy, Culture: Interviews and Other Writings, 1977-1984, L. Kritzman (ed.), London: Routledge, 1988a.
  • Foucault, M., ‘The ethic of care for the self as a practice of freedom’ in J. Bernhauer and D. Rasmussen (eds), The Final Foucault, Cambridge: Mass.: MIT Press, 1988b.
  • Fraser, N., Unruly Practices: power, discourse and gender in contemporary social theory, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1989.
  • Grimshaw, J., ‘Practices of Freedom’ in Up Against Foucault, C. Ramazanoglu (ed.), London and NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Grosz, E., Volatile Bodies: Toward a Corporeal Feminism, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
  • Gutting, G., (ed.) The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Hacking, I., ‘The Archaeology of Knowledge’ in D. Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: a critical reader, NY: Basil Blackwell, 1986.
  • Hartsock, N., ‘Foucault on power: a theory for women?’ in L. Nicholson (ed.), Feminism/Postmodernism, London & NY: Routledge, 1990.
  • Hekman, S. (ed.) Feminist Interpretations of Michel Foucault, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania University Press, 1996.
  • Lloyd, M., ‘A Feminist Mapping of Foucauldian Politics’ in Feminism and Foucault: Reflections on Resistance, I. Diamond & L. Quinby (eds), Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1988.
  • McNay, L., Foucault: a critical introduction, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1994.
  • McNay, L., Foucault and Feminism: Power, Gender and the Self, Polity Press, 1992.
  • Ramazanoglu, C., Up Against Foucault: Explorations of Some Tensions Between Foucault and Feminism, London & NY: Routledge, 1993.
  • Rouse, J., ‘Power/Knowledge’ in Gary Gutting (ed) The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Sawicki, J., ‘Feminism and the Power of Discourse’ in J. Arac (ed.) After Foucault: Humanistic Knowledge, Postmodern Challenges, New Brunswick and London: Rutgers University Press, 1988, pp. 161-178.
  • Sawicki, J., ‘Foucault, feminism, and questions of identity’ in ed. G. Gutting, The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Sawicki, J., ‘Feminism, Foucault and “Subjects” of Power and Freedom’ in The Later Foucault: politics and philosophy, J. Moss (ed.), London; Thousand Oaks: Sage Publications, 1998.
  • Soper, K., ‘Productive contradictions’, Up Against Foucault: Explorations of Some Tensions Between Foucault and Feminism, London & NY: Routledge, 1993.

Author Information

Aurelia Armstrong
University of Queensland

Last updated: July 8, 2005 | Originally published: