The Frankfurt School and Critical Theory

The Frankfurt School, also known as the Institute of Social Research (Institut für Sozialforschung), is a social and political philosophical movement of thought located in Frankfurt am Main, Germany. It is the original source of what is known as Critical Theory. The Institute was founded, thanks to a donation by Felix Weil in 1923, with the aim of developing Marxist studies in Germany. The Institute eventually generated a specific school of thought after 1933 when the Nazis forced it to close and move to the United States, where it found hospitality at Columbia University, New York.

The academic influence of the “critical” method is far reaching in terms of educational institutions in which such tradition is taught and in terms of the problems it addresses. Some of its core issues involve the critique of modernities and of capitalist society, the definition of social emancipation and the perceived pathologies of society. Critical theory provides a specific interpretation of Marxist philosophy and reinterprets some of its central economic and political notions such as commodification, reification, fetishization and critique of mass culture.

Some of the most prominent figures of the first generation of Critical Theorists are Max Horkheimer (1895-1973), Theodor Adorno (1903-1969), Herbert Marcuse (1898-1979), Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), Friedrich Pollock (1894-1970), Leo Lowenthal (1900-1993), Eric Fromm (1900-1980). Since the 1970s, the second generation has been led by Jürgen Habermas who has greatly contributed to fostering the dialogue between the so called “continental” and “analytical” tradition. This phase has also been substantiated by the works of Klaus Günther, Hauke Brunkhorst, Ralf Dahrendorf, Gerhard Brandt, Alfred Schmidt, Claus Offe, Oskar Negt, Albrecht Wellmer and Ludwig von Friedeburg, Lutz Wingert, Josef Früchtl, Lutz-Bachman. More generally, it is possible to speak of a “third generation” of critical theorists, symbolically represented in Germany by the influential work of Axel Honneth. The philosophical impact of the school has been worldwide. Early in the first decade of the twenty-first century, a fourth generation of critical theory scholars emerged and coalesced around Rainer Forst.

The “first generation” of critical theorists was largely occupied with the functional and conceptual re-qualification of Hegel’s dialectics. After Habermas, preference has been assigned to the understanding of the conditions of action coordination through the underpinning of the conditions of validity for speech-acts. The third generation, then, following the works of Honneth, turned back to Hegel’s philosophy and in particular to Hegel’s notion of “recognition” as a cognitive and pre-linguistic sphere grounding intersubjectivity.

Table of Contents

  1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background
  2. What is Critical Theory?
    1. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique
    2. The Theory/Practice Problem
    3. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents
  3. Concluding Thoughts
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background

Felix Weil’s father Herman made his fortune exporting grain from Argentina to Europe. In 1923 Felix convinced him to spend some of it financing an institute devoted to the study of society in the light of the Marxist tradition. At this point, Felix could not have foreseen that in the 1960s the University of Frankfurt, to which the institute was attached, would receive the epithet “Karl Marx University”. The initial idea of an independently founded institute was conceived to provide for studies on the labor movement and the origins of anti-Semitism, which at the time were being ignored in German intellectual and academic life

Not long after its inception, the Institute for Social Research was formally recognized by the Ministry of Education as an entity attached to Frankfurt University. The first official appointed director was Carl Grünberg (1923-9), a Marxist legal and political professor at the University of Vienna. His contribution to the Institute was the creation of an historical archive mainly oriented to the study of the labor movement (also known as the Grünberg Archiv).

In 1930, Max Horkheimer succeeded Grünberg. While continuing the Marxist inspiration, Horkheimer interpreted the Institute’s mission to be more directed towards an interdisciplinary integration of the social sciences. Additionally, the Grünberg Archiv ceased to publish, and instead a different official organ was launched which was to have a much greater impact: the Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung. While never officially supporting any party, the Institute entertained intensive research exchanges with the Soviet Union.

It was under Horkheimer’s leadership that members of the Institute were able to address a wide variety of economic, social, political and aesthetic topics, ranging from empirical analysis to philosophical theorization. Different interpretations of Marxism and its historical applications explain some of the hardest confrontations on economic themes within the Institute, such as the case of Pollock’s criticism of Grossman’s standard view on the pauperization of capitalism. This particular confrontation led Grossman to leave the Institute. Pollock’s critical reinterpretation of Marx also received support from intellectuals who greatly contributed to the later development of the School: for instance, Leo Lowenthal, Theodor Wiesengrund-Adorno and Erich Fromm. In particular, with Fromm’s development of a psychoanalytic trend at the Institute and with an influential philosophical contribution by Hokheimer, it became clear how under his directorship the Institute faced a drastic turning point characterizing all its future endeavors. In the following, I shall briefly introduce some of the main research patterns introduced by Fromm and Horkheimer respectively.

From the beginning, psychoanalysis in the Frankfurt School was conceived in terms of a reinterpretation of Freud and Marx. Its consideration in the School was clearly due to Horkheimer, who encouraged his researchers to direct their attention to the subject. It was Fromm, nevertheless, who best produced an advancement of the discipline; his central aim was to provide, through a synthesis of Marxism and psychoanalysis, “the missing link between ideological superstructure and socio-economic base” (Jay 1966, p. 92). There was a radical shift in the conjunction of the School’s interests and psychoanalysis with the coeval entrance of Adorno and Fromm’s departure in the late 1930s. Nevertheless, the School retained psychoanalysis, and in particular Freud’s instinct theory, as an area of interest. This can be seen in Adorno’s later paper “Social Science and Sociological Tendencies in Psychoanalysis” (1946), as well as Marcuse’s book Eros and Civilization (1955). The School’s interest in psychoanalysis was characterized by the total abandonment of Marxism as well as by a progressive interest into the relation of psychoanalysis with social change and the maintenance of Fromm’s insight into the psychic (or even psychotic) role of the family. This interest became crucial in empirical studies in 1940, which culminated in Adorno’s co-authored work The Authoritarian Personality (1950).  The goal of this work was to explore, on the basis of submission of a questionnaire, a “new anthropological type” – the authoritarian personality (Adorno et al. 1950, quoted in Jay 1996, p. 239). Such a character was found to have specific traits, such as, among others: compliance with conventional values, non-critical thinking, an absence of introspectiveness.

(As pointed out by Jay: “Perhaps some of the confusion about this question was a product of terminological ambiguity. As a number of commentators have pointed out, there is an important distinction that should be drawn between authoritarianism and totalitarianism [emphasis added]. Wilhelminian and Nazi Germany, for example, were fundamentally dissimilar in their patterns of obedience. What The Authoritarian Personality was really studying was the character type of a totalitarian rather than an authoritarian society. Thus, it should have been no surprise to learn that this new syndrome was fostered by a familial crisis in which traditional paternal authority was under fire” (Jay 1996, p. 247).)

Horkheimer’s leadership provided a very distinct methodological direction and philosophical grounding to the Institute’s research interests. Against the so-called Lebensphilosophie (philosophy of life), he criticized the fetishism of subjectivity and the lack of consideration for the materialist conditions of life. Furthermore, arguing against Cartesian and Kantian philosophy, he attempted to rejoin all dichotomies – like those between consciousness and being, theory and practice, fact and value – through the use of dialectical mediation. Differently from Hegelism or Marxism though, dialectics for Horkheimer amounted to neither a metaphysical principle nor a historical praxis; it was not intended as a methodological instrument. On the contrary, Horkheimer’s dialectics functioned as the battleground for overcoming categorical fixities and oppositions. From this descended Horkheimer’s criticism of orthodox Marxism which dichotomized the opposition between productive structures and ideological superstructure, or positivism’s naïve separation of social facts from their social interpretation.

In 1933, due to the Nazi takeover, the Institute temporarily transferred first to Geneva and then in 1935 to New York and Columbia University. Two years later Horkheimer published the ideological manifesto of the School in his  “Traditional and Critical Theory” ([1937] 1976), where some of the already anticipated topics were addressed, such as the practical and critical turn of theory. In 1938 Adorno joined the Institute after spending time at Merton College, Oxford as an “advanced student.” He was invited by Horkheimer to join the Princeton Radio Research Project together with Lazarsfeld. Gradually, Adorno assumed a preponderant intellectual role in the School, culminating in the co-publication, with Horkheimer, of one of the milestones of Critical Theory: Dialectic of Enlightenment in 1947. During this time, while Germany was under Nazi seizure, the Institute remained the only free voice publishing in German. The backlash of this choice, though, was a prolonged isolation from American academic life and intellectual debate, a situation which Adorno appealed against iconoclastically as “a message in the bottle” for the lack of a public target. According to Wiggershaus: “The Institute disorientation in the late 1930s made the balancing acts it had always had to perform, for example in relation to its academic environment, even more difficult. The seminars were virtually discussion groups for the Institute’s associates, and American students only rarely took part in them” (1995, p. 251).

Interestingly, one of the School’s major topics of study was Nazism. This led to two different approaches in the School. One was guided by Neumann, Gurland and Kirchheimer and addressed mainly legal and political issues on the basis of economic substructures. The other, guided by Horkheimer, focused on psychological irrationalism as a source of obedience and domination (see Jay 1996, p. 166).

In 1941, Horkheimer moved to Pacific Palisades, near Los Angeles. He built himself a bungalow near other German intellectuals, among whom were Bertold Brecht and Thomas Mann, and those working for the film industry or aiming at doing so (Wiggershaus 1995, p. 292). Other fellows like Marcuse, Pollock and Adorno followed shortly, whereas some remained in New York. Only Benjamin refused to leave Europe and, while attempting to cross the border between France and Spain at Port Bou, committed suicide in 1940. Some months later Arendt also crossed the border there, passing on to Adorno Benjamin’s last writing, “Theses on the Philosophy of History”.

The internal division of the School between its bases in New York and California, was accompanied by a progressive distinction of research programs led respectively by Pollock on anti-Semitism from the east coast, culminating in a four-volume work titled Studies in Anti-Semitism as well as an international conference in 1944; and a trend of studies on dialectics from the west coast led by Horkheimer and Adorno. Even during these years the latter engaged in the study of anti-semitic tendencies as several publications showed, such as The Authoritarian Personality or Studies in Prejudice. After this period, only few devoted supporters of the School remained there: Horkheimer himself, Pollock, Adorno, Lowenthal, and Weil. In 1946, however, the Institute was officially invited to rejoin Frankfurt University.

Returning to West Germany, Horkheimer presented his inaugural speech for the reopening of the institute on 14 November 1951, and one week later inaugurated the academic year as a new rector of Frankfurt University. Nevertheless what was once a lively intellectual community became a small team of a few but very busy people, with Horkheimer involved in the administration of the university and Adorno occupied with different projects and teachings. In addition, due to the maintenance of US citizenship, Adorno had to go back to California, where he earned his living from qualitative analysis research. From his side, Horkheimer attempted to attract back his former assistant Marcuse when the opportunity arose for a successor to Gadamer’s chair in Frankfurt, but neither this initiative nor further occasions were successful. Marcuse remained in the United States and was offered a full position by Brandeis University. Adorno returned to Germany in August 1953 and was soon involved again in empirical research combining quantitative and qualitative methods in the analysis of industrial relations for the Mannesmann Company. Then in 1955, he took over Horkheimer’s position as director of the Institute for Social Research, and on 1 July 1957 he was appointed full professor in philosophy and sociology. Adorno’s most innovative contribution was thought to be in the field of music theory and aesthetics, where some of his significant works included Philosophy of Modern Music (1949) and later “Vers une Musique Informelle”. In 1956 Horkheimer retired just as several important publications emerged, such as Marcuse’s Eros and Civilization and the essay collection Sociologica. These events gave character to the precise research phase reached by the “Frankfurt School” and “Critical Theory”.

The sixties – which saw famous student protests across Europe – also saw the publication of Adorno’s fundamental work, Negative Dialectics (1966). While far from being conceived either in terms of materialism or of metaphysics, this maintained important connections with an “open and non systemic” notion of dialectics. Marcuse had just published One-Dimensional Man (1964), introducing the notion of “educational dictatorship”, which implied that for the sake of liberation there was a need for the advancement of material conditions for the realization of a higher notion of “the good”. While Marcuse quite ostensibly sponsored the student upheavals, Adorno maintained a much more moderate and critical profile.

In 1956, Habermas joined the Institute as Adorno’s assistant, and was soon involved in an empirical and cooperative study under the title of Students and Politics. The text, though, was rejected by Horkheimer and did not come out, as it should have, in the series Frankfurt Contributions to Sociology, but only later in 1961 in the series Sociological Texts, by the publisher Luchterhand (see Wiggershaus 1995, p. 555). Horkheimer’s aversion towards Habermas was even more evident when he was refused supervision on his habilitation. In the event, Habermas undertook his habilitation, on the topic of the bourgeois’ public sphere, under the supervision of Abendroth at Marburg. As a result of his previous studies, in 1962 Habermas published The Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere, and in the same year, just before his habilitation and thanks to Gadamer, he was appointed as professor at Heidelberg. Besides his academic achievements, as an activist the young Habermas contributed towards a critical self-awareness of the socialist student groups around the country (the so-called SDS, Sozialistischer Deutscher Studentenbund). It was in this context that Habermas had to deal with the extremism of Rudi Dutschke, the students’ radical leader who criticized him for defending a non-effective emancipatory view. Discussion of the notion of “emancipation” has been at the center of the Frankfurt School’s political contention and of its philosophical debates. For the sake of clarification, it must be said that the German word “Befreiung”, covers a much wider semantic spectrum than “emancipation;” its most recurrent use in German philosophical works is that of “liberation”, which implies either a transformative or even a revolutionary action. Due to the plasticity of “Befreiung”, Critical Theory scholars engaged into a far reaching process of conceptual and political clarification; accordingly, it was principally against Dutschke’s positions that Habermas, during a public assembly, labeled such positions with the epitome “left-wing fascism”. How representative this expression is of Habermas’ views on students’ protests has often been a matter of contention, even though this reaction cannot be taken to encompass the complexity of the Habermasian position respect to the students’ liberation movement.

After his nomination in 1971 as a director of the Max Planck Institut for Research into the Conditions of Life in the Scientific-Technical World at Starnberg, Habermas left Frankfurt, returning there in 1981 after the completion of one of his masterpieces, The Theory of Communicative Action. This decade was crucial for the definition of the School’s research objectives as well as most of the fundamental research achievements of the so-called “second generation” of Frankfurt scholars. In his two-volume work The Theory of Communicative Action (1984b [1981]), Habermas provided a model of social complexities and action coordination based upon the original interpretation of classical social theorists as well as contemporary philosophy of language such as Searle’s Speech Acts theory. Within this work, it also became evident how the large amount of empirical work conducted by Habermas’ research team on topics concerning pathologies of society, moral development and so on, was elevated to a functionalistic model of society oriented to an emancipatory purpose. This normative force can be detected from within language itself, in what Habermas defined as the “unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions of mutual understanding”. Social action, therefore, whose coordination function relies on the same pragmatic presuppositions, gets connected to a justification for the validity of claims.

Habermas describes discourse theory as characterized by three types of validity-claims raised by communicative acts: it is only when the conditions of truth, rightness and sincerity are raised by speech-acts that social coordination is obtained. In contrast to the closeness of the German intellectual world characterizing most of the first generation of Frankfurt scholars, Habermas contributed greatly to bridge the continental and analytical traditions, integrating prospects belonging to American Pragmatism, Anthropology and Semiotics with Marxism and Critical Social Theory.

Just one year before Habermas’ retirement in 1994, the directorship of the Institut für Sozialforschung was assumed by Honneth. This inaugurated a new phase of Critical Theory, both in terms of generation (the third generation) and in terms of philosophical research as Honneth revived the Hegelian notion of recognition (Anerkennung) in social and political enquiry. Honneth began his collaboration with Habermas in 1984, when he was hired as assistant professor. After a period of academic appointments in Berlin and Konstanz, in 1996 he took Habermas’ chair in Frankfurt.

Honneth’s central tenet, the struggle for recognition, represents a leitmotiv finding wide discussion in The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts ([1986]), certainly one of Honneth’s greatest texts. This work is a mature expansion of what was partially addressed in his dissertation, a work published under the title of Critique of Power: Stages of Reflection of a Critical Social Theory (1991 [1985]). One of the core themes addressed by Honneth is that, contrary to what Critical Theory had emphasized so far, more attention should be paid to the notion of conflict in society and among societal groups. Such conflict represents the internal movement of historical advancement and human emancipation, falling therefore within the core theme of critical social theory. The so-called “struggle for recognition” is what best characterizes the fight for emancipation by social groups, and this fight represents a subjective negative experience of domination – a form of domination attached to misrecognitions. To come to terms with such negations of subjective forms of self-realization means to be able to transform social reality. Normatively, though, acts of social struggle activated by forms of misrecognition point to the role that recognition plays as a crucial criterion for grounding intersubjectivity.

Honneth inaugurated a new research phase in Critical Theory. Indeed, his communitarian turn of social theory has been paralleled by the work of some of his fellow scholars. Brunkhorst, for instance, in his Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community (2005 [2002]), canvasses a line of thought springing from the French Revolution of 1789 to contemporary times, which has been still insufficiently explored so far: the notion of fraternity. By the use of historical conceptual reconstruction and normative speculation, Brunkhorst presents the pathologies of the contemporary globalized world and the function that “solidarity” would play.

The confrontation with American debate initiated systematically by the work of Habermas has become then normal practice during the third generation of critical social theorists. Additionally since Habermas, the third generation has engaged in dialogue with French post-modern philosophers like Derrida, Baudrillard, Lyotard, and so forth, which according to Foucault are legitimate interpreters of some central instances of the Frankfurt School.

2. What is Critical Theory?

“What is ‘theory’?” asks Horkheimer in the opening of his essay Traditional and Critical Theory [1937]. The discussion about method, has been always a constant topic for those critical theorists who, since the beginning, have attempted to clarify the specificity of what it means for social theory to be “critical”. A primary broad distinction that Horkheimer drew was that of the difference in method between social theories, scientific theories and critical social theories. While the first two categories have been treated as instances of traditional theories, the latter connoted the methodology the Frankfurt School adopted.

Traditional theory, whether deductive or analytical, has always focused on coherency and on the strict distinction between theory and praxis. Along Cartesian lines, knowledge was treated as being grounded upon self-evident propositions, or at least upon propositions derivable from self-evident truths. Traditional theory proceeded to explain facts through the application of universal laws, so that by the subsumption of a particular into the universal, law was either confirmed or disconfirmed. A verificationist procedure of this kind was what positivism has considered to be the best explicatory account for the notion of praxis in scientific investigation. If one were to defend the view according to which scientific truths, in order to be considered so, should pass the test of empirical confirmation, then he would commit himself to the idea of an objective world. Knowledge would be simply a mirror of reality. This point is firmly refused by Critical Theory.

Under several aspects, what Critical Theory wants to reject in traditional theory is precisely this “picture theory” of language and knowledge widely presented originally in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus. According to such view, later abandoned by Wittgenstein himself, the logical form of propositions consists in “showing” a possible fact and in “saying” whether this is true or false. For example, the proposition “it rains today”, shows both the possibility of the fact that “it rains today”, and says that it is actually the case that “it rains today.” In order to check whether something is or is not the case, I have to verify empirically whether it occurs or not. This implies that the condition of truth and falsehood presupposes an objective structure of the world.

Horkheimer and his followers rejected the notion of objectivity in knowledge by pointing, among other things, to the fact that the object of knowledge is itself embedded into an historical and social process: “The facts which our sense present to us are socially preformed in two ways: through the historical character of the object perceived and through the historical character of the perceiving organ” (Horkheimer [1937] in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 242). Further, with a rather Marxian tone, Horkheimer noticed also that phenomenical objectivity is a myth because it is dependent upon “technological conditions” and that the latter is sensitive of the material conditions of production. Critical Theory thus wants to abandon naïve conceptions of knowledge-impartiality. Since intellectuals themselves are not disembodied entities reflecting from outside, knowledge can be obtained only from within a society of interdependent individuals.

If traditional theory is evaluated in accordance with its practical implications, then no practical consequences can be inferred. As a matter of fact, the finality of knowledge as a mirror of reality is mainly theoretically oriented and aimed at separating knowledge from action, speculation from social transformative enterprise. On the contrary, Critical Theory characterizes itself as a method which does not “fetishize” knowledge, considering it rather functional to ideology critique and social emancipation. In the light of such finalities, knowledge becomes social criticism, and the latter translates itself into social action, that is, into the transformation of reality.

Critical Theory has been strongly influenced by Hegel’s notion of dialectics, the latter aimed at reconciling socio-historical oppositions, as well as by Marx’s theory of economy and society and the limits of Hegel’s “bourgeois philosophy”. Critical Theory, indeed, has expanded Marxian criticisms of capitalist society, by formulating patterns of social emancipatory strategies. Whereas Hegel found that Rationality had finally come to terms with Reality through the birth of the modern national state (which in his eyes was the Prussian state), Marx insisted on the necessity of reading the development of rationality through history as a struggle of social classes. The final stage of this struggle would have seen the political and economic empowerment of the proletariat. Critical theorists, in their turn, rejected both the metaphysical apparatus of Hegel and the eschatological aspects connected to Marx’s theory. On the contrary, Critical Theory analyses, oriented to the understanding of society, pointed rather to the necessity of establishing open systems of analysis based on an immanent form of social criticism. Their starting point was the Marxian view on the relation between a system of production paralleled by a system of beliefs. Ideology, which according to Marx, was totally explicable through the underlying system of production, had, for critical theorists, to be analyzed in its own respect and as a non-economically reducible form of expression of human rationality. Such a revision of Marxian categories became extremely crucial, then, in the reinterpretation of the notion of dialectic for the analysis of capitalism. In the light of this, dialectic, as a method of social criticism, was interpreted as following from the contradictory nature of capitalism as a system of exploitation. Indeed, it was on the basis of such inherent contradictions that capitalism was seen to open up to a collective form of ownership of the means of production, that is, socialism.

a. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique

From these conceptually rich implications one can observe some of the constant topics which have characterized critical social theory – that is, the normativity of social philosophy as something distinct from classical descriptive sociology, the everlasting crux on the theory/practice relation, or even ideology criticism. These are the primary tasks that a critical social theory must accomplish in order to be defined as “critical.” Crucial in this sense is the understanding and the criticism of the notion of “ideology”.

In defining the senses to be assigned to the notion of ideology, within its descriptive-empirical sense “one might study the biological and quasi-biological properties of the group” or, alternatively, “the cultural or socio-cultural features of the group” (Geuss 1981, p. 4 ff). Ideology, in the descriptive sense, incorporates both “discursive” and “non-discursive” elements. That is, in addition to propositional contents or performatives, it includes gestures, ceremonies, and so forth (Geuss 1981, pp. 6-8); also, it shows a systematic set of beliefs – a world-view – characterized by conceptual schemes. A variant of the descriptive sense is the “pejorative” version, where a form of ideology is judged negatively in view of its epistemic, functional or genetic properties (Geuss 1981, p. 13).  On the other hand, if one takes “ideology” according to a positive sense, then, he is not dealing with something empirically given, but rather with a “desideratum”, a “verité a faire” (Geuss 1981, p. 23). Critical Theory, though, distinguishes itself from scientific theories tout court, since while the latter produce a sort of objectified knowledge, the former serves the purpose of human emancipation through consciousness and self-reflection.

If the task of critical social theory is that of evaluating the rationality of any system of social domination in view of certain standards of justice, then ideological criticism has the function of unmasking wrong rationalizations of present or past injustices – that is, ideology in the factual and negative sense – such as in the case of the belief that “women are inferior to men, or blacks to whites…”. Thus ideological criticism has the function of proposing alternative practicable ways for constructing the social bound. Critical Theory moves precisely in between the contingency of objectified non-critical factual reality and the normativity of utopian idealizations, that is, within the so-called “theory/practice” problem (see Ingram 1990, p. xxiii). Marcuse, for instance, in the essay Philosophie und kritische Theorie (1937), defends the view that Critical Theory characterizes itself as being neither philosophy tout court, nor pure science as overly simplistic Marxism claims. Critical Theory has easier tasks: that of clarifying the sociopolitical determinants explaining the limits of analysis of a certain philosophical view, as well as that of transcending the use of imagination – the actual limits of imagination. From all this, two notions of “rationality” result: the first attached to the dominant form of power and deprived of any normative force; the second characterized, on the contrary, by a liberating force based on a yet-to-come scenario. This difference in forms of rationality is what Habermas later presented, mutatis mutandis, as the distinction between “instrumental” and “communicative” rationality. While the first is oriented to a means-ends understanding of human and environmental relations, the second is oriented to subordinating human action to the respect of certain normative criteria of action validity. This latter point echoes quite distinctively Kant’s principle of morality according to which human beings must be always treated as “ends in themselves” and never as mere “means”. Critical Theory, and Habermas in particular, are no exception towards such a double layer of rationality, since they both see Ideologiekritik not just as a form of “moralizing criticism”, but as a form of knowledge, that is as a cognitive operation for disclosing the falsity of conscience (Geuss 1981, p. 26).

This point is strictly connected to another conceptual category playing a great role within Critical Theory, the concept of “interest” and in particular the distinction between “true interests” and “false interests”. As Geuss suggests, there are two possible ways to make such a separation: “the perfect-knowledge approach” and “the optimal conditions approach” (1981, p. 48). Were one to follow the first option, the outcome would be that of falling into the side of acritical utopianism. On the contrary, “the optimal conditions approach” is reinterpreted, at least in Habermas, in terms of an “ideal speech situation” which, by virtually granting an all-encompassing exchange of arguments, assumes the function of providing a counterfactual normative check on actual discursive contexts. Within such a model, therefore, epistemic knowledge and social critical reflection are attached to unavoidable pragmatic-transcendental conditions that are universally the same for all.

The universality of such epistemological status differs profoundly from Adorno’s contextualism where individual epistemic principles grounding cultural criticism and self-reflection are recognized to be legitimately different in accordance to time and history. Both versions are “critical” in that they remain faithful to the objective of clearing false consciousness from ignorance and domination; but whereas Habermas sets a high standard of validity/non-validity for discourse theory, Adorno’s historicism is oriented towards “degrees” of rationality that are variable according to contexts. In one of his late 1969 writings  (republished in Adorno 2003, pp. 292 ff.), Adorno provides a short but dense interpretation in the form of eight theses on the significance and the mission of Critical Theory. The central message is that Critical Theory while drawing from Marxism, must avoid hypostatization and closure into a single Weltanschauung on the pain of losing its “critical” capacity. By interpreting rationality as a form of self-reflective activity, Critical Theory represents a particular form of rational enquiry capable of distinguishing, immanently, “ideology” from Hegelian “Spirit”. The mission of Critical Theory, though, is not exhausted by a theoretical understanding of the social reality; as a matter of fact, there is a strict interconnection between critical understanding and transformative action: theory and practice are interconnected.

b. The Theory/Practice Problem

During the course of its history, Critical Theory has always confronted itself with one crucial methodological problem: the “theory/practice” problem. To this issue critical theorists have provided different answers, so that it is not possible to organize a homogeneous set of views. In order to understand what the significance of the theory/practice problem is, one must refer back to David Hume’s “is/ought” question. What Hume demonstrated through the separation of the “is” from the “ought” was the non-derivability of prescriptive statements from descriptive ones. This separation has been at the basis of those ethical theories that have not recognized moral statements as a truth-property. In other words, according to the reading provided to the “is/ought” relation, it follows that either a cognitivist approach (truth-validity of moral statements), or a non-cognitivist approach is defended (no truth-validity), as in the case of the thesis according to which moral statements simply “express” an attitude (expressivism).

Even if characterized by several internal differences, what Critical Theory added to this debate was the consideration both of the anthropological as well as the psychological dynamics motivating masses and structuring ideologies.

As far as the anthropological determinants in closing up the gap of the “theory/practice” problem is concerned, one can consider Habermas’ Knowledge and Human Interest ([1968] 1971). There Habermas combines a transcendental argument with an anthropological one by defending the view according to which humans have an interest in knowledge insofar as such interest is attached to the preservation of self-identity. Yet, to preserve one’s identity is to go beyond mere compliance with biological survival, as Habermas clarifies: “[…] human interests […] derive both from nature and from the cultural break with nature” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram,1992, p. 263). On the contrary, to preserve one’s identity means to see, in the emancipatory force of knowledge, the fundamental interest of human beings. Indeed, the grounding of knowledge into the practical domain has quite far-reaching implications, as for instance that interest and knowledge, in Habermas, find their unity in self-reflection, that is, in “knowledge for the sake of knowledge” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 264).

The Habermasian answer to the theory/practice problem comes from his criticism of non-cognitivist theories. If it is true, as non-cognitivists claim, that prescriptive claims are grounded on commands and do not have any cognitive content which can be justified through an exchange of public arguments, it follows that they cannot provide an answer to the difference between what is a “convergent behavior”, established through normative power on the basis, for example, of punishment, and what is instead “following a valid rule”. In the latter case, there seems to be required an extra layer of justification, namely, a process through which a norm can be defined as “valid”. Such process is for Habermas conceived in terms of a counterfactual procedure for a discursive exchange of arguments. This procedure is aimed at justifying those “generalizable interests” that ought to be obeyed because they pass the test of moral validity.

The Habermasian answer to the “is/ought” question has several important implications. One, and maybe the most important, is the criticism of positivism and of the epistemic status of knowledge. On the basis of Habermasian premises, indeed, there can be no objective knowledge, as positivists claim, detached from intersubjective forms of understanding. Since knowledge is strictly embedded in serving human interests, it follows that it cannot be considered value-neutral and objectively independent.

A further line of reflection on the “theory/practice” problem comes from psychoanalysis. In such cases, the outcomes have maintained a strict separation between the “is” and “ought”, and of unmasked false “oughts” through the clarification of the psychological mechanisms constructing desires. Accordingly, critical theorists like Fromm referred to Freud’s notions of the unconscious which contributed defining ideologies in terms of “substitute gratifications”. Psychoanalysis represented such a strong component within the research of the Frankfurt School that even Adorno in his article Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda (1951) analyzed Fromm’s interconnection between sadomasochism and fascism. Adorno noticed how a parallel can be drawn between the loss of self-confidence and estimation in hierarchical domination and a compensation through self-confidence which can be re-obtained in active forms of dominations. Such mechanisms of sadomasochism, though, are not only proper of fascism. As Adorno noticed, they reappear under different clothes in modern cultural industry through the consumption of so-called “cultural commodities”.

Notwithstanding the previous discussions, the greatest philosophical role of psychoanalysis within Frankfurt School was exemplified by Marcuse’s thought. In his case, the central problem became that of interpreting the interest genealogy at the basis of capitalist ideology. But how can one provide an account of class interests after the collapse of classes? How can one formulate, on the basis of the insight provided by psychoanalysis, the criteria through which it can distinguish true from false interests? The way adopted by Marcuse was with a revisitation of Freud’s theory of instinctual needs. Differently from Freud’s tensions between nature and culture and Fromm’s total social shaping of natural instincts, Marcuse defended a third – median – perspective where instincts were considered only partially shaped by social relations (Ingram 1990, p. 93 ff). Through such a solution, Marcuse overcame the strict opposition between biological and historical rationality preventing the resolution of the theory/practice problem. He did so by recalling the annihilation of individual’s sexual energy at the basis of organized society, recalling in its turn the archetypical scenario of a total fulfillment of pleasure. Imagination is taken by Marcuse as a way to obtain individual reconciliation with social reality, a reconciliation, though, which hid his underlying unresolved tension. Marcuse conceived of overcoming such tensions through the aestheticization of basic instincts liberated through the work of imagination. The problem with Marcuse’s rationalization of basic instincts was that by relying excessively on human biology it became impossible to distinguish between the truth or falsity of socially dependent needs (see on this Ingram 1990, p. 103).

c. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents

For Critical Theory, rationality has always been a crucial theme in the analysis of modern society as well as of its pathologies. Whereas the early Frankfurt School and Habermas viewed rationality as a historical process whose unity was taken as a precondition for social criticism, later critical philosophies influenced mainly by post-modernity privileged a rather more fragmented notion of (ir)rationality manifested by social institutions. In the latter, social criticism did not represent a self-reflective form of rationality since rationality was not conceived as an incorporated process of history. One point shared by all critical theorists was that forms of social pathology were connected to deficits of rationality, which in their turn manifested interconnections with the psychological status of the mind (see Honneth 2004, p. 339 ff.).

In non-pathological social aggregations, individuals should be capable of achieving cooperative forms of self-actualizations only if freed from coercive mechanisms of domination. Accordingly, for the Frankfurt School, modern processes of bureaucratic administration exemplified what Weber had already considered as an all-encompassing domination of formal rationality over substantive values. In Weber, rationality is to be interpreted as “purposive rationality”, that is, as a form of instrumental reason. Accordingly, the use of reason does not amount to formulating prescriptive models of society but aims at achieving goals through the selection of the best possible means of action. If in Lukács the proletariat was to represent the only dialectical way out from the total control of formal rationality, Horkheimer and Adorno saw technological domination of human action as the negation of the inspiring purposes of Enlightenment. In their most important work – Dialectic of Enlightenment (1969 [1947]) – they emphasized the role of knowledge and technology as a “means of exploitation” of labor, and viewed the dialectic of reason as the archetypical movement of human self-liberation. Nevertheless, the repression by formal-instrumental rationality of natural chaos has had as a consequence that of determining a resurgence of natural violence under a different form, so that the liberation from nature through instrumental reason has led to domination by a totalitarian state (see Ingram 1990, p. 63).

According to this view, reason is essentially a form of control over nature which has characterized humanity since its beginning, that is, since those attempts aimed at providing a mythological explanation of cosmic forces. The purpose served by such instrumental rationality was essentially that of promoting self-preservation, even if this paradoxically turned into the fragmentation of bourgeois individuality which, once deprived of any substantive value, became merely formal and thus determined by external influences of “mass-identity” in a context of “cultural industry”.

Rationality thus began to assume a double significance: on the one hand, as traditionally recognized by German idealism, it was conceived as the primary source of human emancipation; on the other, it was conceived as the premise of totalitarianism. If, as Weber believed, modern rationalization of society came to a formal reduction of the power of rationality, it followed that hyper-bureaucratization of society led not just to a complete separation between facts and values, but also to a total disinterest in the latter. Nevertheless, for Critical Theory it remained essential to defend the validity of social criticism on the basis of the idea that humanity is embedded in a historical learning process, where clash is due to the actualization of reason re-establishing a power balance and to struggles for group domination.

Given such general framework on rationality, it can be said that Critical Theory today has undergone several “internal” and “external” reformulations and criticisms. First of all, Habermas himself has suggested a further “pre-linguistic” line of enquiry making appeal to the notion of “authenticity” and “imagination”, so to suggest a radical reformulation of the same notion of “truth” and “reason” in the light of its metaphorical capacities of signification (see Habermas 1984a). Secondly, the commitment of Critical Theory to universal validity and universal pragmatics has been widely criticized by post-structuralists and post-modernists who have instead insisted respectively on the hyper-contextualism of the forms of linguistic rationality, as well as on the substitution of a criticism of ideology with genealogical criticism. While Derrida’s “deconstructive method” has shown how binary opposition collapses when applied to the semantic level, so that meaning can only be contextually constructed, Foucault oriented his criticisms to the supposedly “emancipatory” power of universal reason by showing how forms of domination permeate micro-levels of power-control such as in sanatoriums, educational and religious bodies and so on. The control of life – known as bio-power – manifests itself in the attempt of “normalizing” and constraining individuals’ behaviors and psychic lives. For Foucault, reason is embedded into such practices which display in their turn the multiple layers of force. The activity of the analyst in this sense is not far from the same activity of the participant: there is no objective perspective which can be defended. Derrida, for instance, while pointing to the Habermasian idea of pragmatic communication, still avoids any overlapping by defending the thesis of a restless deconstructive potential of any constructing activity, so that no unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions nor idealizing conditions of communication can survive deconstruction. On the other hand, Habermasian “theory of communicative action and discourse ethics”, while remaining sensitive to contexts, defends transcendental conditions of discourse which, if violated, lead to performative contradiction. To the Habermasian role of “consensus” or “agreement” in discursive models, Foucault objected that rather than a “regulatory” principle, a true “critical” approach would simply command against “nonconsensuality” (see Rabinow, ed. 1984, p. 379 ff).

3. Concluding Thoughts

The debate between Foucault and Critical Theory – and in particular Habermas – is quite illuminating of the common “critical” purposes versus the diverging methodologies defended by the two approaches. For Foucault it is not correct to propose a second-order theory for defining what rationality is. Rationality is not to be found in abstract forms. On the contrary, what social criticism can achieve is the uncovering of deeply enmeshed forms of irrationality deposited in contingent and historical institution-embeddings. Genealogical method, though, does not reject that (ir)-rationality is part of history; on the contrary, rather than suggesting abstract and procedural rational models, it dissects concrete institutional social practices through “immanent criticism”. To this, Habermas has easily objected that any activity of rational criticism “presupposes” unavoidable conditions for its same exercise. This relaunches the necessity of formulating transcendental conditions for immanent criticism revealed along the same pragmatic conditions of criticism itself. For Habermas, criticism is possible only if universal standards of validity are recognized and only if understanding (Verständigung) and agreement (Einverständnis) are seen as interconnected practices.

A further line of criticism against Habermas, which embraces more widely Critical Theory as such, comes from scholars like Chantal Mouffe (2005) who have detected in the notion of “consensus” a surrender from engagement into “political agonism”. If, as Mouffe claims, the model of discursive action is bound to the achievement of consensus, then, what role would be reserved to politics after such an agreement has been obtained? The charge of eliminating the consideration of “political action” from “the political” has been extended, retrospectively, also to previous critical theorists such as Horkheimer, Adorno and Marcuse by the so-called third generation of critical theorists. The criticism concerns the non-availability of a context-specific political guidance answering the question “What is to be done?” (see Chambers 2004, p. 219 ff.) Whereas Critical Theory aims at fostering human emancipation, it remains incapable of specifying a political action-strategy for social change. A clear indication in this sense came, for instance, from Marcuse’s idea of “the Great Refusal”, which predicated abstention from full engagement and transformative attempts directed towards capitalist economy and democratic institutions (Marcuse 1964). It is indeed towards such a widespread trend that the third generation of critical theorists with Honneth, Fraser and Benhabib, among others, engaged in a philosophical dialogue integrating such lacunae. Honneth revisited the Hegelian notion of “(mis)-recognition” by enriching both its normative content, social significance and psychological force; Fraser insisted, instead, on the notion of “redistribution” as a key element for overcoming economic inequalities and power-imbalances in post-industrial societies where cultural affiliations are no more significant sources of power. Finally, Benhabib contributed to the clarification of the “universalist” trend by clarifying the significance of the Habermasian “dual-track” model, through the distinction between “moral” issues (universalism) proper of the institutional level and the “ethical” issues (pluralism) characterizing, instead, informal public deliberations. Benhabib’s views, by making explicit several Habermasian assumptions, seem to be able to countervail both the post-structuralist and the post-modern charge to Critical Theory’s absence of engagement into political action. Whereas the requirement of universalist “consensus” pertains only to the institutional sphere, the ethical domain is instead characterized by a plurality of views confronting each other within systems of life.

As introduced at the beginning, one can speak now of a “fourth” generation of Critical Theory scholars revolving mainly around the figure of Rainer Forst. Like that of his doctoral supervisor Jürgen Habermas, Forst’s philosophical preoccupation has been that of addressing the American political debate with the specific aim of constructing a third alternative paradigm to that of liberalism and communitarianism. Contrary to what might superficially appear at a first glance, Forst’s attempt has never been that of replacing “obsolete” Critical Theory arguments with contemporary analytic theories. On the contrary, he has often attempted at “integrating” and “bridging” analytic and continental traditions. These efforts are clearly visible also from one of Forst’s latest essays devoted to the normative justification of human rights (Forst, [2010] 2011). There the author refers to the “right to justification” as the grounding principle for the universal ascription of human rights. What is worth noticing is that the principle of the “right to justification” provokes echoes both across the analytic and the Critical Theory domain. It seems therefore that the new challenge Critical Theory is today facing consists precisely in detecting key concepts at the crossroads of both the Anglo-Saxon and the Continental tradition.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, Theodor W. et al. The Authoritarian Personality, New York: Harper and Brothers, 1950.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. Eine Bildmonographie, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2003.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. “Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda” (1951), in Andrew Arato and Eike Gebhardt (eds.). The Essential Frankfurt School Reader, Continuum: New York, 1982.
  • Brunkhorst, Hauke. Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community, trans. by J. Flynn, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, (2002) 2005.
  • Chambers, Simone. “The Politics of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush Fred (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Couzens, David and Thomas McCarthy. Critical Theory. Oxford: Blackwell, 1994.
  • Forst, Rainer, “The Justification of Human Rights and the Basic Right to Justification. A Reflexive Approach”, Ethics 120:4 (2010), 711-40, reprinted in Claudio Corradetti (ed.). Philosophical Dimensions of Human Rights. Some Contemporary Views, Springer: Dordrecht, 2011.
  • Geuss, Raymond. The Idea of a Critical Theory. Habermas & the Frankfurt School, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Knowledge and Human Interests. Boston: Beacon Press, (1968) 1971.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “Questions and Counter-Questions”, Praxis International 4:3 (1984a).
  • Habermas, Jürgen. The Theory of Communicative Action, vols. 1 and 2, Boston: Beacon Press, (1981) 1984b.
  • Honneth, Axel. Critique of Power: Reflective Stages in a Critical Social Theory, trans. by Kenneth Baynes. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press,  [1985] 1991.
  • Honneth, Axel. The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts, trans. by Joel Anderson. Cambridge: Polity Press, [1986] 1995.
  • Honneth, Axel. “The Intellectual legacy of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Horkheimer, Max. “Traditional and Critical Theory”, in Paul Connerton (ed.). Critical Sociology: Selected Readings, Harmondsworth: Penguin, [1937] 1976.
  • Horkheimer, Max and Theodor W. Adorno. Dialectic of Enlightenment, New York: Continuum, [1947] 1969.
  • Ingram, David. Critical Theory and Philosophy, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1990.
  • Ingram, David and Julia Simon-Ingram. Critical Theory: the Essential Readings, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1992.
  • Jay, Martin. The Dialectical Imagination, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996.
  • Lukács, Georg. History and Class Consciousness, Cambridge Mass.: MIT Press, [1968], 1971.
  • Marcuse, Herbert. “Philosophie und Kritische Theorie”, Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung VI:3 (1937).
  • Marcuse, Herbert. One Dimensional Man: Studies in the Ideology of Advanced Industrial Society, Boston: Beacon Press, 1964.
  • Mouffe, Chantal. The Democratic Paradox, London: Verso, 2005.
  • Rabinow, Paul (ed.). “Politics and Ethics: an Interview”, in The Foucault Reader, New York: Pantheon, 1984.
  • Rush, Fred. Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Wiggershaus, Rolf. The Frankfurt School, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1995.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, London: Routledge, 2001 [1st English edition 1922].

Author Information

Claudio Corradetti
Email: crrcld00@uniroma2.it
European Academy and the University of Rome
Italy