The Frankfurt School and Critical Theory

The Frankfurt School, known more appropriately as Critical Theory, is a philosophical and sociological movement spread across many universities around the world. It was originally located at the Institute for Social Research (Institut für Sozialforschung), an attached institute at the Goethe University in Frankfurt, Germany. The Institute was founded in 1923 thanks to a donation by Felix Weil with the aim of developing Marxist studies in Germany. After 1933, the Nazis forced its closure, and the Institute was moved to the United States where it found hospitality at Columbia University in New York City.

The academic influence of the critical method is far reaching. Some of the key issues and philosophical preoccupations of the School involve the critique of modernity and capitalist society, the definition of social emancipation, as well as the detection of the pathologies of society. Critical Theory provides a specific interpretation of Marxist philosophy with regards to some of its central economic and political notions like commodification, reification, fetishization and critique of mass culture.

Some of the most prominent figures of the first generation of Critical Theorists were Max Horkheimer (1895-1973), Theodor Adorno (1903-1969), Herbert Marcuse (1898-1979), Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), Friedrich Pollock (1894-1970), Leo Lowenthal (1900-1993), and Eric Fromm (1900-1980). Since the 1970s, a second generation began with Jürgen Habermas, who, among other merits, contributed to the opening of a dialogue between so-called continental and the analytic traditions. With Habermas, the Frankfurt School turned global, influencing methodological approaches in other European academic contexts and disciplines. It was during this phase that Richard Bernstein, a philosopher and contemporary of Habermas, embraced the research agenda of Critical Theory and significantly helped its development in American universities starting from the New School for Social Research in New York.

The third generation of critical theorists, therefore, arose either from Habermas’ research students in the United States and at Frankfurt am Main and Starnberg (1971-1982), or from a spontaneous convergence of independently educated scholars. Therefore, tthird generation of Critical Theory scholars consists of two groups. The first group spans a broad time—denying the possibility of establishing any sharp boundaries. It can be said to include also scholars such as Andrew Feenberg, even if he was a direct student of Marcuse, or people such as Albrecht Wellmer who became an assistant of Habermas due to the premature death of Adorno in 1969. Klaus Offe, Josef Früchtl, Hauke Brunkhorst, Klaus Günther, Axel Honneth, Alessandro Ferrara, Cristina Lafont, and Rainer Forst, among others, are also members of this group. The second group of the third generation is instead composed mostly of American scholars who were influenced by Habermas’ philosophy during his visits to the United States.

Table of Contents

  1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background
  2. What is Critical Theory?
    1. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique
    2. The Theory/Practice Problem
    3. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents
  3. Concluding Thoughts
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Critical Theory: Historical and Philosophical Background

Felix Weil’s father, Herman, made his fortune by exporting grain from Argentina to Europe. In 1923, Felix decided to use his father’s money to found an institute specifically devoted to the study of German society in the light of a Marxist approach. The initial idea of an independently founded institute was conceived to provide for studies on the labor movement and the origins of anti-Semitism, which at the time were being ignored in German intellectual and academic life.

Not long after its inception, the Institute for Social Research was formally recognized by the Ministry of Education as an entity attached to Goethe University Frankfurt. Felix could not imagine that in the 1960s Goethe University Frankfurt would receive the epithet of “Karl Marx University”. The first officially appointed director was Carl Grünberg (1923-9), a Marxist professor at the University of Vienna. His contribution to the Institute was the creation of a historical archive mainly oriented to the study of the labor movement (also known as the Grünberg Archiv).

In 1930, Max Horkheimer succeeded to Grünberg. While continuing under a Marxist inspiration, Horkheimer interpreted the Institute’s mission to be more directed towards an interdisciplinary integration of the social sciences. Additionally, the Grünberg Archiv ceased to publish and an official organ was instead launched with a much greater impact: the Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung. While never officially supporting any party, the Institute entertained intensive research exchanges with the Soviet Union.

It was under Horkheimer’s leadership that members of the Institute were able to address a wide variety of economic, social, political and aesthetic topics, ranging from empirical analysis to philosophical theorization. Different interpretations of Marxism and its historical applications explain some of the hardest confrontations on economic themes within the Institute, such as the case of Pollock’s criticism of Grossman’s standard view on the pauperization of capitalism. This particular confrontation led Grossman to leave the Institute. Pollock’s critical reinterpretation of Marx received support also from intellectuals who greatly contributed to later developments of the School as, for instance, in the case of Leo Lowenthal, Theodor Wiesengrund-Adorno and Erich Fromm. In particular, with Fromm’s development of a psychoanalytic trend at the Institute and with an influential philosophical contribution by Hokheimer, it became clear how under his directorship the Institute faced a drastic turning point which characterized all its future endeavors. The following sections, therefore, briefly introduce some of the main research patterns introduced by Fromm and Horkheimer, respectively.

Since the beginning, psychoanalysis in the Frankfurt School was conceived in terms of a reinterpretation of Freud and Marx. The consideration of psychoanalysis by the Frankfurt School was certainly due to Horkheimer’s encouragement. It was Fromm, nevertheless, who achieved a significant advancement of the discipline; his central aim was to provide, through a synthesis of Marxism and psychoanalysis, “the missing link between ideological superstructure and socio-economic base” (Jay 1966, p. 92). A radical shift though occurred in the late 1930s, when Adorno joined the School and Fromm decided, for independent reasons, to leave. Nevertheless, the School’s interest in psychoanalysis, particularly in Freud’s instinct theory, remained unaltered. This was manifest in Adorno’s paper Social Science and Sociological Tendencies in Psychoanalysis (1946), as well as in Marcuse’s book Eros and Civilization (1955). The School’s interest in psychoanalysis coincided with a marginalization of Marxism, a growing interest into the interrelation between psychoanalysis and social change, as well as with Fromm’s insight into the psychic (or even psychotic) role of the family. This interest became crucial in empirical studies of the 40s that led, eventually, to Adorno’s co-authored work The Authoritarian Personality (1950). The goal of this work was to explore, on the basis of empirical research making use of questionnaires, to define a “new anthropological type”—the authoritarian personality (Adorno et. al. 1950, quoted in Jay 1996, p. 239). Such a character was found to have specific traits such as: compliance with conventional values, non-critical thinking, as well as absence of introspectiveness.

As pointed out by Jay: “Perhaps some of the confusion about this question was a product of terminological ambiguity. As a number of commentators have pointed out, there is an important distinction that should be drawn between authoritarianism and totalitarianism [emphasis added]. Wilhelminian and Nazi Germany, for example, were fundamentally dissimilar in their patterns of obedience. What The Authoritarian Personality was really studying was the character type of a totalitarian rather than an authoritarian society. Thus, it should have been no surprise to learn that this new syndrome was fostered by a familial crisis in which traditional paternal authority was under fire” (Jay 1996, p. 247). Horkheimer’s leadership provided a very distinct methodological direction and philosophical grounding to the research interests of the Institute. As an instance of Horkheimer’s aversion to so-called Lebensphilosophie (philosophy of life), he criticized the fetishism of subjectivity and the lack of consideration for materialist conditions of living. Furthermore, arguing against Cartesian and Kantian philosophy, Horkheimer, by use of dialectical mediation, attempted to rejoin all dichotomies including the divide between consciousness and being, theory and practice, fact and value. Differently from Hegelianism or Marxism, dialectics amounted for Horkheimer to be neither a metaphysical principle nor a historical praxis; it was not intended as a methodological instrument. On the contrary, Horkheimer’s dialectics functioned as the battleground for overcoming overly rigid categorizations and unhelpful dichotomies and oppositions. It originated from criticism by Horkheimer of orthodox Marxism's dichotomy between productive structures and ideological superstructure, as well as positivism’s naïve separation of social facts and social interpretation.

In 1933, due to the Nazi takeover, the Institute was temporarily transferred, first to Geneva and then in 1935 to Columbia University, New York. Two years later Horkheimer published the ideological manifesto of the School in his Traditional and Critical Theory ([1937] 1976) where he readdressed some of the previously introduced topics concerning the practical and critical turn of theory. In 1938, Adorno joined the Institute after spending some time as an advanced student at Merton College, Oxford. He was invited by Horkheimer to join the Princeton Radio Research Project. Gradually, Adorno assumed a prominent intellectual leadership in the School and this led to co-authorship, with Horkheimer, of one of the milestones works of the School, the publication of Dialectic of Enlightenment in 1947. During the time of Germany’s Nazi seizure, the Institute remained the only free voice publishing in German language. The backlash of this choice, though, was a prolonged isolation from American academic life and intellectual debate, a situation described by Adorno with the iconic expression “message in the bottle” to refer to the lack of a public American audience. According to Wiggershaus: “The Institute disorientation in the late 1930s made the balancing acts it had always had to perform, for example in relation to its academic environment, even more difficult. The seminars were virtually discussion groups for the Institute’s associates, and American students only rarely took part in them” (1995, p. 251).

Interestingly, and not surprisingly, one of the major topics of study was Nazism. This led to two different approaches in the School. One marshaled by Neumann, Gurland and Kirchheimer and oriented mainly to the analysis of legal and political issues by consideration of economic substructures; the other, instead, guided by Horkheimer and focusing on the notion of psychological irrationalism as a source of obedience and domination (see Jay 1996, p. 166).

In 1941, Horkheimer moved to Pacific Palisades, near Los Angeles. He built himself a bungalow near other German intellectuals, among whom were Bertold Brecht and Thomas Mann as well as with other people interested in working for the film industry (Wiggershaus 1995, p. 292). Other fellows like Marcuse, Pollock and Adorno followed shortly, whereas some remained in New York. Only Benjamin refused to leave Europe and in 1940, while attempting to cross the border between France and Spain at Port Bou, committed suicide. Some months later, Arendt also crossed the same border, passing on Adorno Benjamin’s last writing: Theses on the Philosophy of History.

The division of the School into two different premises, New York and California, was paralleled by the development of two autonomous research programs led, on the one hand, by Pollock and, on the other hand, by Horkheimer and Adorno. Pollock directed his research to study anti-Semitism. This research line culminated into an international conference organized in 1944 as well as a four-volume work titled Studies in Anti-Semitism; Horkheimer and Adorno, instead, developed studies on the reinterpretation of the Hegelian notion of dialectics as well as engaged into the study of anti-Semitic tendencies. The most relevant publication in this respect by the two was The Authoritarian Personality or Studies in Prejudice. After this period, only few devoted supporters remained faithful to the project of the School. These included Horkheimer himself, Pollock, Adorno, Lowenthal and Weil. In 1946, however, the Institute was officially invited to join Goethe University Frankfurt.

Upon return to West Germany, Horkheimer presented his inaugural speech for the reopening of the institute on 14 November 1951. One week later he inaugurated the academic year as a new Rector of the University. Yet, what was once a lively intellectual community became soon a small team of very busy people. Horkheimer was involved in the administration of the university, whereas Adorno was constantly occupied with different projects and teaching duties. In addition, in order to keep US citizenship, Adorno had to go back to California where he earned his living by conducting qualitative research analysis. Horkheimer, instead, attempted to attract back his former assistant Marcuse when the opportunity arose for a successor to Gadamer’s chair in Frankfurt, but neither this initiative nor further occasions were successful. Marcuse remained in the United States and was offered a full position at Brandeis University. Adorno returned to Germany in August 1953 and was soon involved again in empirical research, combining quantitative and qualitative methods in the analysis of industrial relations for the Mannesmann Company. In 1955, he took over Horkheimer position as director of the Institute for Social Research, and on 1 July 1957 he was appointed full professor in philosophy and sociology. Even though greatly influential in philosophy, Adorno’s most innovative contribution is unanimously thought to be in the field of music theory and aesthetics. Some of his significant works in this area included Philosophy of Modern Music (1949) and later Vers une Musique Informelle. In 1956, Horkheimer retired just when several important publications were appearing, such as Marcuse’s Eros and Civilization and the essay’s collection Sociologica. These events marked the precise intellectual phase of maturity reached at that time by the Frankfurt School.

The sixties—which saw famous student protests across Europe—also saw the publication of Adorno’s fundamental work, Negative Dialectics (1966). This study, while far from either materialism or metaphysics, maintained important connections with an “open and non-systemic” notion of dialectics. It appeared only a few years later than One-Dimensional Man (1964), where Marcuse introduced the notion of “educational dictatorship”— a strategy intended for the advancement of material conditions aimed at the realization of a higher notion of the good. While Marcuse, quite ostensibly, sponsored the student upheavals, Adorno maintained a much moderate and skeptical profile.

In 1956, Habermas joined the Institute as Adorno’s assistant. He was soon involved in an empirical study titled Students and Politics. The text, though, was rejected by Horkheimer and it did not come out, as it should have, in the series of the Frankfurt Contributions to Sociology. Only later, in 1961, it appeared in the series Sociological Texts (see Wiggershaus 1995, p. 555). Horkheimer’s aversion towards Habermas was even more evident when he refused to supervise his Habilitation. Habermas obtained his Habilitation under the supervision of Abendroth at Marburg, where he addressed the topic of the bourgeois formation of public sphere. This study was published by Habermas in 1962 under the title of The Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere, just before he handed in his Habilitation. With the support of Gadamer he was, then, appointed professor at Heidelberg. Besides his achievements, both in academia and as an activist, the young Habermas contributed towards the construction of a critical self-awareness of the socialist student groups around the country (the so-called SDS, Sozialistischer Deutscher Studentenbund). It was in this context that Habermas reacted to the extremism of Rudi Dutschke, the radical leader of the students' association who criticized him for defending a non-effective emancipatory view. It was principally against Dutschke’s positions that Habermas, during a public assembly labeled such positions with the epitome of “left-wing fascism”. How representative this expression was of Habermas’ views on student protests has often been a matter of contention.

Discussions of the notion of emancipation had been at the center of the Frankfurt School political debate since the beginning. The concept of emancipation (Befreiung in German), covers indeed a wide semantic spectrum. Literarily it means “liberation from”. The notion spans, therefore, from a sense related to action-transformation to include also revolutionary action.

After his nomination in 1971 as a director of the Max Planck Institute for Research into the Conditions of Life in the Scientific-Technical World at Starnberg, Habermas left Frankfurt. He returned there only in 1981 after having completed The Theory of Communicative Action. This decade was crucial for the definition of the School’s research objectives. In The Theory of Communicative Action (1984b [1981]), Habermas provided a model for social complexities and action coordination based upon the original interpretation of classical social theorists as well as the philosophy of Searle’s Speech Acts theory. Within this work, it also became evident how the large amount of empirical analysis conducted by Habermas’ research team on topics concerning pathologies of society, moral development and so on was elevated to a functionalistic model of society oriented to an emancipatory purpose. The assumption was that language itself embedded a normative force capable of realizing action co-ordination within society. In this respect, Habermas defined these as the “unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions of mutual understanding”. Social action whose coordination-function relies on the same pragmatic presuppositions was seen as connected to a justification discourse based on the satisfaction of specific validity-claims.

Habermas described discourse theory as relying on three types of validity-claims raised by communicative action. He claimed that it was only when the conditions of truth, rightness and sincerity were raised by speech-acts that social coordination could be obtained. As noticed in the opening sections, differently from the first generation of Frankfurt School intellectuals, Habermas contributed greatly to bridging the continental and analytical traditions, integrating aspects belonging to American Pragmatism, Anthropology and Semiotics with Marxism and Critical Social Theory.

Just one year before Habermas’ retirement in 1994, the directorship of the Institut für Sozialforschung was assumed by Honneth. This inaugurated a new phase of research in Critical Theory. Honneth, indeed, revisited the Hegelian notion of recognition (Anerkennung) in terms of a new prolific paradigm in social and political enquiry. Honneth began his collaboration with Habermas in 1984, when he was hired as an assistant professor. After a period of academic appointments in Berlin and Konstanz, in 1996 he took Habermas’ chair in Frankfurt.

Honneth’s central tenet, the struggle for recognition, represents a leitmotiv in his research and preeminently in one of his most important books, The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts ([1986]). This work represents a mature expansion of what was partially addressed in his dissertation, a work published under the title of Critique of Power: Stages of Reflection of a Critical Social Theory (1991 [1985]). One of the core themes addressed by Honneth consisted in the claim that, contrary to what Critical Theory initially emphasized, more attention should have been paid to the notion of conflict in society and among societal groups. Conflict represents the internal movement of historical advancement and human emancipation, falling therefore within the core theme of critical social theory. The so-called “struggle for recognition” is what best characterizes the fight for emancipation by social groups. This fight represents a subjective negative experience of domination—a form of domination attached to misrecognitions. To come to terms with negations of subjective forms of self-realization means to be able to transform social reality. Normatively, though, acts of social struggle activated by forms of misrecognition point to the role that recognition plays as a crucial criterion for grounding intersubjectivity.

Honneth inaugurated a new research phase in Critical Theory. Indeed, his communitarian turn has been paralleled by the work of some of his fellow scholars. Brunkhorst, for instance, in his Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community (2005 [2002]), canvasses a line of thought springing from the French Revolution of 1789 to contemporary times: the notion of fraternity. By the use of historical conceptual reconstruction and normative speculation, Brunkhorst presented the pathologies of the contemporary globalized world and the function that solidarity would play.

The confrontation with American debate, initiated systematically by the work of Habermas, became soon an obsolete issue in the third generation of critical theorists—not only because the group was truly international, merging European and American scholars. The work of Forst testifies, indeed, of the synthesis between analytical methodological rigor and classical themes of the Frankfurt School. Thanks to Habermas’ intellectual opening, the third generation of critical theorists engaged into dialogue with French post-modern philosophers like Derrida, Baudrillard, Lyotard and so forth, which according to Foucault are the legitimate interpreters of some central aspects of the Frankfurt School.

2. What is Critical Theory?

“What is ‘theory’?” asked Horkheimer in the opening of his essay Traditional and Critical Theory [1937]. The discussion about method has been always a constant topic for those critical theorists who have attempted since the beginning to clarify the specificity of what it means to be “critical”. A primary broad distinction that Horkheimer drew was that of the difference in method between social theories, scientific theories and critical social theories. While the first two categories had been treated as instances of traditional theories, the latter connoted the methodology the Frankfurt School adopted.

Traditional theory, whether deductive or analytical, has always focused on coherency and on the strict distinction between theory and praxis. Along Cartesian lines, knowledge has been treated as grounded upon self-evident propositions or, at least, upon propositions based on self-evident truths. Accordingly, traditional theory has proceeded to explain facts by application of universal laws, that is, by subsumption of a particular to a universal in order to either confirm or disconfirm this. A verificationist procedure of this kind was what positivism considered to be the best explicatory account for the notion of praxis in scientific investigation. If one were to defend the view according to which scientific truths should pass the test of empirical confirmation, then one would commit oneself to the idea of an objective world. Knowledge would be simply a mirror of reality. This view is firmly rejected by critical theorists.

Under several aspects, what Critical Theory wants to reject in traditional theory is precisely this “picture theory” of language and knowledge as that defined by “the first” Wittgenstein in his Tractatus. According to such a view, later abandoned by “the second” Wittgenstein, the logical form of propositions consists in showing a possible fact and in saying whether this is true or false. For example, the proposition “it rains today” shows both the possibility of the fact that “it rains today” and it affirms that it is the case that “it rains today.” In order to check whether something is or is not the case, one must verify empirically whether the stated fact occurs or not. This implies that the condition of truth and falsehood presupposes an objective structure of the world.

Horkheimer and his followers rejected the notion of objectivity in knowledge by pointing, among other things, to the fact that the object of knowledge is itself embedded into a historical and social process: “The facts which our senses present to us are socially preformed in two ways: through the historical character of the object perceived and through the historical character of the perceiving organ” (Horkheimer [1937] in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 242). Further, with a rather Marxist twist, Horkheimer noticed also that phenomenological objectivity is a myth because it is dependent upon “technological conditions” and the latter are sensitive to the material conditions of production. Critical Theory aims thus to abandon naïve conceptions of knowledge-impartiality. Since intellectuals themselves are not disembodied entities observing from a God’s viewpoint, knowledge can be obtained only from a societal embedded perspective of interdependent individuals.

If traditional theory is evaluated by considering its practical implications, then no practical consequences can be actually inferred. Indeed, the finality of knowledge as a mirror of reality is mainly a theoretically-oriented tool aimed at separating knowledge from action, speculation from social transformative enterprise. Critical Theory, instead, characterizes itself as a method contrary to the “fetishization” of knowledge, one which considers knowledge as something rather functional to ideology critique and social emancipation. In the light of such finalities, knowledge becomes social criticism and the latter translates itself into social action, that is, into the transformation of reality.

Critical Theory has been strongly influenced by Hegel’s notion of dialectics for the conciliation of socio-historical oppositions as well as by Marx’s theory of economy and society and the limits of Hegel’s “bourgeois philosophy”. Critical Theory, indeed, has expanded Marxian criticisms of capitalist society by formulating patterns of social emancipatory strategies. Whereas Hegel found that Rationality had finally come to terms with Reality with the birth of the modern nation state (which in his eyes was the Prussian state), Marx insisted on the necessity of reading the development of rationality through history in terms of a class struggle. The final stage of this struggle would have seen the political and economic empowerment of the proletariat. Critical theorists, in their turn, rejected both the metaphysical apparatus of Hegel and the eschatological aspects connected to Marx’s theory. On the contrary, Critical Theory analyses were oriented to the understanding of society and pointed rather to the necessity of establishing open systems based on immanent forms of social criticism. The starting point was the Marxian view on the relation between a system of production paralleled by a system of beliefs. Ideology, which according to Marx was totally explicable through an underlying system of production, for critical theorists had to be analyzed in its own respect and as a non-economically reducible form of expression of human rationality. Such a revision of Marxian categories became extremely crucial, then, in the reinterpretation of the notion of dialectics for the analysis of capitalism. Dialectics, as a method of social criticism, was interpreted as following from the contradictory nature of capitalism as a system of exploitation. Indeed, it was on the basis of such inherent contradictions that capitalism was seen to open up to a collective form of ownership of the means of production, namely, socialism.

a. Traditional and Critical Theory: Ideology and Critique

From these conceptually rich implications one can observe some of the constant topics which have characterized critical social theory, that is, the normativity of social philosophy as something distinct from classical descriptive sociology, the everlasting crux on the theory/practice relation and, finally, ideology critique. These are the primary tasks that a critical social theory must accomplish in order to be defined as “critical”. Crucial in this sense is the understanding and the criticism of the notion of “ideology”.

In defining the senses to be assigned to the notion of ideology, within its descriptive-empirical sense “one might study the biological and quasi-biological properties of the group” or, alternatively, “the cultural or socio-cultural features of the group” (Geuss 1981, p. 4 ff). Ideology, in the descriptive sense, incorporates both “discursive” and “non-discursive” elements. That is, in addition to propositional contents or performatives, it includes gestures, ceremonies and so forth (Geuss 1981, pp. 6-8); also, it shows a systematic set of beliefs—a world-view—characterized by conceptual schemes. A variant of the descriptive sense is the “pejorative” version where a form of ideology is judged negatively in view of its epistemic, functional or genetic properties (Geuss 1981, p. 13). On the other hand, if one takes “ideology” according to a positive sense, then, reference is not with something empirically given, but rather with a “desideratum”, a “verité a faire” (Geuss 1981, p. 23). Critical Theory, distances itself from scientific theories because, while the latter understands knowledge as an objectified product, the former serves the purpose of human emancipation through consciousness and self-reflection.

If the task of critical social theory is to evaluate the degree of rationality of any system of social domination in accordance to standards of justice, then ideological criticism has the function of unmasking wrong rationalizations of present or past injustices—that is, ideology in the factual and negative sense—such as in the case of the belief that “women are inferior to men, or blacks to whites…”. Thus ideological criticism aims at proposing alternative practicable ways for constructing social bounds. Critical Theory moves precisely in between the contingency of objectified non-critical factual reality and the normativity of utopian idealizations, that is, in between the so-called “theory/practice” problem (see Ingram 1990, p. xxiii). Marcuse, for instance, in the essay Philosophie und Kritische Theorie (1937), defends the view that Critical Theory characterizes itself as being neither philosophy tout court nor pure science, as it claims to be instead an overly simplistic approach to Marxism. Critical Theory has the following tasks: to clarify the sociopolitical determinants that explain the limits of analysis of a certain philosophical view as well as to transcend the use of imagination—the actual limits of imagination. From all this, two notions of rationality result: the first attached to the dominant form of power and deprived of any normative force; the second characterized, on the contrary, by a liberating force based on a yet-to-come scenario. This difference in forms of rationality is what Habermas has later presented, mutatis mutandis, in terms of the distinction between instrumental and communicative rationality. While the first form of rationality is oriented to a means-ends understanding of human and environmental relations, the second form is oriented to subordinating human action to the respect of certain normative criteria of action validity. This latter point echoes quite distinctively Kant’s principle of morality according to which human beings must be always treated as “ends in themselves” and never as mere “means”. Critical Theory and Habermas, in particular, are no exception to these view on rationality, since they both see Ideologiekritik not just as a form of “moralizing criticism”, but as a form of knowledge, that is, as a cognitive operation for disclosing the falsity of conscience (Geuss 1981, p. 26).

This point is strictly connected to another conceptual category playing a great role within Critical Theory, the concept of interest and in particular the distinction between “true interests” and “false interests”. As Geuss has suggested, there are two possible ways to propose such separation: “the perfect-knowledge approach” and “the optimal conditions approach” (1981, p. 48). Were one to follow the first option, the outcome would be one of falling into the side of acritical utopianism. On the contrary, “the optimal conditions approach” is reinterpreted, at least for Habermas, in terms of an “ideal speech situation” that by virtually granting an all-encompassing exchange of arguments, it assumes the function of providing a counterfactual normative check on actual discursive contexts. Within such a model, epistemic knowledge and social critical reflection are attached to unavoidable pragmatic-transcendental conditions that are universally the same for all.

The universality of such epistemological status differs profoundly from Adorno’s contextualism where individual epistemic principles grounding cultural criticism and self-reflection are recognized to be legitimately different along time and history. Both versions are critical in that they remain faithful to the objective of clearing false consciousness from ignorance and domination; but whereas Habermas sets a high standard of validity/non-validity for discourse theory, Adorno’s historicism remains sensitive to degrees of rationality that are context-dependent. In one of his later writings of 1969 (republished in Adorno 2003, pp. 292 ff.), Adorno provides a short but dense interpretation in eight theses on the significance and the mission of Critical Theory. The central message is that Critical Theory, while drawing from Marxism, must avoid hypostatization and closure into a single Weltanschauung on the pain of losing its “critical” capacity. By interpreting rationality as a form of self-reflective activity, Critical Theory represents a particular form of rational enquiry that must remain capable of distinguishing, immanently, ideology from a Hegelian “Spirit”. The mission of Critical Theory, therefore, is not exhausted by a theoretical understanding of social reality; as a matter of fact, there is a strict interconnection between critical understanding and transformative action: theory and practice are interconnected.

b. The Theory/Practice Problem

During the entire course of its historical development, Critical Theory has always confronted itself with one crucial methodological concern: the “theory/practice” problem. To this puzzle critical theorists have provided different answers, such that it is not possible to regroup them into a homogeneous set of views. In order to understand what the significance of the theory/practice problem is, it is useful to refer back to David Hume’s “is/ought” question. What Hume demonstrated through the separation of the “is” from the “ought” was the non-derivability of prescriptive statements from descriptive ones. This separation has been at the basis of those ethical theories that have not recognized moral statements as a truth-property. In other words, alternative reading to the “is/ought” relation have defended either a cognitivist approach (truth-validity of moral statements) or, alternatively, a non-cognitivist approach (no truth-validity), as in the case of emotivism.

Even if characterized by several internal differences, what Critical Theory added to this debate was the consideration both of the anthropological as well as the psychological dynamics motivating masses and structuring ideologies.

As far as the anthropological determinants in closing up the gap of the “theory/practice” problem is concerned, it is possible to take into consideration Habermas’ Knowledge and Human Interest ([1968] 1971). There Habermas combined a transcendental argument with an anthropological one by defending the view according to which humans have an interest in knowledge insofar as such interest is attached to the preservation of self-identity. Yet, to preserve one’s identity is to go beyond mere compliance with biological survival. As Habermas clarifies: “[…] human interests […] derive both from nature and from the cultural break with nature” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram,1992, p. 263). On the contrary, to preserve one’s identity means to find in the emancipatory force of knowledge the fundamental interest of human beings. Indeed, the grounding of knowledge into the practical domain has quite far-reaching implications as, for instance, that interest and knowledge in Habermas find their unity in self-reflection, that is, in “knowledge for the sake of knowledge” (Habermas [1968], in Ingram and Simon-Ingram 1992, p. 264).

The Habermasian answer to the theory/practice problem comes from the criticism of non-cognitivist theories. If it is true, as non-cognitivists claim, that prescriptive claims are grounded on commands and do not have any cognitive content which can be justified through an exchange of public arguments, it follows that they cannot provide an answer to the difference between what is a “convergent behavior”, established through normative power on the basis, for example, of punishment and what is instead the notion of “following a valid rule”. In the latter case, there seems to be required an extra layer of justification, namely, a process through which a norm can be defined as valid. Such process is for Habermas conceived in terms of a counterfactual procedure for a discursive exchange of arguments. This procedure is aimed at justifying those generalizable interests that ought to be obeyed because they pass the test of moral validity.

The Habermasian answer to the is/ought question has several important implications. One implication, perhaps the most important one, is the criticism of positivism and of the epistemic status of knowledge. On the basis of Habermasian premises, indeed, there can be no objective knowledge, as positivists claim, detached from intersubjective forms of understanding. Since knowledge is strictly embedded in serving human interests, it follows that it cannot be considered value-neutral and objectively independent.

A further line of reflection on the theory/practice problem comes from psychoanalysis where a strict separation has been maintained between the “is” and “ought” and false “oughts” have been unmasked through the clarification of the psychological mechanisms constructing desires. Accordingly, critical theorists like Fromm referred to Freud’s notions of the unconscious which contributed defining ideologies in terms of “substitute gratifications”. Psychoanalysis represented such a strong component within the research of the Frankfurt School that even Adorno in his article Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda (1951) analyzed Fromm’s interconnection between sadomasochism and fascism. Adorno noticed how a parallel can be drawn between the loss of self-confidence and estimation in hierarchical domination, on the one hand, and compensation through self-confidence which can be re-obtained in active forms of dominations, on the other hand. Such mechanisms of sadomasochism, though, are not only proper of fascism. As Adorno noticed, they reappear under different clothes in modern cultural industry through the consumption of so-called “cultural commodities”.

Notwithstanding the previous discussions, the greatest philosophical role of psychoanalysis within Frankfurt School was exemplified by Marcuse’s thought. In his case, the central problem became that of interpreting the interest in the genealogical roots of capitalist ideology. How can one provide an account of class interests after the collapse of classes? How can one formulate, on the basis of the insights provided by psychoanalysis, the criteria through which it can be distinguished true from false interests? The way adopted by Marcuse was with a revisitation of Freud’s theory of instinctual needs. Differently from Freud’s tensions between nature and culture and Fromm’s total social shaping of natural instincts, Marcuse defended a third—median—perspective where instincts were considered only partially shaped by social relations (Ingram 1990, p. 93 ff). Through such a solution, Marcuse overcame the strict opposition between biological and historical rationality that was preventing the resolution of the theory/practice problem. He did so by recalling the annihilation of individual’s sexual energy laying at the basis of organized society and recalling, in its turn, the archetypical scenario of a total fulfillment of pleasure. Marcuse took imagination as a way to obtain individual reconciliation with social reality: a reconciliation, though, with an underlying unsolved tension. Marcuse conceived of overcoming such tensions through the aestheticization of basic instincts liberated by the work of imagination. The problem with Marcuse’s rationalization of basic instincts was that by relying excessively on human biology, it became impossible to distinguish between the truth and the falsity of socially dependent needs (see on this Ingram 1990, p. 103).

c. The Idea of Rationality: Critical Theory and its Discontents

For Critical Theory, rationality has always been a crucial theme in the analysis of modern society as well as of its pathologies. Whereas the early Frankfurt School and Habermas viewed rationality as a historical process whose unity was taken as a precondition for social criticism, later critical philosophies, influenced mainly by post-modernity, privileged a rather more fragmented notion of (ir)rationality manifested by social institutions. In the latter views, social criticism could not act as a self-reflective form of rationality, since rationality cannot be conceived as a process incorporated in history. One point shared by all critical theorists was that forms of social pathology were connected to deficits of rationality which, in their turn, manifested interconnections with the psychological status of the mind (see Honneth 2004, p. 339 ff.).

In non-pathological social aggregations, individuals were said to be capable of achieving cooperative forms of self-actualizations only if freed from coercive mechanisms of domination. Accordingly, for the Frankfurt School, modern processes of bureaucratic administration exemplified what Weber considered as an all-encompassing domination of formal rationality over substantive values. In Weber, rationality was to be interpreted as purposive rationality, that is, as a form of instrumental reason. Accordingly, the use of reason did not amount to formulating prescriptive models of society but aimed at achieving goals through the selection of the best possible means of action. If in Lukács the proletariat was to represent the only dialectical way out from the total control of formal rationality, Horkheimer and Adorno saw technological domination of human action as the negation of the inspiring purposes of Enlightenment. In the already mentioned work—>Dialectic of Enlightenment (1969 [1947])—Horkheimer and Adorno emphasized the role of knowledge and technology as a “means of exploitation” of labor and viewed the dialectic of reason as the archetypical movement of human self-liberation. Nevertheless, the repression by formal-instrumental rationality of natural chaos pointed to the possible resurgence of natural violence under a different vest, so that the liberation from nature through instrumental reason opened to the possibility of domination by a totalitarian state (see Ingram 1990, p. 63).

According to this view, reason had been seen essentially as a form of control over nature characterizing humanity since its inception, that is, since those attempts aimed at providing a mythological explanation of cosmic forces. The purpose served by instrumental rationality was essentially that of promoting self-preservation, even if this goal turned paradoxically into the fragmentation of bourgeois individuality that, once deprived of any substantive value, became merely formal and thus determined by external influences of mass-identity in a context of cultural industry.

Rationality, thus, began assuming a double significance: on the one hand, as traditionally recognized by German idealism, it was conceived as the primary source of human emancipation; on the other, it was conceived as the premise of totalitarianism. If, as Weber believed, modern rationalization of society came to a formal reduction of the power of rationality, it followed that hyper-bureaucratization of society led not just to a complete separation between facts and values but also to a total disinterest in the latter forms. Nevertheless, for Critical Theory it remained essential to defend the validity of social criticism on the basis of the idea that humanity is embedded in a historical learning process where clash is due to the actualization of reason re-establishing power-balances and struggles for group domination.

Given such a general framework on rationality, it can be said that Critical Theory has undergone several paradigm revolutions, both internally and externally. First of all, Habermas himself has suggested a further pre-linguistic line of enquiry by making appeal to the notion of “authenticity” and “imagination”. This suggests a radical reformulation of the same notion of “truth” and “reason” in the light of its metaphorical capacities of signification (see Habermas 1984a). Secondly, the commitment of Critical Theory to universal validity and universal pragmatics has been widely criticized by post-structuralists and post-modernists who have instead insisted respectively on the hyper-contextualism of the forms of linguistic rationality, as well as on the substitution of a criticism of ideology with genealogical criticism. While Derrida’s deconstructive method has shown how binary opposition collapses when applied to the semantic level, so that meaning can only be contextually constructed, Foucault has oriented his criticisms to the supposedly emancipatory power of universal reason by showing how forms of domination permeate micro-levels of power-control such as in sanatoriums, educational and religious bodies and so on. The control of life—known as bio-power—manifests itself in the attempt of normalizing and constraining individuals’ behaviors and psychic lives. For Foucault, reason is embedded into such practices which display the multiple layers of un-rationalized force. The activity of the analyst in this sense is not far from the same activity of the participant: there is no objective perspective which can be defended. Derrida, for instance, while pointing to the Habermasian idea of pragmatic of communication, still maintained a distinct thesis of a restless deconstructive potential of any constructing activity, so that no unavoidable pragmatic presuppositions nor idealizing conditions of communication could survive deconstruction. On the other hand, Habermasian theory of communicative action and discourse ethics, while remaining sensitive to contexts, pretended to defend transcendental conditions of discourse which, if violated, were seen to lead to performative contradictions. Last but not least, to the Habermasian role of consensus or agreement in discursive models, Foucault objected that rather than a regulatory principle, a true critical approach would simply enact a command in case of “nonconsensuality” (see Rabinow, ed. 1984, p. 379 ff).

3. Concluding Thoughts

The debate between Foucault and Critical Theory—in particular with Habermas—is quite illuminating of the common critical-universalist orientations of the first phase of the Frankfurt School versus the diverging methodologies defended starting from the Habermasian interpretation of modernity. For Foucault it was not correct to propose a second-order theory for defining what rationality is. Rationality is not to be found in abstract forms. On the contrary, what social criticism can only aim to achieve is the unmasking of deeply enmeshed forms of irrationality deposited in contingent and historical institutional embeddings. Genealogical methods, though, do not reject the idea that (ir)-rationality is part of history; on the contrary, they rather pretend to illuminate abstract and procedural rational models by dissecting and analyzing concrete institutional social practices through immanent criticism. To this views, Habermas has objected that any activity of rational criticism presupposes unavoidable conditions in order to justify the pretence of validity of its same exercise. This rebuttal reopened the demands of transcendental conditions for immanent criticism revealed along the same pragmatic conditions of social criticism. For Habermas, criticism is possible only if universal standards of validity are recognized and only if understanding (Verständigung) and agreement (Einverständnis) are seen as interconnected practices.

A further line of criticism against Habermas, one which included also a target to Critical Theory as a whole, came from scholars like Chantal Mouffe (2005). What she noticed is that in the notion of consensus it nested a surrendering to a genuine engagement into “political agonism”. If, as Mouffe claimed, the model of discursive action is bound to the achievement of consensus, then, what rolecan be left to politics once agreement is obtained? The charge of eliminating the consideration of political action from “the political” has been extended by Mouffe also to previous critical theorists such as Horkheimer, Adorno and Marcuse. Criticism concerned the non-availability of context-specific political guidance answering the question “What is to be done?” (see Chambers 2004, p. 219 ff.). What has been noticed is that whereas Critical Theory has aimed at fostering human emancipation, it has remained incapable of specifying a political action-strategy for social change. For the opponents to the Critical Theory paradigm, a clear indication in this sense was exemplified by Marcuse’s idea of “the Great Refusal”, one predicating abstention from real political engagement and pretences of transformation of the capitalist economy and the democratic institutions (Marcuse 1964). It was indeed in view of the reformulation of the Critical Theory ambition of presenting “realistic utopias”, that some of the representatives of the third generation directed their attention. Axel Honneth, for instance, starting from a revisitation of the Hegelian notion of (mis)-recognition and through a research phase addressing social pathologies, has proposed in one of his latest studies  a revisited version of socialism, as in The Idea of Socialism: Towards a Renewal (2017). Nancy Fraser, instead, by focusing on the notion of redistribution has provided key elements in understanding how it is possible to overcome economic inequalities and power-imbalances in post-industrial societies where cultural affiliations are no longer significant sources of power. In his turn, Alessandro Ferrara along his recent monograph The Democratic Horizon (2014), has revived the paradigm of political liberalism by addressing the significance of democracy and tackled next the problem of hypepluralism and multiple democracies. For Ferrara, what is inherent to democratic thinking is innovation and openness. This notion bears conceptual similarities with what Kant and Arendt understood in terms of “broad mindedness”. Seyla Benhabib, along similar lines, has seeked to clarify the significance of the Habermasian dual-track model of democracy, as one based on the distinction between moral issues that are proper of the institutional level (universalism) and ethical issues characterizing, instead, informal public deliberations (pluralism). Whereas the requirement of a universal consensus pertains only to the institutional sphere, the ethical domain is instead characterized by a plurality of views confronting each other across different life-systems. Benhabib’s views, by making explicit several Habermasian assumptions, aim to countervail both post-structuralist worries as well as post-modern charges of political action ineffectiveness of Critical Theory models. Finally, Forst’s philosophical preoccupation has been that of addressing the American philosophical debate with the specific aim of constructing an alternative paradigm to that of liberalism and communitarianism. Forst’s attempt has integrated analytic and continental traditions by radicalizing along transcendental lines some core Habermasian intuitions on rights and constitutional democracy. In his collections of essays, The Right to Justification, Forst suggests a transformation of the Habermasian “co-originality thesis” into a monistic “right to justification”. This move is aimed at suggesting an alternative and hopefully more coherent route of explanation for the understanding of the liberal constitutional experience (Forst, [2007] 2014, see also Forst, [2010] 2011).

4. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, Theodor W. et al. The Authoritarian Personality, New York: Harper and Brothers, 1950.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. Eine Bildmonographie, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 2003.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. “Freudian Theory and the Pattern of Fascist Propaganda” (1951), in Arato, Andrew and Eike Gebhardt (eds.). The Essential Frankfurt School Reader, Continuum: New York, 1982.
  • Brunkhorst, Hauke. Solidarity: From Civic Friendship to a Global Legal Community, trans. by J. Flynn, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, [2002] 2005.
  • Chambers, Simone. “The Politics of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush Fred (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Couzens, David and Thomas McCarthy. Critical Theory. Oxford: Blackwell, 1994.
  • Ferrara, Alessandro. The Democratic Horizon. Hyperpluralism and the Renewal of Political Liberalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2014.
  • Forst, Rainer. “The Justification of Human Rights and the Basic Right to Justification. A Reflexive Approach”, Ethics 120:4 (2010), 711-40, reprinted in Claudio Claudio (ed.). Philosophical Dimensions of Human Rights. Some Contemporary Views, Dordrecht: Springer 2011.
  • Forst, Rainer. The Right to Justification. Elements of a Constructivist Theory of Justice, New York, NY: Columbia University Press, 2014.
  • Geuss, Raymond. The Idea of a Critical Theory. Habermas & the Frankfurt School, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Knowledge and Human Interests. Boston: Beacon Press, [1968] 1971.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. “Questions and Counter-Questions”, Praxis International 4:3 (1984a).
  • Habermas, Jürgen. The Theory of Communicative Action, vols. 1 and 2, Boston: Beacon Press, [1981] 1984b.
  • Honneth, Axel. Critique of Power: Reflective Stages in a Critical Social Theory, trans. by Kenneth Baynes. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, [1985] 1991.
  • Honneth, Axel. The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts, trans. by Joel Anderson. Cambridge: Polity Press, [1986] 1995.
  • Honneth, Axel. “The Intellectual legacy of Critical Theory”, in Fred Rush (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Honneth, Axel. The Idea of Socialism: towards a Renewal, Polity Press, Cambridge, 2017.
  • Horkheimer, Max. “Traditional and Critical Theory”, in Paul Connerton (ed.). Critical Sociology: Selected Readings, Harmondsworth: Penguin, [1937] 1976.
  • Horkheimer, Max and Theodor W. Adorno. Dialectic of Enlightenment, New York: Continuum, [1947] 1969.
  • Ingram, David. Critical Theory and Philosophy, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1990.
  • Ingram, David and Julia Simon-Ingram. Critical Theory: The Essential Readings, St. Paul: Paragon House, 1992.
  • Jay, Martin. The Dialectical Imagination, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996.
  • Lukács, Georg. History and Class Consciousness, Cambridge Mass.: MIT Press, [1968], 1971.
  • Marcuse, Herbert. “Philosophie und Kritische Theorie”, Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung VI:3 (1937).
  • Marcuse, Herbert. One Dimensional Man: Studies in the Ideology of Advanced Industrial Society, Boston: Beacon Press, 1964.
  • Mouffe, Chantal. The Democratic Paradox, London: Verso, 2005.
  • Rabinow, Paul (ed.). “Politics and Ethics: An Interview”, in The Foucault Reader, New York: Pantheon, 1984.
  • Rush, Fred. Critical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Wiggershaus, Rolf. The Frankfurt School, Cambridge: Polity Press, 1995.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, London: Routledge, 2001 [1st English edition 1922].


Author Information

Claudio Corradetti
University of Rome Tor Vergata