Gottlob Frege (1848-1925) is most celebrated today for his contributions to mathematical logic and the philosophy of language. The first section below considers why a philosophical investigation of language mattered at all for Frege, the mathematician, and why it should have mattered to him. At the same time, the considerations may serve to illustrate some general motivations that were behind the development of philosophy of language as a separate branch of philosophy in the 20th century. Section 2 deals with Frege’s idea of a formal language and the motivations for developing and employing such a language for purposes of logico-philosophical analysis. The shift from Frege’s early semantics to his famous distinction between sense and significance is explained in Section 3, as are the motivations for this shift. The section also contains a discussion of the difficulties that scholars have encountered when trying to find a proper English translation of Frege’s key semantic terms. Michael Dummett‘s claim that Frege had brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general has been an influential interpretation, but has increasingly been challenged in the past decades. The present article emphasizes that Frege’s philosophy of language should be regarded as a branch of epistemology, even if Frege himself did not fully engage in epistemology in the narrower sense of the term.
Long before Frege, it was considered commonplace that language is a necessary vehicle for human thought. In the modern period, Thomas Hobbes and John Locke had assigned two main characteristic uses to language with regard to thought: First, it is used to assist memory, or the representation and recording of one’s own thoughts; and second, it is used as a required vehicle of communication of one’s own thoughts to other people (Hobbes 1655:192-97; Locke 1690, Bk. III, §1). It was not before the later decades of the 19th century, however, that philosophical method was finally beginning to take a radically “linguistic turn” – investigating language in order to best deal with ontological or conceptual problems – and Frege has been regarded as one of the first and the most innovative thinkers in this respect.
For Frege, too, it was the very insight that human thought depends in certain ways on language, or on symbols in general, that compelled him to analyze the workings of language in order to investigate the logical structure of thought. Indeed, it seems that language itself was never the primary object of his philosophical interest. Rather, most of the general philosophical issues upon which Frege reflected, aside from his more specialized projects in the philosophy of mathematics, had to do with the nature of thought in general and its relation to logic, to truth, to language, and to the objects it can be about. In 1918, Frege published a lengthy essay titled “Thoughts,” in which he describes his motives for investigating the nature of language:
I am not here in the happy position of a mineralogist who shows his audience a rock-crystal: I cannot put a thought in the hands of my readers with the request that they should examine it from all sides. Something in itself not perceptible by sense, the thought is presented to the reader – and I must be content with that – wrapped up in a perceptible linguistic form. The pictorial aspect of language presents difficulties. The sensible always breaks in and makes expressions pictorial and so improper. So one fights against language, and I am compelled to occupy myself with language although it is not my proper concern here. I hope I have succeeded in making clear to my readers what I want to call ‘thought’ (1997:333f., n.).
Frege presents us with a dilemma that lies at the heart of his lifelong attitude toward language. On the one hand, language is indispensable for us in order to get access to thought. On the other hand, language – because of its sensible character – obscures thought (which by itself is insensible). Thus, Frege saw himself forced to deal with language by way of a continuous struggle – fighting the distortions that are imposed on thought by language, and diagnosing as well as clarifying the misunderstandings that result from these distortions.
But why is language indispensable for thought, and why did Frege think that it is? These two questions are central for an understanding of the rise of philosophy of language in general, and of Frege’s engagement in philosophy of language in particular. They are important because, if it turns out that we cannot find a convincing reason for the indispensability of language for thought, then the struggle with language that Frege is talking about above would not seem necessary for philosophical inquiry: we could just circumvent the obstacle of language and access our concepts and thoughts directly. Historically, dealing with the second question in particular might give us some insight about the extent of Frege’s possible indebtedness, or lack thereof, to earlier conceptions of the relations between language and thought and language as such.
Thus, it would be worthwhile taking a closer look at the two traditional functions of language with regard to thought that Hobbes and Locke distinguished in the context of their respective epistemological reflections. These were: (a) the indispensable assistance of language to memory, or to the representation and recording of one’s own thoughts, and (b) its role as a necessary vehicle of the communication of one’s own thoughts to other people.
If we take a closer look at those two characteristic functions of language as traditionally distinguished we find that they seem to be intimately connected. For one thing, if we conceive of human communication as essentially intentional – as has been the standard view probably throughout the history of philosophy, and most prominently advocated in the 20th century by Paul Grice – then we must ask just how we could even intend to convey a certain piece of information to someone else if we are not able to represent this information to ourselves in conscious thought. Our communicative intention would be quite void – there would be a missing element in the three-place relation “X intends to convey Y to Z”. Even less, it seems, could intentional communication ever succeed if the speaker is not herself aware of what she intends to communicate – unless, perhaps, we also acknowledge the existence of subconscious communicational intentions. But even in this case, it could be argued, the speaker presumably would need to be able to have a representation of what she subconsciously intends to convey in order to do so, and if such a representation is only to be had through language then even the kind of communication that rests on subconscious intentions could not take place without language.
To be sure, information may in principle be conveyed even without the conveyor’s intention, and perhaps it is merely a matter of terminology whether or not we acknowledge that there is also something like unintentional human communication: slips of the tongue, a blushful face, or mere movements of a face muscle, can only too well convey information about the thoughts or attitudes of the conveyor, and even indirectly about what these thoughts and attitudes are about. However, even if we include such phenomena in the category of “human communication”, it still appears that language is required for communication precisely insofar as it is required for the representation and recording of one’s own thoughts. For, in such a case, the very act of understanding the piece of information conveyed requires the person to whom it is conveyed to be able to record it for herself in her own memory; and, inasmuch as this requires language, human communication always requires language at least on he side of the receiver of the information – even if communication is to be understood as not presupposing communicational intentions. On this account, language appears as a necessary vehicle of human communication precisely because it is a necessary vehicle to record one’s own thoughts. Thus, communication of one’s own thoughts to another appears to be entirely dependent on representing and recording one’s own thoughts to herself.
Why should language be a necessary vehicle to record one’s own thoughts? And what does this exactly mean? Does it mean that language constitutes thought, so that the latter could not be without the former? Or does it merely mean that we could not become aware of our thoughts or could not grasp them without language?
Let us look at what Frege thought about this matter. His earliest and at the same time most comprehensive attempt to answer the first question above is in his 1882 piece “On the Scientific Justification of a Begriffsschrift”. The relevant passages are cited at full length:
Our attention is directed by nature to the outside. The vivacity of sense-impressions surpasses that of memory-images to such an extent that, at first, sense-impressions determine almost by themselves the course of our ideas, as is the case in animals. And we would scarcely ever be able to escape this dependency if the outer world were not to some degree dependent on us.
Even most animals, through their ability to move about, have an influence on their sense-impressions: They can flee some, seek others. And they can even effect changes in things. Now humans have this ability to a much greater degree; but nevertheless, the course of our ideas would still not gain its full freedom from this ability alone: It would still be limited to that which our hand can fashion, our voice intone, without the great invention of symbols, which call to mind that which is absent, invisible, perhaps even beyond the senses.
I do not deny that even without symbols the perception of a thing can gather about itself a group of memory-images; but we could not pursue these further: A new perception would let these images sink into darkness and allow others to emerge. But if we produce the symbol of an idea that a perception has called to mind, we create in this way a firm, new focus about which ideas gather. We then select another idea from these in order to elicit its symbol. Thus we penetrate step by step into the inner world of our ideas and move about there at will, using the realm of sensibles itself to free ourselves from its constraint. Symbols have the same importance for thought that discovering how to use the wind to sail against the wind had for navigation….
Also, without symbols we would scarcely lift ourselves to conceptual thinking. Thus in applying the same symbol to different but similar things, we actually no longer symbolize the individual thing, but rather what the similarities have in common: the concept. This concept is first gained by symbolizing it; for since it is, in itself, imperceptible, it requires a perceptible representative in order to appear to us” (1972:83f. Note, Frege’s expression “men” has been changed to “humans”).
Frege appears to locate the source of the dependence of human thought on language in the power that sensation exerts on our attention. Based on this he specifies three main characteristic domains of thought for which we need symbols. First, without symbols we could not become aware of things that are physically absent or insensible. Without them we could only become aware of our immediate sensations and some fleeting memory images of these sensations. This view, however – that we could not grasp or become aware of thoughts about invisible things – does not by itself imply that the thoughts themselves could not be without language.
The second domain concerns memory in general. Though according to Frege, the mere perception of a physical object can serve as a focus around which memory images gather even without the help of symbols, these would not be stable and lasting, for new perceptual images would soon take their place. Immediate sensations are usually so much stronger than memory images that without the help of a tool by means of which we could regulate the train and content of our thought independently of sensation it would be almost entirely determined by immediate sensory input. Thus, what Frege seems to have in mind here is that only by using symbols do we enable ourselves to memorize ideas in such a way that we can henceforth call them up more or less at will. In this way, symbols – though themselves sensible – are able, to a large extent, to free us from our dependence on the sensible world. Again, this argument leads only to the conclusion that we could not freely call up past thoughts about the world – it does not show that these thoughts could not exist in the first place without language.
In any case, why should the memory of symbols be less subject to the overwhelming influence of immediate sensations than the fleeting memory images caused by perception without the help of symbols? Perhaps a later passage in the same paper gives us a clue about how it seemed possible to Frege that due to its very nature language could give us power over the immediate impact of sensation and thus enable us to memorize our thoughts:
It is impossible, someone might say, to advance science with a conceptual notation, for the invention of the latter already presupposes the completion of the former. Exactly the same apparent difficulty arises for [ordinary] language. This is supposed to have made reason possible, but how could humans have invented language without reason? Research into the laws of nature employs physical instruments; but these can be produced only by means of an advanced technology, which again is based upon knowledge of the laws of nature. The circle is resolved in each case in the same way: An advance in physics results in an advance in technology, and this makes possible the construction of new instruments by means of which physics is advanced. The application to our case is obvious (1972:89).
Here, Frege draws an analogy between language and reason on the one hand, and technology and science on the other. In both cases, each of the two elements in the respective pairs is needed in order to advance the other. Thus, language is needed to develop and/or employ our faculty of reasoning, on the one hand, but at the same time reason has to be presupposed to a certain degree in order for language to be possible. Hence, for Frege there is something which is the condition of possibility of language, even though that something –which he calls reason – may not fully function or be applicable without language as its tool. This suggests that for Frege reason is also what enables us to overcome the power of immediate sensual input by using language as a tool; it enables us to memorize links between symbols and what they symbolize even despite the continuous influx of fleeting sensations and memory images. In effect, Frege appears to propose a non-vicious circle between reason and language such that, roughly, the former enables us – by its very nature – to hold in memory a small initial assortment of symbols, and such that the use of these symbols then expands our rational capacities to allow for the combinations and application of those symbols, which in turn are stored in the memory to lead to further combinations – as well as the possible invention of new symbols or symbolic systems – whose use leads to further mental expansion, etc. This conception seems to rule out that language could be the product of mere sensation, at least if sensation is not to be conceived of as part of reason or as its basis.
Frege’s third explanation for why we need language in order to think is that without the help of symbols we could never raise ourselves to the level of specifically conceptual thinking. For, according to Frege in the passage above, we acquire concepts only by applying the same symbol to different but similar things, thereby no longer symbolizing the individual things, but rather what they have in common: the concept. Again, this argument does not show that concepts could not exist without language or symbols; rather, it shows that concepts could not become available to us without language. In Frege’s own terms, it shows that we could not represent to ourselves what a group of similar things have in common, which is what he calls a concept.
Scholars point out that aspects of Frege’s 1882 explanation of why we need language in order to think suggest an empiricist, psychologist account (at least of thought content) according to which thought content derives simply from sense impressions via memory images; however, this stands in contrast at least to Frege’s later views on the matter (for example, Sluga 2002:82). Indeed, Frege’s above admission that at the most basic level sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual conceptual elements seems to stand in direct contrast to rationalist as well as Kantian accounts of the nature of perception. Though, as we saw in the previous section, none of Frege’s arguments for the dependency of thought on language explicitly commit him to the view that the very existence of concepts or thought contents depend on language, the idea that at least basic thoughts and memories are possible on the basis of sensation alone raises the question of why then not all thought and memory content may derive – by means of language – from sensual images (which clearly would be an empiricist view).
If this assessment of Frege’s 1882 view of content is correct, then it might also be relevant to our evaluation of the above argument as an attempt at explaining why language is necessary for thought. For if, by contrast, we assume that the human mind is furnished with innate ideas in addition to the faculty of sensation – as had been the standard view in modern Continental Rationalism – then it might need some more argumentation to show why concepts become available to us only through the application of general symbols to things that we perceive through the senses, or why we could think of invisible, insensible things only by creating symbols for them. After all, innate ideas – if they exist – are in a certain sense continually present in the mind, if not in our consciousness, and this very presence could perhaps already explain why we are able to memorize perceptual experiences, to engage in conceptual thinking, and in general to overcome the continuous impact of sensation on our attention. In other words, if our minds were already furnished with innate ideas then it would need further explanation to understand why reason could not have a direct impact on human consciousness, that is, why it needs language in addition in order to guide and develop our capacity of thinking. If we assume, however, that thought contents are by their very nature entirely made up of sensations and images gained through sensation, then it would seem much more obvious that without the acquisition of general symbols to represent concepts – instead of the individual, elusive images delivered by sensation – there would be no way for us to make use of and memorize them.
Thus, if Frege held a rationalist view of thought contents at this early point, his argument above for the indispensability of thought for language would still appear somewhat incomplete, and if he was an empiricist about thought content at the time but changed his view later, he should have been expected to supplement his argument at that later time in order to convince us of the necessity to study language in order to explore concepts and thoughts. So let us take a closer look both at Frege’s views of the nature of thought content and at plausible rationalist motivations for the philosophical study of language based on the idea that language is necessary for human thought.
Let us first get back to Frege’s apparent view – in his 1882 piece – that basic forms of sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual thought contents. This view appears to contradict his own later remarks on perception in, for instance, 1918′s “Thought”. There he emphasizes that:
Sense impressions alone do not reveal the external world to us. Perhaps there is a being that has only sense impressions without seeing or touching things….Having visual impressions is certainly necessary for seeing things, but not sufficient. What must still be added is not anything sensible. And yet this is just what opens up the external world for us; for without this non-sensible something everyone would remain shut up in his inner world. So perhaps, since the decisive factor lies in the non-sensible, something non-sensible, even without the cooperation of sense impressions, could also lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts (1997: 342f.).
For Frege, forming a thought about the external world — even the kind of thought involved in the mere perception of an object — requires more than sense impressions that are available to the human mind. In addition, something non-sensible has to be assumed in order to account for the possibility of perception. The aim of “Thought” was to show that this something is the thought itself — an entity that, as Frege argues here, belongs neither to the inner world of subjective ideas nor to the world of spatio-temporal, perceivable objects, but rather to a third realm of objective but non-physical things. Indeed, as we read in an earlier passage of the piece, “although the thought does not belong with the contents of the thinker’s consciousness, there must be something in his consciousness that is aimed at the thought. But this should not be confused with the thought itself” (ibid.: 342). In this last passage, Frege clearly distinguishes between a conscious act of thinking – which must be in a certain way “aimed at” an abstract, objective thought – and the thought itself at which it is aimed.
In addition, Frege explicitly rejects the idea that sense impressions alone could enable our minds to grasp such an objective, non-sensible thought — rather, what is required is again something “non-sensible.” This idea obviously fits in with what he said in his 1882 piece about the relation between language and reason. For according to that remark, language – as a means for grasping thoughts – presupposes reason at least as an independent potential. Reason, then, is a likely candidate for the “something non-sensible” that may be required, according to Frege in 1918, “to lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts.” Since language itself consists of and works through the perception and use of sensible symbols, it could not be language that Frege has in mind here. However, Frege does not make use of the term “reason” in his 1918 piece but speaks more concretely of a “special mental capacity, the power of thinking”, which is supposed to explain our ability to grasp a thought (ibid.: 341).
In any case, these remarks provide clear evidence that Frege in 1918 conceived of thoughts as existing independently of both physical and empirically psychological reality – thereby ruling out an empiricist account of their constitution. They do not provide conclusive evidence that Frege endorsed a rationalist or transcendentalist view of the origin or nature of conceptual entities, if by this we understand a view according to which either a special faculty of reason – or pure understanding – or alternatively a certain normative value or principle that is constitutive of rationality in general serve to provide the conceptual content of our thought episodes. Rather, Frege’s 1918 remarks would just as well be compatible with a naive Platonist view about thought contents, according to which their objective existence is a brute fact, that is, not accountable or explainable in terms of anything else. (This still seems to be one of the most dominant readings of the nature of Fregean thoughts, as well as concepts and numbers; see Baker and Hacker 1984, Dummett 1991, Burge 1992, & al.)
It seems obvious, however, that Frege favored a broadly rationalist or transcendentalist account of the origin of conceptual entities both in his first monograph Conceptual Notation (1879) and in his second, The Foundations of Arithmetic (1884). For in §23 of Conceptual Notation, Frege claims to have shown “how pure thought, regardless of any content given through the senses or even given a priori through an intuition, is able, all by itself, to produce from the content which arises from its own nature judgments that at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition.” What Frege has in mind here by “the content that arises from its [pure thought's] own nature” obviously is the content of the laws of logic, which he also calls the “laws of thought” in his preface to Conceptual Notation. Those judgments, by contrast, which “at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition” presumably are those of arithmetic, which Kant had believed to be grounded on the pure intuition of time. This 1879 metaphor of pure thought as grounding arithmetical judgments by way of “the content that arises from its own nature” not only appears inconsistent with Frege’s 1882 seeming slip into psychologism about mental content, but at the same time suggests a rationalist or transcendental approach to the nature of at least some of the contents of our judgments. This is so if we conceive of “pure thought” as referring to a capacity or principle that is constitutive of the rational mind, which is how this expression, and similar ones, had been used by Leibniz, Kant, and their successors.
Indeed, in Foundations Frege explicitly sympathizes with Leibniz’s view that “the whole of arithmetic is innate and is in virtual fashion in us;” a view according to which even what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it (1953, §11). In other passages of Foundations, Frege presents objectivity itself as being constituted by reason, and numbers as its nearest kin:
I understand objective to mean what is independent of our sensations, intuition and imagination, and of all construction of mental pictures out of memories of earlier sensations, but not what is independent of the reason, – for what are things independent of the reason? To answer that would be as much as to judge without judging, or to wash the fur without wetting it (1953, §26).
[O]bjectivity cannot, of course be based on any sense-impression, which as an affection of our mind is entirely subjective, but only, so far as I can see, on the reason (ibid., §27).
On this view of numbers the charm of work on arithmetic and analysis is, it seems to me, easily accounted for. We might say, indeed, almost in the well-known words: The reason’s proper study is itself. In arithmetic we are not concerned with objects which we come to know as something alien from without through the medium of the senses, but with objects given directly to our reason and, as its nearest kin, utterly transparent to it. And yet, or rather for that very reason, these objects are not subjective fantasies. There is nothing more objective than the laws of arithmetic” (ibid., §105).
The first passage above, in particular, recalls Kant´s idea that objectivity is not a feature of things-in-themselves, but of things as they are constituted and apprehended by means of logical forms of judgment, pure categories of understanding and pure forms of intuition. These latter constitute part of the transcendental as opposed to the subjective, psychological aspect of the mind according to Kant. Scholars who tend to read Frege from the perspective of Neo-Kantianism have therefore taken passages like those above as strong evidence for the thesis that his notion of objectivity was not dogmatically metaphysical but epistemological in the tradition of transcendental philosophy (cf. Sluga 1980:120).
In any case, it seems that under the presupposition of either a naive Platonist or a rationalist/transcendentalist account of the origins of objective thought contents, the strength of Frege’s 1882 argument for the indispensability of symbols for human thought rests largely on assumptions about the causal influence of sensation on our train of thought. Indeed, as we saw, Frege had initiated this argument with observations about the effect of sense-impressions on our attention. In this he simply followed Leibniz, who – although a rationalist about the origin of thought – had granted that the senses are required to make the mind attentive to truths and to direct it towards some truths rather than others. For this reason, according to Leibniz, even though intellectual ideas and the truths arising from them do not “originate in the senses”, without the senses we would never think of them (ibid., I, i, §§5, 11). Similarly, Kant points out in the Critique of Pure Reason that our empirical consciousness must be prompted by sensation or sensible impressions in order to have a beginning in time; hence “all our cognitions commence with experience” (1781/86:B1). Frege obviously agrees with Kant and Leibniz on this point, as he regards sense impressions as necessary – if not sufficient – for perception insofar as they “occasion our judgments” (1924/5, 1979:267; see also Frege’s preface to Conceptual Notation, 1972:103). Indeed, with regard to the causality of consciousness we would be “as stupid as rocks” without sense impressions, “and should know nothing either of numbers or of anything else” (1953, §105, n.).
Given such presuppositions about the causal role sensation plays in the generation of actual processes of conscious thought, Frege can still make his case for the necessity of language for thinking by arguing as follows: Without sensible symbols, which – due to their intimate connection to reason (perhaps in the form of a set of innate ideas) – are able to draw our attention away from other sensory input and toward conceptual thought, our entire mental life would be largely dictated by the nature of our immediate sensations. Therefore, we would be psychologically unable to rise to higher forms of conscious awareness and contemplation than those provided by immediate sense perception and the fleeting memory images arising from it. This way of arguing would not commit him to the view that concepts or conceptual thought contents themselves depend for their existence on symbols or on any other sensible images. Rather, the dependence of human thought on language could itself be thought of as merely causal (Baker and Hacker 1984:65f.). As we saw before, Frege apparently sympathized with Leibniz’s view that what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it. But if we need to learn about truths and concepts that have been in our understanding all along – as Leibniz saw it – then this is compatible with the claim that in order to learn them we need to use language.
Indeed, in a much later piece written and submitted for publication shortly before his death (“Sources of Knowledge of Mathematics and the Mathematical Natural Sciences”), Frege finally comes to explicitly commit himself to the view that language is necessary not for the existence of thought contents themselves, but only for our conscious awareness of them, that is, for our acts of thinking. In this context, he speaks of a “logical source of knowledge” and a “logical disposition” in us that must be at work in the formation of language, where he made use in 1882 of the ambiguous word “reason” and in 1918 of the expression “power of thinking” to denote a special mental capacity:
The senses present us with something external and because of this it is easier to comprehend how mistakes can occur than it is in the case of the logical source of knowledge which is wholly inside us and thus appears to be more proof against contamination. But appearances are deceptive. For our thinking is closely bound up with language and thereby with the world of the senses. Perhaps our thinking is at first a form of speaking which then becomes an imaging of speech. Silent thinking would in that case be speech that has become noiseless, taking place in the imagination. Now we may of course also think in mathematical signs; yet even then thinking is tied up with what is perceptible to the senses. To be sure, we distinguish the sentence as the expression of a thought from the thought itself. We know we can have various expressions for the same thought. The connection of a thought with one particular sentence is not a necessary one; but that a thought of which we are conscious is connected in our mind with some sentence or other is for us humans necessary.
But that does not lie in the nature of the thought but in our own nature. There is no contradiction in supposing there to exist beings that can grasp the same thought as we do without needing to clad it in a form that can be perceived by the senses. But still, for us humans there is this necessity. Language is a human creation; and so humans had, it would appear, the capacity to shape it in conformity with the logical disposition alive in them. Certainly the logical disposition of humans was at work in the formation of language but equally alongside this many other dispositions – such as the poetic disposition. And so language is not constructed from a logical “blueprint” (1979:269).
Here, Frege explains how it comes about that language in a certain sense “contaminates” the logical source of knowledge – that is, the faculty in us that enables us to have knowledge about logical structures and relations. As he sees it here, this logical disposition in us is not identical to the ability to speak a language, although it is required for the development and acquisition of a language. As he points out in a later passage,
If we disregard how thinking occurs in the consciousness of an individual, and attend instead to the true nature of thinking, we shall not be able to equate it with speaking. In that case we shall not derive thinking from speaking; thinking will then emerge as that which has priority and we shall not be able to blame thinking for the logical defects we have noted in language” (ibid.: 270).
Accordingly, thoughts are not to be identified with their linguistic expressions, and they do not in principle require any language in order to be accessible to rationally ideal beings that are capable of grasping them in an entirely non-sensible way. Presumably, these beings would possess a logical source of knowledge that is so powerful that it doesn’t require language at all in order to produce acts of thought. This idea again recalls Leibniz’s account of the nature of thought, and in particular of his admission that God and the angels were exactly such rational beings who do not – like human beings – require language in order to think (Leibniz 1704/1765, Bk. IV, ch. 5, §1). They do not require language precisely because their attention is not distracted or dominated by the continuous impact of sense impressions.
As opposed to this, Frege points out human beings require language in order to become conscious of a thought. And this, together with the fact that ordinary language – the kind of language in which human beings normally learn to think – is shaped also by other, less rational aspects of human nature, explains for Frege why actual human thought (as opposed to the bare content of pure thought, or that at which an act of thinking, as part of human consciousness, has to aim in order to be a thought at all) is prone to impurity through the influence of the language in which it is normally clad.
These results raise doubts about Michael Dummett‘s notorious claim that Frege brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general (1981a: 669f.). Dummett’s central claim about Frege’s philosophy of language is that Frege simply converted traditional problems of epistemology into questions about language (1991: 111-112). The question, for instance, of how “numbers [are] given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them” raised by Frege in §62 of Foundations, is clearly epistemological. However, according to Dummett, it simply becomes the question of how we refer to, that is, succeed in talking about, numbers. And as Dummett understands this question, it is answered simply by Frege’s account of the meanings of conventionally introduced expressions. The problem with this interpretation is that, presumably, for Frege any complete account of how expressions can possess meaning at all would have to involve a complete account of how we can grasp and understand pure thoughts – and it does not appear that he thought this question could be sufficiently answered with recourse to language simply because for Frege language itself presupposes certain rational capacities in order to be capable of expressing thoughts.
This seems to be precisely why Frege repeatedly takes refuge in various metaphors to indicate the existence of certain rational faculties that enable us to grasp a thought, like the mysterious “power of thinking” that he talks about in “Thought”. Indeed, in a draft dating from 1897 he explicitly describes the act of thinking as “perhaps the most mysterious of all”, and adds that he regards the question of how it is possible as “still far from being grasped in all its difficulty” (1979:145). At the same time, he explicitly denies that this question could ever be answered in terms of empirical psychology or in terms of logic. Certainly, then, he could not seriously hold that specifying a relation between expressions and what they designate, or between sentences and their truth-values, could ever fully replace the question of how it is possible that we can think of anything at all.
Consequently, this also means that a philosophy of language in Frege’s view could never be more than a fragment of a complete philosophy of human thought, albeit an important one. Dummett is aware that in this sense, Frege’s philosophical account of thought and understanding is still incomplete; however, it is doubtful that Frege would have agreed that it could be completed by reflecting further on the uses and functions of language – which is Dummett’s own proposal (1981:413). In fact, whether the question of what thoughts consist in and what their preconditions are could be completely settled within the philosophy of language or not has been one of the major – and most interesting – issues of dispute in 20th century analytic philosophy. (For detailed discussions of Dummett’s interpretation of Frege see Dummett and Lotter 2004, chap. 2.4.)
We now begin to understand why language was a serious matter to Frege, even though he did not consider it his primary object of interest. His interest in the philosophy of language was based on his firm belief that language is necessary for human thought, and it was triggered in particular by his investigations into the foundations of mathematics, in which he faced a serious problem concerning the symbolic tools that were available at the time for such investigations. In his 1919 “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter,” he describes the problem that first led him to investigate language as follows:
I started out from mathematics. The most pressing need, it seemed to me, was to provide this science with a better foundation. I soon realized that number is not a heap, a series of things, nor a property of a heap either, but that in stating a number that we have arrived at as the result of counting we are making a statement about a concept.
The logical imperfections of language stood in the way of such investigations. I tried to overcome these obstacles with my concept-script. In this way I was led from mathematics to logic” (1979:253).
Frege Points out that the logical imperfections of language – by which he means the natural language of everyday life, or the “language of life”, as he sometimes calls it – had proven to be an obstacle for his investigations into the ontology of numbers and the epistemology of mathematics, especially arithmetic. He was trying to find out whether all arithmetic formulas could be proven on the basis of logical axioms and definitions alone, and whether numbers could therefore be construed as logical objects – a view that later came to be called “logicism.” In order to find this out, Frege had to see just “how far one could get in arithmetic by inferences alone, supported only by the laws of thought that transcend all particulars” (1997:48). However, the formula language of arithmetic, in which numbers and their relations are expressed, did not contain expressions for specifically logical relations; and ordinary language proved to be insufficiently transparent with regard to the discovery of logical relations – especially logical consequence – to serve Frege’s purposes well. Therefore, Frege decided to create what he regarded as a logically superior notational system for arithmetic – a notational system that was supposed to be as transparent as possible with respect to the logical structure of thought in that area, and one that contained symbols not only for arithmetical entities but also for specifically logical relations and concepts. Moreover, each term contained or introduced into this notational system should be given a precise and fixed meaning by way of definitions in terms of small number of primitive terms.
Following Adolf Trendelenburg (in his 1867 essay “On Leibniz’s Project of a Universal Characteristic”) Frege baptized his new symbolic system “Begriffsschrift”. (Although “Begriffsschrift” is usually translated as “concept script” or “conceptual notation”, it is sometimes translated differently; in Frege 1952, for example, it is translated as “ideography”.) He gives two independent reasons for the choice of this terminology: First – as he explains in the preface to Conceptual Notation – because in it all and only that part of the content of natural language expressions is to be represented that is of significance for logical inference; and this is what Frege called the “conceptual content” of an expression (1997:49). Secondly – as we learn again from his 1882 piece mentioned earlier – Frege means by “Begriffsschrift” a symbolic system in which, contrary to natural language, the written symbols come to express their subject matter directly, that is, without the intervention of speech (1972:88). In this way, expressions of conceptual content could be radically abbreviated; for instance, a simple statement could be accommodated in one line as a formula of the concept script. Frege also decided to represent complex statements of propositional logic – statements linking two or more simple statements – in a two-dimensional manner for reasons of perspicuity.
Historically, the idea of a concept script derives from the Leibnizian project of developing a so-called “universal characteristic” (characteristica universalis): A universal symbolic system in which every complex concept is completely defined based on a set of primitive concepts and logical rules of inference and definition, and which thus enables us to make the conceptual structure of our universe explicit. Such a symbolic system would also contain a logical calculus (calculus ratiocinator) consisting of purely syntactic inference rules based on the types of symbols used within the formal language. However, according to the Leibnizian conception, logic itself is not merely a calculus but expressible in an ideal language, that is, in the universal characteristic. Frege certainly adopted this view of logic from Leibniz; his main source of his understanding of Leibniz’s conception very likely was again Trendelenburg’s essay (Sluga 1980, ch. 2.4). However, 20th and 21st century mainstream analytic philosophy has somewhat misleadingly characterized Frege as regarding logic itself as a universal language rather than a calculus (for example, van Heijenoort, 1967).
The latter characterization is misleading for two reasons. The first is that, as we have seen, Frege did not regard language as the source of thought contents; he did regard logic, however, as consisting of (true) thought contents (though this has been recently disputed for the Frege of the Conceptual Notation period in Linnebo 2003). Hence, he could not have regarded logic as being identical with any language. Secondly, Frege did not actually attempt to develop his concept script as a universal language in Leibniz’s sense (though he agrees that logic itself contains universally applicable laws of thought). Rather, he held the more cautious belief that if such a language could be developed at all, its development would have to proceed gradually, in a step-by-step manner:
“Arithmetical, geometrical and chemical symbols can be regarded as realizations of the Leibnizian conception in particular fields. The concept script offered here adds a new one to these – indeed, the one located in the middle, adjoining all the others. From here, with the greatest prospect of success, one can then proceed to fill in the gaps in the existing formula languages, connect their hitherto separate fields into the domain of a single formula language and extend it to fields that have hitherto lacked such a language” (1997:50).
Thus, Frege intended his concept script primarily for the expression of logical relations within the realm of arithmetic – the field that he saw as located in the middle of all other areas of possible inquiry. He did seem optimistic that his concept-script could be successfully applied “wherever a special value has to be placed on the validity of proof” (ibid.); and this seemed appropriate not only with regard to mathematics but also with regard to “fields where, besides conceptual necessity, natural necessity prevails” – that is, the pure theory of motion, mechanics and physics (ibid.). He also expressed – in the 1882 piece mentioned earlier – the belief that in principle the concept-script could be applied wherever logical relations pertain, and that therefore philosophers as well should pay attention to it. However, he was never ambitious or even interested in examining how it could be applied to areas that were remote from arithmetic.
Frege’s revival of the idea of a universal, logically ideal language for the analysis and advancement of science and human knowledge subsequently became extremely influential especially through the writings of Russell and the early Wittgenstein and it contributed to the development of Logical Positivism in the first half of the 20th century. Rudolf Carnap and other members of the Vienna Circle actually worked on the establishment of a universal formal language of science in which not only every scientific theory could be expressed in a unified way, but also every meaningful philosophical problem would be soluble by way of logical reconstruction (Carnap 1928a and 1928b). Still in the fifties and sixties of the last century, after attempts at establishing a universal formal language of science had eventually proven unsuccessful, Nelson Goodman practiced and endorsed an axiomatic approach — based on the idea of multiple formal reconstructions of certain areas of philosophical inquiry — for investigating the conceptual relation between universals and particulars and between the world of phenomenal experience and that of physical objects (Goodman 1951, 1963). Frege, by contrast, never applied his concept-script to fields other than logic and mathematics, choosing an informal, argumentative (rather than formal) and “constructivist” approach to dealing with philosophical issues arising from – or underlying – his logicist project. Some remarks in the preface to Conceptual Notation might give us a clue as to why he did not go so far as Carnap and Goodman in his adherence to formula language in philosophical inquiry. There, Frege uses the analogy of the microscope and the eye in order to explain the relation between ordinary language (or the “language of life”, as Frege calls it) and concept-script:
The latter (that is, the eye), because of the range of its applicability and because of the ease with which it can adapt itself to the most varied circumstances, has a great superiority over the microscope. Of course, viewed as an optical instrument it reveals many imperfections, which usually remain unnoticed only because of its intimate connection with mental life. But as soon as scientific purposes place strong requirements upon sharpness of resolution, the eye proves to be inadequate. On the other hand, the microscope is perfectly suited for just such purposes; but, for this very reason, it is useless for all others” (1972:105).
According to Frege, the concept-script is not to replace ordinary language in all its uses; on the contrary, he regards it as “useless” in all contexts but “scientific” ones. Given this belief, it remains undecided whether Frege regarded philosophy itself as an entirely scientific discipline or whether he thought that there are areas of philosophy in which the concept-script would be useless in principle. That he never even considered formalizing his claims about perception, meaning, the nature of thought, or the basis of objectivity may be taken as some evidence for the latter, although it would not be conclusive.
What all of these “formal language” approaches have in common is not merely the insight that ordinary language lacks a certain amount of transparency when it comes to exploring the meanings and logical relations between words and sentences. It is moreover the assumption that an artificial formula language is in principle able to capture the logical structure of thought – or even of the world itself as it is reflected in thought – better than any natural language that characterizes the approach to language taken by Frege – and after him Russell, the early Wittgenstein, and the Logical Positivists.
The following is a brief survey of what Frege considered the most prominent logical impurities of natural language that stood in the way of his logical investigations into the foundations of arithmetic, and how Frege thought them to be eliminated in a logically perfect language like his concept-script.
According to Frege, the difference between concept and object is not generally well observed in natural languages. Often, the same word serves to designate both a concept and an object that falls under it. The word “horse”, for instance, sometimes serves to denote a concept, as in “This is a horse”, other times a single object, as in “This horse is black”, and sometimes also an entire biological species, as in “The horse is an herbivorous animal” (1972:84). Even though we could read the second sentence above as “There is exactly one x at location y such that x is a horse and x is black”, thereby maintaining the same logical category for “horse” as in the first sentence, this syntactical structure is not transparent in ordinary language. In a logically ideal language, by contrast, every word or complex expression would have to stand for exactly one object, concept, or relation, and it would have to be clear from the syntax of the language — that is, from the syntactical categories of the expressions themselves — to which of those ontological categories the entity designated belongs. Thus, the logical syntax of the language would reflect the logical structure within the realm of entities to which it is applied.
The main rationale for Frege’s strict distinction between concepts and objects, as well as their corresponding syntactic categories, appears to lie in his understanding of logical unity. In his “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter” Frege points out that:
[W]here logic is concerned, it seems that every combination of parts results from completing something that is in need of supplementation; where logic is concerned, no whole can consist of saturated parts alone. The sharp separation of what is in need of supplementation from what is saturated is very important” (1983:254).
Frege does not think that a logical unit such as a sentence, a thought, or truth value could consist of components all of which are logically complete; such components could not really hang together to constitute a logical whole. Rather, in order to account for the possibility of logically complex units at all, we have to assume that they are composed of a combination of two types of logical components; saturated, complete, self-subsisting ones, on the one hand, and unsaturated, incomplete ones – ones that essentially are in need of supplementation – on the other. On the level of ontology, Frege calls every unsaturated entity a “concept” or “relation”, and every saturated one an “object”. Up until the very last phase of his intellectual career, he included in the latter category not only physical things, and psychological events, but also abstract entities like sets, numbers, truth values, and even entire thoughts (in his specific sense of that which is grasped in an act of thinking).
On the syntactic level, the contrast between saturated and unsaturated entities is reflected in the distinction between proper names, on the one hand, and predicates (which Frege calls “concept-words”) on the other. In this sense, we can say that in Frege, syntactic distinctions as well as relations are not only presupposed in the creation of any meaningful linguistic unit but they already have a meaning in themselves. Thus, the mere combination of a proper name with a predicate in a logically ideal language as such already expresses something – namely, it expresses that an object falls under a concept (which was for Frege the most basic logical relation one can think of).
A proper name in Frege’s sense is any singular expression, that is, a proper name is any expression that serves to designate one and only one particular object; a predicate, by contrast, designates a concept or a relation. Thus, the class of Fregean proper names in ordinary language comprises not only names in the narrow sense like “Aristotle” but also any other expression that is used to refer to one particular object. Notoriously, since at least from 1891 onwards Frege conceives of truth values as objects and of sentences as referring to truth values (1892a), he regards complete sentences of ordinary language as proper names as well – unlike assertions or asserted judgments, which are represented in the concept script by means of an assertion sign (1906a; 1979:195).
Besides its lack of exact correspondence between syntactical and ontological categories, another problem of ordinary language – which Frege encountered not only in fictional but also in scientific contexts – is that of empty proper names. These are grammatically well-formed singular expressions that do not happen to denote anything, or that apply to more than one thing and therefore do not actually fulfill their function as singular terms. One example that Frege cites is the syntactically well-formed expression “the celestial body most distant from the Earth”; it is doubtful whether this expression denotes anything at all. This is even more obvious with expressions like “the least rapidly convergent series”, which are just as void of an object of designation as is the name “Odysseus” (1892a; 1952:58; 1997:153). In his very late phase, Frege traces back the paradoxes of set theory, which brought about the failure of his logicist project, to this very problem of empty singular terms in natural language, as it had misled him into believing that sets, (that is, extensions of concepts) and numbers were logical objects (1979:269f.; 1997:369f.).
In a logically perfect language, by contrast, “every expression grammatically well constructed as a proper name out of signs already introduced shall in fact designate an object, and… no new sign shall be introduced as a proper name without being secured a significance” (1952:70, 1997:163). In addition Frege suggested that, if need be, an artificial significance could be stipulated for all those proper names that turn out to lack reference to an actually existing object (ibid.).
According to Frege, while proper names serve to designate objects, concept-words serve to designate concepts, which as such belong to an entirely separate logical category (1892:5). This is also reflected in the use of concept-words, which — in contrast to proper names — can refer even if no object falls under the concept they designate (1979:123ff). Nonetheless, a concept-word lacks significance just like an empty proper name if it does not clearly express under which conditions an object falls under the designated concept and under which it doesn’t. For Frege, the logic of pure thought cannot acknowledge concepts with undetermined boundaries (1891a, 1891b).
It seems obvious that most, if not all, concept-words in natural language lack the kind of semantic precision that Frege expects of a logically perfect language. For instance, do we know exactly under what conditions anyone falls under the concept of baldness and under what conditions s/he does not? If not then – barring the remote possibility that there really is a sharp boundary of which we are more or less ignorant – most if not all ordinary language concept-words have vague meanings in Frege’s sense. Hence, strictly speaking most, if not all, concept-words in ordinary language would lack significance, according to Frege’s logic.
In a logically perfect language – as Frege conceived of it – the vagueness of predicates could be eliminated through their arrangement in an axiomatic system, through logical analysis, as well as informal elucidations and clarification of the primitive terms by way of examples. Frege strictly distinguishes definitions from illustrative examples. The latter, together with other forms of elucidation, merely serve to clarify the meanings of primitive signs (signs whose meanings cannot be analyzed further into logical components). Theoretically, one would never be able to fully clarify the meaning of such an expression by way of examples; however, according to Frege “we do manage to come to an understanding about the meanings of words” in practice. Whether we do, of course, will in this case always depend on a “meeting of minds, on others guessing what we have in mind” (1914/1979:207).
Definitions in the proper sense are constructive, in that they introduce a new sign to abbreviate a more complex expression that we have constructed out of its logical components. Frege distinguishes from these purely stipulative definitions cases of what were in his time called “analytic definitions”. These display a logical analysis of the sense of a sign that has long been in use before by identifying its sense with that of a complex expression; this sense then is a function of the senses of the latter’s logical parts. In this case the meaning equation is not a mere matter of arbitrary stipulation but can only be recognized by “an immediate insight.”
For Frege, the logician’s main goal in her struggle with language is to “separate the logical from the psychological;” that is, the logician’s main goal in her struggle with language is to isolate the logically relevant aspects of grammar and meaning from those that are not. Frege defines “logically relevant aspects of grammar” as only those aspects of language that have a bearing on logical inference (1979:4). Accordingly, as philosophers interested in pure thought we “have to turn our backs on” any grammatical distinctions and elements of meaning that are not relevant for logical inferences, or that may even obscure them.
This includes, but is not limited to, the grammatical distinction between the subject and the predicate of a sentence, which Frege contends misled logicians for centuries. Grammatically speaking, the subject of a sentence is the expression that signifies what the sentence is “about”, or as Frege puts it, the subject of the sentence is “the concept with which the judgment is chiefly concerned” (1979:113). The predicate, by contrast, would then be the expression that signifies what is being said about the subject or, alternatively, the concept that is applied to the subject. So, for instance, in the sentence “Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse,” the word “Archimedes” appears to be the subject; and “…perished at the conquest of Syracuse, “the predicate. According to Frege, however, the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate, which used to be the model for traditional logic, does not match the logical structure of that part of the content of sentences that is relevant for logic.
More precisely, Frege thought the distinction between subject and predicate to be neither necessary nor sufficient to describe the logical structure of thought. It is not necessary because it yields distinctions between sentences that appear to have the same logical power of inference. For instance, the following two sentences obviously are grammatically distinct:
(1) “At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians.”
(2) “At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks.”
In (1) “the Greeks” appears to be the grammatical subject, while in (2) it is “the Persians”. Yet from a logical point of view the two sentences have the same conceptual content, and therefore do not need to be distinguished in a logically perfect language (ibid.:112f.); all the consequences that can be derived from (1) combined with certain others can also be derived from (2) combined with the same others, which means that the logically relevant part of their content, which Frege decides to call “conceptual content”, is the same.
The second reason why Frege thought the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate is unnecessary for the expression of, or distinction between, conceptual contents and their components is that, logically speaking, the linguistic expression of a judgment or assertion can always be rephrased as a combination of a nominal phrase, which contains the entire conceptual content, and a grammatical predicate like “is a fact” or “is true”, which does not add anything to that content. Hence, as Frege points out, “we can imagine a language in which the proposition “Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse” would be expressed in the following way: “The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse is a fact” (1879, §3; 1972:113). In such a case the grammatical subject contains the whole content of the judgment and the predicate serves only to present this content as a judgment; hence, strictly speaking, nothing at the level of conceptual content — at the level of what is relevant to logical inference — corresponds to the predicate here. In fact, for Frege a logically ideal language like the concept-script is a language in which the only grammatical predicate is “is a fact”, represented by a combination of the so-called judgment stroke “ ” and the content stroke “~”; and occurring to the left of judgable contents (” ….”) (1879, §2). Because Frege conceives of such contents as identical to the contents of nominal phrases and thus all complete expressions in his system are names (or “terms” in Russellian terminology), his sentential logic today is sometimes called “term logic” (for example, Zalta 2004) as opposed to standard propositional logic, in which propositions or sentences are regarded as a logical category distinct from both predicates and terms.
Furthermore, even for cases when we do seem to be able to use the distinction between predicate and subject to analyze judgable contents into their components, Frege thought the grammatical opposition of subject and predicate to be insufficient for capturing important logical distinctions that apply to the contents of sentences in a logically ideal language. In particular, it does not appear to suffice for an analysis of the differences between singular, particular, and general propositions. Singular propositions, according to Frege, are those in which an object is subsumed or falls under a concept; this is what he regarded as the fundamental relation in logic to which all others can be reduced (1979:118). Nevertheless, for the purposes of understanding the structure and logical impact of general and existential propositions, Frege distinguishes two other structural relations within conceptual contents: First, that of subordination or bringing something under something else, which pertains between two concepts of the same logical order; and second, that of a concept’s falling within a concept of higher order.
In a proposition like “All whales are mammals”, for instance, the expression “all whales” again appears as grammatical subject, but “all whales” does not seem to denote a particular object, hence it cannot be construed as a proper name. Instead, what we actually mean is this: “If anything is a whale then it is a mammal”. This indicates that what the sentence actually is about is a relation between two concepts, that of a whale and that of a mammal. What the sentence says about these concepts is that whatever falls under the first also falls under the second; it thereby subordinates the first under the second concept (1979:119; 1884, §47). However, the second concept is not a property of the first; being a mammal is not a property of the concept of being a whale but rather of the objects falling under that concept, just as being a whale itself is. Hence, the two concepts are of the same logical order – they both apply to objects.
This is different in statements that concern the existence of things of a certain kind. If one says “Mammals exist”, or “Some mammals are elephants” then one is not talking about about any particular mammal or elephant but rather about the concepts of a mammal or an elephant; and what one means is that these concepts are satisfied in at least one case. Frege, therefore, regards existence as a concept of the second order. A concept of the second order is one that applies to concepts of the first order; that is, a concept of the second order does not apply to objects but to concepts of the first order, and it is concepts of the first order, not concepts of the second order, that apply directly to objects. Thus, contrary to the use of ordinary language, statements like “Caesar exists” turn out to be senseless because they contain a category mistake (1892b/1997:189). By contrast, we could meaningfully say, “There is one man named ‘Caesar;’” but in this case one is again ascribing existence to a concept; that is, one is ascribing existence to the concept of being named “Caesar”. Moreover, if one rephrases her original singular existence statement as “There is one and only one man named Caesar”, she does not only say something false (for surely there have been plenty of people baptized “Caesar”) but is again just referring to the concept of being named “Caesar;” that is, one is again incorrectly stating that the name “Caesar” applies to exactly one object.
For these reasons, Frege decided to replace the traditional logical distinction between subject and predicate (which in his view is derived from the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate expressions) with the distinction between function and argument a distinction with which he was familiar through his expertise in mathematical analysis. In Conceptual Notation, this distinction is introduced in connection with the notion of judgment. For Frege, “in the expression of a judgment we can always regard the combination of symbols to the right of the turnstile as a function of one of the symbols occurring in it” (1879, §11). As one can see, the terms “function” and “argument” apply to to expressions rather than to what they stand for. In Conceptual Notation those terms in fact are still used for both; only later did Frege reserve them for those entities that a functional expression and an argument expression respectively stand for.
Functional expressions typically contain placeholders (or variables), which in singular sentences have to be replaced by an argument in order to determine a definite truth-value. For instance, the expression “2 + x = 5″ is functional in the sense that its truth-value depends on the value of the variable “x” that occurs in it. If “x” is replaced by “3″ then the expression becomes a true sentence or formula of arithmetic; if it is replaced by any other numeral the resulting sentence or formula will be false. Thus, for Frege a function is what such a functional expression stands for. A potential argument for that function is an entity denoted by an expression that serves to supplement the functional expression so as to yield a complete sentence. On the basis of this distinction between function and argument, Frege achieved a new, mathematically oriented understanding of concepts and relations: a concept simply is a function whose value always is a truth value for any suitable argument, and a relation is a function that has more than one such argument place. This idea of concepts or relations as functions covers even cases of higher-order properties: those are conceived of as functions that take on only other, lower-order functions as arguments so as to determine a truth-value. Finally, by contrast to subject-predicate analyses of expressions and their meanings, the distinction between function and argument can be applied also to those logical components that do not by themselves constitute complete sentences, that is, the distinction can be applied to operations like that expressed by “the father of ( )”.
The general motivation for Frege’s abandonment of logical distinctions that are, in his view, still too close to the grammar of natural language was his conviction that ordinary language grammar “is a mixture of the logical and the psychological” (1979:3) He thought that theses two areas of inquiry should be strictly distinguished both with regard to the questions they raise and to their respective ways of answering them. This anti-psychologism about logic itself extends also to the contents of natural language and thought. As we saw above, one of Frege’s reasons for calling his symbolic system “concept-script” was the fact that it was supposed to represent only that part of the content of natural language expressions that is of significance for logical inference. This implies, however, that according to Frege the content of ordinary language expressions comprises more than just their “conceptual content”. Frege is quite explicit about this point both in early and in later writings. Concerning the two sentences “At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians” and “At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks” he points out in Begriffsschrift that:
Even if one can perceive a slight difference in sense, the agreement still predominates. Now I call the part of the content which is the same in both the conceptual content” (1972, §3:112).
It seems clear that the words “sense” and “content” are being used to cover both logically relevant and other aspects of the meaning of a linguistic expression; for the former constitute only part of the content of an expression. The meaning of “sense” (Sinn) in Frege’s later writings comes closer to that of “conceptual content” in his earlier works. However, the general word “content” still appears to retain its very broad use in works that were written even after Frege’s famous distinction between sense and significance. In a letter to Husserl, for instance, Frege points out that the content of a sentence can include more than just that which can be true or false: for example, a sentence content can also contain “a mood, feelings, and ideas”, none of which can be judged as true or false and none of which, therefore, concerns logic (1906b:106). Note that at this point, interestingly, Frege’s criterion of the logical relevance of linguistic content is no longer articulated in terms of inference but rather in terms of the capacity to be true or false. Frege here lays the ground for that movement in 20th century philosophy of language that rests on the principle that linguistic meaning consists solely in truth conditions, and that therefore a theory of meaning can either be derived from or is identical to a theory of truth – a movement whose most prominent representative was Donald Davidson.
However, the isolated word “content” in Frege’s own writings still covers both logically relevant and logically irrelevant aspects of ordinary language meaning. Hence, to distinguish the two, and sort out the latter, is in Frege’s view one of the main tasks of the logician. What is also peculiar about Frege’s view of natural language content is that he appears to regard all of that part of it which is logically irrelevant as being purely subjective and thus a matter only of psychology, as his mentioning of “moods, feelings, and ideas” already shows. That is, he does not appear to recognize any but subjective and purely psychological meaning elements that are not, strictly speaking, logically relevant. He writes:
The task of logic being what it is, it follows that we must turn our backs on anything that is not necessary for setting up the laws of inference. In particular, we must reject all distinctions in logic that are made from a purely psychological standpoint and have no bearing on inference…. In the form in which thinking naturally develops the logical and the psychological are bound up together. The task in hand is precisely that of isolating what is logical” (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3).
According to Frege, such logically irrelevant distinctions include “all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener” such as all information conveyed to the latter by way of intonation or word-order in order to draw the listener’s attention to a particular part of speech (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3). They also include merely connotational differences between words denoting the same entities, as exemplified by groups of expressions like “walk”, “stroll”, and “saunter”. Though all of these expressions stand for the same concept, Frege thinks that they all act in different ways on the imagination of the listener, adding to the meaning of the sentences in which they are used an element that is irrelevant to logical inference. Whether one says, “This dog howled the whole night”, or one says, “This cur howled the whole night,” makes no difference with regard to the logical inferences one can draw from them in connection with sentences, nor with regard to their truth or falsity. One tends to associate with the word “cur” rather unpleasant ideas; however, for Frege, even if one disagrees that these associations match the dog in question, this would still not make the second sentence above false (1979:140).
According to how Frege characterizes these extra-logical, yet, rule-governed features of ordinary language meaning, these are not different from the merely arbitrary association of images with certain words in the minds of individual speakers. In other words, the difference between the meanings of the words “dog” and “cur” would be just as intangible and subjective as the difference between the internal image that a horseman, painter, or zoologist may have come to associate with the name “Bucephalus” and which Frege considers just as subjective “coloring and shading” of a piece of linguistic information (1997:154). And while Frege admits that “without some affinity in human ideas art would certainly be impossible,” he does not seem to see – or be interested in exploring – the conventional rules that govern the difference in meaning between the pejorative “cur” and the neutral “dog”(1997:155).
In other words, Frege does not even seem to acknowledge an entire field of philosophy of language that has been explored subsequently by John Austin, John Searle, Paul Grice and others and that is based on the assumption that we can philosophically – not just psychologically – explore the meaning of utterances as opposed to, or even underlying, the meaning of sentences. Frege reduces this entire area of inquiry to “all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener”, and he thereby overlooks that the phenomena described above do not result just from the interaction between two people. Rather, they are either based on conventional rules and maxims – adherence to which is generally rational or even essential for the possibility of linguistic communication – or at least presuppose knowledge of some such maxims or conventions in order to be properly understood. Therefore, solutions of problems connected to speaker meaning and speech acts are not at all just a matter of psychology; rather, they are at least as philosophically important in any comprehensive account of linguistic communication as problems of the relation between expressions and things in the world, or between expression and what they express.
The development of Frege’s view of the semantics of a logically perfect language can be divided up in two major phases, corresponding to two styles of semantic analysis that Frege consecutively adopted. Following Alberto Coffa, we can regard the first as a form of semantic monism and the second as a form of semantic dualism (1991:79f.). What both styles have in common is a broadly picture-theoretic idea of the relation between language and world, and a corresponding ideal of semantic analysis; to serve its purpose, language has to be partitioned into basic syntactical units, each of which is to be associated with an appropriate semantic correlate, which is conceived as an entity. For this reason, monism and dualism can also be regarded as varieties of an entity theory of meaning as defined more recently by Lycan (2000: 78, 83). This is so at least if we keep in mind that for Frege not all those entities that his semantic theory associates with linguistic expressions are supposed to be “individual things”, as Lycan’s characterization of an entity theory of meaning suggests. Rather, as we have seen, some semantic entities in Frege are intrinsically incomplete, like concepts and relations.
A disagreement between monism and dualism arises with regard to the number and character of the entities that are associated with the logical components of sentences. The monist believes that only one such entity needs to be postulated in order to explain how linguistic expressions mean anything and how sentences can be true or false. The dualist, by contrast, holds that linguistic expressions can have truth value potential only if we assign them not one but two different kinds of values, one of which then becomes our link to extra-linguistic reality (that is, to the entities denoted by expressions of our language).
Frege’s early account of semantics given in Conceptual Notation and Foundations appears to be monistic in the sense above. Frege’s early semantics is based on the notion of a conceptual content, that is, it is based on that part of meaning that is relevant for logical inferences. The class of conceptual contents in turn is divided up into judgable and non-judgable ones, whereby the former are logically composed of and can be decomposed into the latter. What Frege may have had in mind – although he does not put it exactly this way – with his distinction between judgable and non-judgable contents is the following consideration: a judgable content is such that we can reasonably either affirm or deny it: it is acceptable to say “Archimedes’s death is/is not true”, where one of the two alternatives must be correct. Thus, “Archimedes death” is a judgable content. However, this is different in a statement like “This house is/is not true ” – unless we take it to be elliptic for something like “The existence of this house is/is not true”. For a house by itself (unlike its existence) does not belong to the category of things for which the question of whether they are true or false is logically appropriate under the law of excluded middle (tertium non datur), since by itself it can be neither true nor false (alternatively, we can say that it is both not true and not false). For this reason, “this house” is a non-judgable content.
In Conceptual Notation and Foundations, Frege does not appear to acknowledge any ontological difference between a non-judgable content and the object or function that the expression having this content stands for. There are at least three main pieces of textual as well as theoretical evidence for this. The first has to do with Frege’s early account of identity as a relation between signs. Conceptual content in Frege’s early account is explained by recourse to the illustrative example of the the two propositions “At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians” and “At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks”. This appears to be the first example Frege gives for the relation of “identity of content”. The relation then is explicitly introduced in §8 of Conceptual Notation. There it is explained in the following way:
Identity of content differs from conditionality and negation by relating to names, not to contents. Although symbols are usually only representative of their contents…they at once appear in propria persona as soon as they are combined by the symbol for identity of content, for this signifies the circumstance that the two names have the same content” (1972:124).
As Frege points out, the symbol of content identity has the peculiarity that wherever it is used the resulting judgment no longer is about the contents of the names connected by the identity sign but rather about those names themselves. What such a judgment of identity expresses then is that those names have the same content, whatever this content is. Because Frege considers judgable contents to be fully expressible by nominal phrases of the form “The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse”, and as he considers the concept-script to be a symbolism in which every judgable content is so expressed, we can include names and nominal phrases that stand for judgable contents among the symbols that are suitable candidates for the relation of content identity.
Somewhat later in the same paragraph, Frege goes on to explain what exactly he means by the content of a name in the context of identity of content. He does so in order to show why the identity sign does not merely serve to state trivial tautologies or to introduce abbreviations for complex expressions. Taking an example from geometry he lets a straight line rotate about a fixed point ‘A’ on the circumference of a circle. This shows that ‘A’ can be determined in various ways; for instance, it can be determined either directly through perception, or indirectly, through a description. ‘A’ is also uniquely determined as the point corresponding to the rotating straight line’s being perpendicular to the diameter of the circle on ‘A’. Thus, for Frege the need of a special symbol for identity of content rests on the fact that the same content, in this case point ‘A’, can be determined in different ways and that this fact cannot always be known in advance; rather, it is itself the content of a judgment that requires proof.
Thus, what Frege regards as the conceptual content of a geometrical name, that is, of the description of a single object, appears to be the object itself: the same train of thought that he applied to geometrical points, their ways of determination, and their names, can also be applied to physical (or any other) objects. Frege contends that the conceptual content of the name “evening star” is the planet Venus, as is the conceptual content of the name “morning star”, though this content is determined in each case in a different way. In the case of names for judgable contents, the object seems to be a true or false circumstance, whereby its truth or falsity are themselves to be regarded as part of the conceptual content in this case. For after his distinction between sense and significance Frege would point out that he has now divided up what he regarded as judgable content in his earlier account into the thought on the one hand and its truth value on the other (1891c:63). Thus, a judgable content in Frege’s early semantics comprises both aspects while – at least in the case of names – a non-judgable content does not appear to contain more than the object denoted by the name. It does not, apparently, contain the way this object is determined – instead, this way of being determined is conceived of as part of the name itself: there is, in a certain sense, no clear logical distinction between the name as a purely syntactic string of characters and its symbolic character or force, in virtue of which it is able to pick out the object it denotes, in Frege’s early semantics.
More concrete evidence for the monistic character of Frege’s early semantics arises from the fact that it does not allow for the difference between meaningful sentences that lack a truth-value on the one hand, and sentences that are completely meaningless on the other. In other words, it does not account for the existence of sentences expressing mock thoughts, which are so plentiful both in fiction and everyday life. This would not be so, had Frege’s early semantics incorporated a second layer of meaning, which a sentence or expression can possess even if nothing exists to which it actually refers. Frege appears to be quite aware of the advantage that his later distinction between sense and significance in this respect provided. In Foundations he still took it for granted that an expression that fails to denote anything lacks any sense or meaning (1884, §§97: 100-102). After his distinction between sense and significance, however, he is quick to point out that he would now prefer to replace the word “Sinn” (“sense”) in those contexts by “Bedeutung” (“reference” or “significance”) (1980:63).
Finally, objects and concepts – the entities that expressions of a logically perfect notational system would stand for – are discussed in Foundations in the context of Frege’s distinction between objective and subjective ideas, a distinction that was supposed to help clarify Kant’s “true views”:
An idea [Vorstellung] in the subjective sense is what is governed by the psychological laws of association; it is of a sensible, pictorial character. An idea in the objective sense belongs to logic and is in principle non-sensible, although the word which refers to an objective idea is often accompanied by a subjective idea, which nevertheless is not its significance. Subjective ideas are often demonstrably different in different people, objective ideas are the same for all. Objective ideas can be divided into objects and concepts. I shall myself, to avoid confusion, use “idea” only in the subjective sense. It is because Kant associated both meanings with the word that his doctrine assumed such a very subjective, idealist complexion, and his true view was made so difficult to discover. The distinction here drawn stands or falls with that between psychology and logic. If only these themselves were to be kept always rigidly distinct!” (1884, §27, n.).
Frege claims to have clarified the Kantian view with his distinction between objective and subjective ideas. It is disputable just how serious we are to take this lip service to Kantianism, and it is also doubtful that Kant would have accepted Frege’s proposed amendment – for Kant and Frege do not appear to have shared the same notion of objectivity. Nevertheless, Frege’s terminological amendment here certainly serves to clarify his own earlier terminology; for in Conceptual Notation, he still uses the expression “combinations of ideas” to refer to judgable contents (1879, §2). In light of this, however, claiming that objective ideas can be divided up into objects and concepts, as Frege does in the above passage, supports the notion that those judgable contents — as combinations of objective ideas — were at the same time combinations of objects and concepts. Thus, this too supports the claim that early Fregean linguistic symbols have only one semantic dimension, namely, the objects, concepts, and true or false judgable contents that they designate.
One should note that Frege’s distinction between subjective and objective ideas (the latter includes physical objects and properties), as well as his later distinction between the inner and the outer realms of entities, suggests that “subjective”, inner states of the mind (like acts of thinking) cannot be conceived of in physical terms. This, of course, is in striking contrast to physicalist accounts of “the mental” and may strike many contemporary philosophers of mind as naive.
Around 1891, Frege revised his semantics. This revision solves a number of problems that the earlier, monistic account is not able to handle without further expansion. According to Frege’s mature account, each expression has a sense (“Sinn”), which contains a unique way in which the object (or function) that the expression stands for is given to us. The sense is a way an object is determined by an expression . (Roughly, “sense” in Frege’s 1891 account resembles a way an object is determined by an expression in his earlier account.) The object or function that the expression stands for is the expression’s significance (“Bedeutung”), also called “reference” or “referent” both in English translations of Frege’s work and in Anglo-Saxon Frege scholarship. It follows that for each particular sense there can be maximally one significance/reference, while numerous distinct senses may correspond to the same significance, representing the various ways the object (or concept) that an expression stands for can be uniquely given to us in thought. For Frege, not only proper names but also concept words and relational expressions possess sense and significance. Their significance then is a concept or relation, not an object, and their sense – though Frege does not say much about it – presumably consists in a logical thought component that contains the necessary and sufficient conditions for an object to fall under the concept (or stand in the relation to another object). Finally, the sense of a complete sentence is a thought, and its significance a truth-value.
Although the terms “Sinn” and “Bedeutung” appear already in Foundations of 1884, the distinction itself and the semantic account connected with it do not occur in Frege’s writings before 1891. Part of that distinction is a logical bifurcation of what Frege earlier calls the “judgable content” into a truth-value and a thought as the truth-value bearer. At the same time, the new account classifies ways an object is given as logical components of thoughts, while the relation between ways an object can be determined according to his earlier account to the judgable contents of which it is a logical component had never been clarified. Thus, the new account appears more consistent and complete with regard to the question of how semantic wholes are composed of their parts. On both levels, that of sense and that of significance, wholes are conceived of as functionally composite units that depend on the nature of their parts. On each level, moreover, the unit of a whole requires the supplement of a function by a suitable argument. A truth-value for Frege simply is the value of a concept or relation relative to certain arguments. Likewise, a thought is a composite of senses, at least one of which plays the part of a function and the other of its argument.
Furthermore, the new account opens up an approach to the semantics of fictional language, that is, it opens up an approach to sentences “about” fictional characters or locations. Such sentences typically contain thoughts that have no truth-value because one or the other of their logical components – senses of fictional terms – lacks a corresponding significance in terms of a real object (or concept). Frege’s idea here is based on the dependence of truth-values on arguments and functions – the non-existence of an object corresponding to a specific sense amounts to the lack of an argument for the functional part of the sentence, and therefore leads to the lack of a value for that function in this case.
Also, the distinction between sense and significance allows for an expansion of Frege’s semantics to belief ascriptions, that is, to sentences of the form “John believed that the earth is flat.” The idea is that this sentence may be true independently of whether the embedded part of it (“the earth is flat”) is true. But this means that — since the truth-value of the entire sentence functionally depends on the significance of each part — what the embedded part stands for cannot be a truth-value. Rather, Frege concludes that in the case of indirect speech and belief ascriptions, embedded sentences take on their original sense – the thought they normally express – as an indirect significance. Thus, while the thought they normally express is their sense in direct speech, it becomes their significance in indirect speech.
Finally, the distinction between sense and significance gives a more consistent account of the informative nature of certain kinds of identity statements (like “The evening star is the morning star”) than Frege’s earlier distinction between what is designated by a name and the way it is determined by means of the name. By introducing this new distinction, Frege no longer needs to regard the concept (or relation) of identity as having the peculiar feature of taking on names rather than objects themselves as its arguments. Thus, within his mature semantics, identity once again becomes an ontological relation in which each object stands to itself (though this has been recently disputed in Caplan & Thau 2001). Identity statements no longer are conceived as being about the fact that two different names have the same conceptual content but rather about the fact that the object given to us in one particular way is the same as the object given in another. The idea is similar to Frege’s early solution to the puzzle of informative identity statements: some identity statements are informative insofar as they state that an object determined or given to us in one way is the same as an object determined or given to us in some other way. However, how this idea is theoretically applied and connected to a general account of semantic content appears more consistent in Frege’s later semantics than in his earlier one.
There have been a number of suggestions as to how to translate “Bedeutung” as opposed to “Sinn” in later Frege into English. Besides “meaning”, which in 1970 was officially chosen as the standard translation in all Blackwell editions of Frege’s works because of its exegetical neutrality (see Beaney 1997: 36, n. 84), the two main other alternatives that have been proposed are “reference” and “significance”, by Dummett and Tugendhat, respectively. Dummett also suggests that we distinguish between “reference” for the relation between an expression and the object it refers to and “referent” for this object itself (1981a:93f.). The term “meaning”, by contrast, is problematic as a translation for “Bedeutung” because meaning often is taken to be either something like sense – that is, the thought connected to a sentence in our minds – or something like the rules of use for an expression in any given context: but none of this is what Frege had in mind when he spoke of “Bedeutung”.
Tugendhat’s proposal to translate “Bedeutung” in Frege as “significance” is based on the insight that, while “reference” or “referent” may be regarded as an adequate rendering of “Bedeutung” in the case of proper names, it is quite misleading in that of predicate expressions (Tugendhat 1970:177; cp.. Dummett 1981a:182f.). Indeed, Frege himself points out that in the case of concepts we could not properly speak about the “Bedeutung” – in the sense of “referent” – of the expression, since then we would imply that we were talking about an object, which cannot be the case in light of Frege’s distinction between objects and concepts (1997: 177, 365). Thus, rendering “Bedeutung” always as “reference” or “referent” would in fact require us to introduce some general notion of “entity”, which comprises both concepts and objects in order to explain just what “Bedeutung” in general is. However, Frege obviously never saw any need for such a general, all-embracing ontological category like “entity”.
Dummett admits that besides the idea of the name-bearer relation, which he regarded as Frege’s prototype relation of reference, a secondary aspect of reference must be acknowledged as well, which consists in the semantic role of the respective expression, that is, in its contribution the truth-values of sentences in which it may occur (1981a:190f.). On this view, predicate expressions behave like proper names in having the function of contributing to the truth-values of sentences in which they occur by means of their respective references, though their semantic role is different from that of proper names. However, Tugendhat (1970) claims that “Bedeutung” in Frege should be understood to always mean primarily the semantic role of an expression, that is, its truth-value potential, and precisely for this reason “Bedeutung” should be translated as “significance” or “importance”. The main evidence in favor of this interpretation is that, for Frege, which reference an expression has, and whether it has any at all, is logically significant only for determining the truth-values of the sentences in which it may occur (as well as whether they have a truth-value at all). Thus, for Tugendhat, there appears to be no additional aspect of the reference of proper names that would justify regarding it as the “prototype” semantic relation, that is, as somewhat superior to the relation between predicates and the concepts or relations that they stand for.
Unlike “reference”, “significance” as a candidate translation for Fregean “Bedeutung” has the advantage that it is generally accepted as a regular connotative aspect of the various meanings of “Bedeutung” in standard German usage, and that it is explicitly used in this meaning by Frege himself (1997:80; cp.. Gabriel 1984:192). Moreover, it seems to be supported by an important principle that Frege endorses, namely, the so-called context principle.
According to the context principle, which is most explicitly stated in Foundations – though nowhere called “context principle” by Frege himself – the sense and/or significance of a word cannot be explained or inquired after in isolation but only in the context of a proposition/sentence (1984: x, §106). It has been a matter of scholarly dispute whether Frege understood this principle to be about sense, or about significance, or about both, since at the time of Foundations the distinction between the two had not been made yet. There has also been a long debate about what exactly the principle implies and how it is to be understood, especially since in one of its formulations, Frege goes so far as to state that a word possesses sense and/or significance only in the context of a sentence (ibid., §62). In fact, this latter formulation has received the most attention in the secondary literature, leading to a widespread conviction that Frege proposes a principle of semantic holism.
However, some scholars, including Dummett, claim that Frege drops the principle in his later writings while others argue that there are passages even in later writings where Frege seems to articulate semantic or non-semantic versions of it in the light of the distinction between sense and significance. For instance, in “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter,” Frege points out that one comes at the parts of a thought only by analyzing the whole – which may be taken as a version of the context principle as a holistic principle at the level of sense (1997:362). It is also conceivable to regard the context principle, as some scholars have, as a semantic version of what has been called the “principle of priority of judgments over concepts” (see Bell 1979, Sluga 1980), which figures in Frege’s very early writings composed before Foundations. According to this latter principle, which Frege explicitly presents as a novel principle in the history of logic, the judgment and its content are to be regarded as logically primitive while concepts, as components of judgable contents in Frege’s early account, are derivative logical entities that can be isolated only by analysis of judgable contents (1979:17, 1983:19). In this respect, Frege is thought to deviate from traditional Aristotelian logic much further than logicians of his time or earlier, who tend to naively presuppose the concepts required to create judgable contents as independently given.
Be that as it may, Tugendhat’s claim is that the context principle was an early statement by Frege that points to his conception of “Bedeutung” as truth-value potential and thus to “significance” as the most basic and general meaning of that term (1970:182; cp.. Gabriel 1984:189ff.). It is clear from this that he believed Frege to have held the context principle as a principle about the dependency of significance on truth-value, that is, on what is characteristically denoted only by sentences. For why should a word have significance only in the context of a sentence if not for the reason that its significance simply consists in a truth-value potential, and that sentences are the only kind of expressions considered as true or false? From this it naturally follows that the question of whether an expression has significance can only arise in connection with the question of whether a sentence is true or false. And this idea indeed is used extensively in Frege’s later writings, especially in the context of his distinction between the realms of art and science (1997:157). “Bedeutung” in this sense is a purely normative term always directed towards an aim or value. And what Frege appears to focus on in “On Sense and Reference” is the question relative to what value or aim the relation of proper names to the objects they stand for – that is, their reference in Dummett’s terminology – is significant: namely, relative to the scientific value of truth alone, and this is a value that only sentences can have.
However, one should note that the context principle has been perceived to clash with another principle commonly assigned to Frege, namely, that of the principle of functionality or compositionality. According to this principle, as it has been interpreted by some scholars, the senses of sentences are ultimately made up of atomic building blocks. According to this interpretation, then, Frege was an atomist and not a holist about meaning components; and this view — though irreconcilable with the context principle, at least as it has been commonly understood — would support Dummett’s interpretation of the reference relation between names and objects as the paradigm relation of logical semantics. (For a detailed critical overview and discussion of the debate about the context principle and the principle of compositionality in Frege see Pelletier 2000).
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 4, 2005 | Originally published: