Sigmund Freud, the father of psychoanalysis, was a physiologist, medical doctor, psychologist and influential thinker of the early twentieth century. Working initially in close collaboration with Joseph Breuer, Freud elaborated the theory that the mind is a complex energy-system, the structural investigation of which is the proper province of psychology. He articulated and refined the concepts of the unconscious, infantile sexuality and repression, and he proposed a tripartite account of the mind’s structure—all as part of a radically new conceptual and therapeutic frame of reference for the understanding of human psychological development and the treatment of abnormal mental conditions. Notwithstanding the multiple manifestations of psychoanalysis as it exists today, it can in almost all fundamental respects be traced directly back to Freud’s original work.
Freud’s innovative treatment of human actions, dreams, and indeed of cultural artifacts as invariably possessing implicit symbolic significance has proven to be extraordinarily fruitful, and has had massive implications for a wide variety of fields including psychology, anthropology, semiotics, and artistic creativity and appreciation. However, Freud’s most important and frequently re-iterated claim, that with psychoanalysis he had invented a successful science of the mind, remains the subject of much critical debate and controversy.
Freud was born in Frieberg, Moravia in 1856, but when he was four years old his family moved to Vienna where he was to live and work until the last years of his life. In 1938 the Nazis annexed Austria, and Freud, who was Jewish, was allowed to leave for England. For these reasons, it was above all with the city of Vienna that Freud’s name was destined to be deeply associated for posterity, founding as he did what was to become known as the ‘first Viennese school’ of psychoanalysis from which flowed psychoanalysis as a movement and all subsequent developments in this field. The scope of Freud’s interests, and of his professional training, was very broad. He always considered himself first and foremost a scientist, endeavoring to extend the compass of human knowledge, and to this end (rather than to the practice of medicine) he enrolled at the medical school at the University of Vienna in 1873. He concentrated initially on biology, doing research in physiology for six years under the great German scientist Ernst Brücke, who was director of the Physiology Laboratory at the University, and thereafter specializing in neurology. He received his medical degree in 1881, and having become engaged to be married in 1882, he rather reluctantly took up more secure and financially rewarding work as a doctor at Vienna General Hospital. Shortly after his marriage in 1886, which was extremely happy and gave Freud six children—the youngest of whom, Anna, was to herself become a distinguished psychoanalyst—Freud set up a private practice in the treatment of psychological disorders, which gave him much of the clinical material that he based his theories and pioneering techniques on.
In 1885-86, Freud spent the greater part of a year in Paris, where he was deeply impressed by the work of the French neurologist Jean Charcot who was at that time using hypnotism to treat hysteria and other abnormal mental conditions. When he returned to Vienna, Freud experimented with hypnosis but found that its beneficial effects did not last. At this point he decided to adopt instead a method suggested by the work of an older Viennese colleague and friend, Josef Breuer, who had discovered that when he encouraged a hysterical patient to talk uninhibitedly about the earliest occurrences of the symptoms, they sometimes gradually abated. Working with Breuer, Freud formulated and developed the idea that many neuroses (phobias, hysterical paralysis and pains, some forms of paranoia, and so forth) had their origins in deeply traumatic experiences which had occurred in the patient’s past but which were now forgotten–hidden from consciousness. The treatment was to enable the patient to recall the experience to consciousness, to confront it in a deep way both intellectually and emotionally, and in thus discharging it, to remove the underlying psychological causes of the neurotic symptoms. This technique, and the theory from which it is derived, was given its classical expression in Studies in Hysteria, jointly published by Freud and Breuer in 1895.
Shortly thereafter, however, Breuer found that he could not agree with what he regarded as the excessive emphasis which Freud placed upon the sexual origins and content of neuroses, and the two parted company, with Freud continuing to work alone to develop and refine the theory and practice of psychoanalysis. In 1900, after a protracted period of self-analysis, he published The Interpretation of Dreams, which is generally regarded as his greatest work. This was followed in 1901 by The Psychopathology of Everyday Life; and in 1905 by Three Essays on the Theory of Sexuality. Freud’s psychoanalytic theory was initially not well received–when its existence was acknowledged at all it was usually by people who were, as Breuer had foreseen, scandalized by the emphasis placed on sexuality by Freud. It was not until 1908, when the first International Psychoanalytical Congress was held at Salzburg that Freud’s importance began to be generally recognized. This was greatly facilitated in 1909, when he was invited to give a course of lectures in the United States, which were to form the basis of his 1916 book Five Lectures on Psycho-Analysis. From this point on Freud’s reputation and fame grew enormously, and he continued to write prolifically until his death, producing in all more than twenty volumes of theoretical works and clinical studies. He was also not averse to critically revising his views, or to making fundamental alterations to his most basic principles when he considered that the scientific evidence demanded it–this was most clearly evidenced by his advancement of a completely new tripartite (id, ego, and super-ego) model of the mind in his 1923 work The Ego and the Id. He was initially greatly heartened by attracting followers of the intellectual caliber of Adler and Jung, and was correspondingly disappointed when they both went on to found rival schools of psychoanalysis–thus giving rise to the first two of many schisms in the movement–but he knew that such disagreement over basic principles had been part of the early development of every new science. After a life of remarkable vigor and creative productivity, he died of cancer while exiled in England in 1939.
Although a highly original thinker, Freud was also deeply influenced by a number of diverse factors which overlapped and interconnected with each other to shape the development of his thought. As indicated above, both Charcot and Breuer had a direct and immediate impact upon him, but some of the other factors, though no less important than these, were of a rather different nature. First of all, Freud himself was very much a Freudian–his father had two sons by a previous marriage, Emmanuel and Philip, and the young Freud often played with Philip’s son John, who was his own age. Freud’s self-analysis, which forms the core of his masterpiece The Interpretation of Dreams, originated in the emotional crisis which he suffered on the death of his father and the series of dreams to which this gave rise. This analysis revealed to him that the love and admiration which he had felt for his father were mixed with very contrasting feelings of shame and hate (such a mixed attitude he termed ‘ambivalence’). Particularly revealing was his discovery that he had often fantasized as a youth that his half-brother Philip (who was of an age with his mother) was really his father, and certain other signs convinced him of the deep underlying meaning of this fantasy–that he had wished his real father dead because he was his rival for his mother’s affections. This was to become the personal (though by no means exclusive) basis for his theory of the Oedipus complex.
Secondly, and at a more general level, account must be taken of the contemporary scientific climate in which Freud lived and worked. In most respects, the towering scientific figure of nineteenth century science was Charles Darwin, who had published his revolutionary Origin of Species when Freud was four years old. The evolutionary doctrine radically altered the prevailing conception of man–whereas before, man had been seen as a being different in nature from the members of the animal kingdom by virtue of his possession of an immortal soul, he was now seen as being part of the natural order, different from non-human animals only in degree of structural complexity. This made it possible and plausible, for the first time, to treat man as an object of scientific investigation, and to conceive of the vast and varied range of human behavior, and the motivational causes from which it springs, as being amenable in principle to scientific explanation. Much of the creative work done in a whole variety of diverse scientific fields over the next century was to be inspired by, and derive sustenance from, this new world-view, which Freud with his enormous esteem for science, accepted implicitly.
An even more important influence on Freud however, came from the field of physics. The second fifty years of the nineteenth century saw monumental advances in contemporary physics, which were largely initiated by the formulation of the principle of the conservation of energy by Helmholz. This principle states, in effect, that the total amount of energy in any given physical system is always constant, that energy quanta can be changed but not annihilated, and that consequently when energy is moved from one part of the system, it must reappear in another part. The progressive application of this principle led to monumental discoveries in the fields of thermodynamics, electromagnetism and nuclear physics which, with their associated technologies, have so comprehensively transformed the contemporary world. As we have seen, when he first came to the University of Vienna, Freud worked under the direction of Ernst Brücke who in 1874 published a book setting out the view that all living organisms, including humans, are essentially energy-systems to which, no less than to inanimate objects, the principle of the conservation of energy applies. Freud, who had great admiration and respect for Brücke, quickly adopted this new “dynamic physiology” with enthusiasm. From there it was but a short conceptual step—but one which Freud was the first to take, and on which his claim to fame is largely grounded—to the view that there is such a thing as “psychic energy,” that the human personality is also an energy-system, and that it is the function of psychology to investigate the modifications, transmissions and conversions of psychic energy within the personality which shape and determine it. This latter conception is the very cornerstone of Freud’s psychoanalytic theory.
Freud’s theory of the unconscious, then, is highly deterministic—a fact which, given the nature of nineteenth century science, should not be surprising. Freud was arguably the first thinker to apply deterministic principles systematically to the sphere of the mental, and to hold that the broad spectrum of human behavior is explicable only in terms of the (usually hidden) mental processes or states which determine it. Thus, instead of treating the behavior of the neurotic as being causally inexplicable—which had been the prevailing approach for centuries—Freud insisted, on the contrary, on treating it as behavior for which it is meaningful to seek an explanation by searching for causes in terms of the mental states of the individual concerned. Hence the significance which he attributed to slips of the tongue or pen, obsessive behavior and dreams—all these, he held, are determined by hidden causes in the person’s mind, and so they reveal in covert form what would otherwise not be known at all. This suggests the view that freedom of the will is, if not completely an illusion, certainly more tightly circumscribed than is commonly believed, for it follows from this that whenever we make a choice we are governed by hidden mental processes of which we are unaware and over which we have no control.
The postulate that there are such things as unconscious mental states at all is a direct function of Freud’s determinism, his reasoning here being simply that the principle of causality requires that such mental states should exist, for it is evident that there is frequently nothing in the conscious mind which can be said to cause neurotic or other behavior. An ‘unconscious’ mental process or event, for Freud, is not one which merely happens to be out of consciousness at a given time, but is rather one which cannot, except through protracted psychoanalysis, be brought to the forefront of consciousness. The postulation of such unconscious mental states entails, of course, that the mind is not, and cannot be, either identified with consciousness, or an object of consciousness. To employ a much-used analogy, it is rather structurally akin to an iceberg, the bulk of it lying below the surface, exerting a dynamic and determining influence upon the part which is amenable to direct inspection—the conscious mind.
Deeply associated with this view of the mind is Freud’s account of instincts or drives. Instincts, for Freud, are the principal motivating forces in the mental realm, and as such they ‘energise’ the mind in all of its functions. There are, he held, an indefinitely large number of such instincts, but these can be reduced to a small number of basic ones, which he grouped into two broad generic categories, Eros (the life instinct), which covers all the self-preserving and erotic instincts, and Thanatos (the death instinct), which covers all the instincts towards aggression, self-destruction, and cruelty. Thus it is a mistake to interpret Freud as asserting that all human actions spring from motivations which are sexual in their origin, since those which derive from Thanatos are not sexually motivated–indeed, Thanatos is the irrational urge to destroy the source of all sexual energy in the annihilation of the self. Having said that, it is undeniably true that Freud gave sexual drives an importance and centrality in human life, human actions, and human behavior which was new (and to many, shocking), arguing as he does that sexual drives exist and can be discerned in children from birth (the theory of infantile sexuality), and that sexual energy (libido) is the single most important motivating force in adult life. However, a crucial qualification has to be added here—Freud effectively redefined the term “sexuality” to make it cover any form of pleasure which is or can be derived from the body. Thus his theory of the instincts or drives is essentially that the human being is energized or driven from birth by the desire to acquire and enhance bodily pleasure.
Freud’s theory of infantile sexuality must be seen as an integral part of a broader developmental theory of human personality. This had its origins in, and was a generalization of, Breuer’s earlier discovery that traumatic childhood events could have devastating negative effects upon the adult individual, and took the form of the general thesis that early childhood sexual experiences were the crucial factors in the determination of the adult personality. From his account of the instincts or drives it followed that from the moment of birth the infant is driven in his actions by the desire for bodily/sexual pleasure, where this is seen by Freud in almost mechanical terms as the desire to release mental energy. Initially, infants gain such release, and derive such pleasure, from the act of sucking. Freud accordingly terms this the “oral” stage of development. This is followed by a stage in which the locus of pleasure or energy release is the anus, particularly in the act of defecation, and this is accordingly termed the ‘anal’ stage. Then the young child develops an interest in its sexual organs as a site of pleasure (the “phallic” stage), and develops a deep sexual attraction for the parent of the opposite sex, and a hatred of the parent of the same sex (the “Oedipus complex”). This, however, gives rise to (socially derived) feelings of guilt in the child, who recognizes that it can never supplant the stronger parent. A male child also perceives himself to be at risk. He fears that if he persists in pursuing the sexual attraction for his mother, he may be harmed by the father; specifically, he comes to fear that he may be castrated. This is termed “castration anxiety.” Both the attraction for the mother and the hatred are usually repressed, and the child usually resolves the conflict of the Oedipus complex by coming to identify with the parent of the same sex. This happens at the age of five, whereupon the child enters a “latency” period, in which sexual motivations become much less pronounced. This lasts until puberty when mature genital development begins, and the pleasure drive refocuses around the genital area.
This, Freud believed, is the sequence or progression implicit in normal human development, and it is to be observed that at the infant level the instinctual attempts to satisfy the pleasure drive are frequently checked by parental control and social coercion. The developmental process, then, is for the child essentially a movement through a series of conflicts, the successful resolution of which is crucial to adult mental health. Many mental illnesses, particularly hysteria, Freud held, can be traced back to unresolved conflicts experienced at this stage, or to events which otherwise disrupt the normal pattern of infantile development. For example, homosexuality is seen by some Freudians as resulting from a failure to resolve the conflicts of the Oedipus complex, particularly a failure to identify with the parent of the same sex; the obsessive concern with washing and personal hygiene which characterizes the behavior of some neurotics is seen as resulting from unresolved conflicts/repressions occurring at the anal stage.
Freud’s account of the unconscious, and the psychoanalytic therapy associated with it, is best illustrated by his famous tripartite model of the structure of the mind or personality (although, as we have seen, he did not formulate this until 1923). This model has many points of similarity with the account of the mind offered by Plato over 2,000 years earlier. The theory is termed ‘tripartite’ simply because, again like Plato, Freud distinguished three structural elements within the mind, which he called id, ego, and super-ego. The id is that part of the mind in which are situated the instinctual sexual drives which require satisfaction; the super-ego is that part which contains the “conscience,” namely, socially-acquired control mechanisms which have been internalized, and which are usually imparted in the first instance by the parents; while the ego is the conscious self that is created by the dynamic tensions and interactions between the id and the super-ego and has the task of reconciling their conflicting demands with the requirements of external reality. It is in this sense that the mind is to be understood as a dynamic energy-system. All objects of consciousness reside in the ego; the contents of the id belong permanently to the unconscious mind; while the super-ego is an unconscious screening-mechanism which seeks to limit the blind pleasure-seeking drives of the id by the imposition of restrictive rules. There is some debate as to how literally Freud intended this model to be taken (he appears to have taken it extremely literally himself), but it is important to note that what is being offered here is indeed a theoretical model rather than a description of an observable object, which functions as a frame of reference to explain the link between early childhood experience and the mature adult (normal or dysfunctional) personality.
Freud also followed Plato in his account of the nature of mental health or psychological well-being, which he saw as the establishment of a harmonious relationship between the three elements which constitute the mind. If the external world offers no scope for the satisfaction of the id’s pleasure drives, or more commonly, if the satisfaction of some or all of these drives would indeed transgress the moral sanctions laid down by the super-ego, then an inner conflict occurs in the mind between its constituent parts or elements. Failure to resolve this can lead to later neurosis. A key concept introduced here by Freud is that the mind possesses a number of ‘defense mechanisms’ to attempt to prevent conflicts from becoming too acute, such as repression (pushing conflicts back into the unconscious), sublimation (channeling the sexual drives into the achievement socially acceptable goals, in art, science, poetry, and so forth), fixation (the failure to progress beyond one of the developmental stages), and regression (a return to the behavior characteristic of one of the stages).
Of these, repression is the most important, and Freud’s account of this is as follows: when a person experiences an instinctual impulse to behave in a manner which the super-ego deems to be reprehensible (for example, a strong erotic impulse on the part of the child towards the parent of the opposite sex), then it is possible for the mind to push this impulse away, to repress it into the unconscious. Repression is thus one of the central defense mechanisms by which the ego seeks to avoid internal conflict and pain, and to reconcile reality with the demands of both id and super-ego. As such it is completely normal and an integral part of the developmental process through which every child must pass on the way to adulthood. However, the repressed instinctual drive, as an energy-form, is not and cannot be destroyed when it is repressed–it continues to exist intact in the unconscious, from where it exerts a determining force upon the conscious mind, and can give rise to the dysfunctional behavior characteristic of neuroses. This is one reason why dreams and slips of the tongue possess such a strong symbolic significance for Freud, and why their analysis became such a key part of his treatment–they represent instances in which the vigilance of the super-ego is relaxed, and when the repressed drives are accordingly able to present themselves to the conscious mind in a transmuted form. The difference between ‘normal’ repression and the kind of repression which results in neurotic illness is one of degree, not of kind–the compulsive behavior of the neurotic is itself a manifestation of an instinctual drive repressed in childhood. Such behavioral symptoms are highly irrational (and may even be perceived as such by the neurotic), but are completely beyond the control of the subject because they are driven by the now unconscious repressed impulse. Freud positioned the key repressions for both, the normal individual and the neurotic, in the first five years of childhood, and of course, held them to be essentially sexual in nature;–since, as we have seen, repressions which disrupt the process of infantile sexual development in particular, according to him, lead to a strong tendency to later neurosis in adult life. The task of psychoanalysis as a therapy is to find the repressions which cause the neurotic symptoms by delving into the unconscious mind of the subject, and by bringing them to the forefront of consciousness, to allow the ego to confront them directly and thus to discharge them.
Freud’s account of the sexual genesis and nature of neuroses led him naturally to develop a clinical treatment for treating such disorders. This has become so influential today that when people speak of psychoanalysis they frequently refer exclusively to the clinical treatment; however, the term properly designates both the clinical treatment and the theory which underlies it. The aim of the method may be stated simply in general terms–to re-establish a harmonious relationship between the three elements which constitute the mind by excavating and resolving unconscious repressed conflicts. The actual method of treatment pioneered by Freud grew out of Breuer’s earlier discovery, mentioned above, that when a hysterical patient was encouraged to talk freely about the earliest occurrences of her symptoms and fantasies, the symptoms began to abate, and were eliminated entirely when she was induced to remember the initial trauma which occasioned them. Turning away from his early attempts to explore the unconscious through hypnosis, Freud further developed this “talking cure,” acting on the assumption that the repressed conflicts were buried in the deepest recesses of the unconscious mind. Accordingly, he got his patients to relax in a position in which they were deprived of strong sensory stimulation, and even keen awareness of the presence of the analyst (hence the famous use of the couch, with the analyst virtually silent and out of sight), and then encouraged them to speak freely and uninhibitedly, preferably without forethought, in the belief that he could thereby discern the unconscious forces lying behind what was said. This is the method of free-association, the rationale for which is similar to that involved in the analysis of dreams—in both cases the super-ego is to some degree disarmed, its efficiency as a screening mechanism is moderated, and material is allowed to filter through to the conscious ego which would otherwise be completely repressed. The process is necessarily a difficult and protracted one, and it is therefore one of the primary tasks of the analyst to help the patient recognize, and overcome, his own natural resistances, which may exhibit themselves as hostility towards the analyst. However, Freud always took the occurrence of resistance as a sign that he was on the right track in his assessment of the underlying unconscious causes of the patient’s condition. The patient’s dreams are of particular interest, for reasons which we have already partly seen. Taking it that the super-ego functioned less effectively in sleep, as in free association, Freud made a distinction between the manifest content of a dream (what the dream appeared to be about on the surface) and its latent content (the unconscious, repressed desires or wishes which are its real object). The correct interpretation of the patient’s dreams, slips of tongue, free-associations, and responses to carefully selected questions leads the analyst to a point where he can locate the unconscious repressions producing the neurotic symptoms, invariably in terms of the patient’s passage through the sexual developmental process, the manner in which the conflicts implicit in this process were handled, and the libidinal content of the patient’s family relationships. To effect a cure, the analyst must facilitate the patient himself to become conscious of unresolved conflicts buried in the deep recesses of the unconscious mind, and to confront and engage with them directly.
In this sense, then, the object of psychoanalytic treatment may be said to be a form of self-understanding–once this is acquired it is largely up to the patient, in consultation with the analyst, to determine how he shall handle this newly-acquired understanding of the unconscious forces which motivate him. One possibility, mentioned above, is the channeling of sexual energy into the achievement of social, artistic or scientific goals–this is sublimation, which Freud saw as the motivating force behind most great cultural achievements. Another possibility would be the conscious, rational control of formerly repressed drives–this is suppression. Yet another would be the decision that it is the super-ego and the social constraints which inform it that are at fault, in which case the patient may decide in the end to satisfy the instinctual drives. But in all cases the cure is effected essentially by a kind of catharsis or purgation–a release of the pent-up psychic energy, the constriction of which was the basic cause of the neurotic illness.
It should be evident from the foregoing why psychoanalysis in general, and Freud in particular, have exerted such a strong influence upon the popular imagination in the Western World, and why both the theory and practice of psychoanalysis should remain the object of a great deal of controversy. In fact, the controversy which exists in relation to Freud is more heated and multi-faceted than that relating to virtually any other post-1850 thinker (a possible exception being Darwin), with criticisms ranging from the contention that Freud’s theory was generated by logical confusions arising out of his alleged long-standing addiction to cocaine (see Thornton, E.M. Freud and Cocaine: The Freudian Fallacy) to the view that he made an important, but grim, empirical discovery, which he knowingly suppressed in favour of the theory of the unconscious, knowing that the latter would be more socially acceptable (see Masson, J. The Assault on Truth).
It should be emphasized here that Freud’s genius is not (generally) in doubt, but the precise nature of his achievement is still the source of much debate. The supporters and followers of Freud (and Jung and Adler) are noted for the zeal and enthusiasm with which they espouse the doctrines of the master, to the point where many of the detractors of the movement see it as a kind of secular religion, requiring as it does an initiation process in which the aspiring psychoanalyst must himself first be analyzed. In this way, it is often alleged, the unquestioning acceptance of a set of ideological principles becomes a necessary precondition for acceptance into the movement–as with most religious groupings. In reply, the exponents and supporters of psychoanalysis frequently analyze the motivations of their critics in terms of the very theory which those critics reject. And so the debate goes on.
Here we will confine ourselves to: (a) the evaluation of Freud’s claim that his theory is a scientific one, (b) the question of the theory’s coherence, (c) the dispute concerning what, if anything, Freud really discovered, and (d) the question of the efficacy of psychoanalysis as a treatment for neurotic illnesses.
This is a crucially important issue since Freud saw himself first and foremost as a pioneering scientist, and repeatedly asserted that the significance of psychoanalysis is that it is a new science, incorporating a new scientific method of dealing with the mind and with mental illness. There can, moreover, be no doubt but that this has been the chief attraction of the theory for most of its advocates since then–on the face of it, it has the appearance of being not just a scientific theory but an enormously strong one, with the capacity to accommodate, and explain, every possible form of human behavior. However, it is precisely this latter which, for many commentators, undermines its claim to scientific status. On the question of what makes a theory a genuinely scientific one, Karl Popper’s criterion of demarcation, as it is called, has now gained very general acceptance: namely, that every genuine scientific theory must be testable, and therefore falsifiable, at least in principle. In other words, if a theory is incompatible with possible observations, it is scientific; conversely, a theory which is compatible with all possible observations is unscientific (see Popper, K. The Logic of Scientific Discovery). Thus the principle of the conservation of energy (physical, not psychic), which influenced Freud so greatly, is a scientific one because it is falsifiable–the discovery of a physical system in which the total amount of physical energy was not constant would conclusively show it to be false. It is argued that nothing of the kind is possible with respect to Freud’s theory–it is not falsifiable. If the question is asked: “What does this theory imply which, if false, would show the whole theory to be false?,” the answer is “Nothing” because the theory is compatible with every possible state of affairs. Hence it is concluded that the theory is not scientific, and while this does not, as some critics claim, rob it of all value, it certainly diminishes its intellectual status as projected by its strongest advocates, including Freud himself.
A related (but perhaps more serious) point is that the coherence of the theory is, at the very least, questionable. What is attractive about the theory, even to the layman, is that it seems to offer us long sought-after and much needed causal explanations for conditions which have been a source of a great deal of human misery. The thesis that neuroses are caused by unconscious conflicts buried deep in the unconscious mind in the form of repressed libidinal energy would appear to offer us, at last, an insight in the causal mechanism underlying these abnormal psychological conditions as they are expressed in human behavior, and further show us how they are related to the psychology of the ‘normal’ person. However, even this is questionable, and is a matter of much dispute. In general, when it is said that an event X causes another event Y to happen, both X and Y are, and must be, independently identifiable. It is true that this is not always a simple process, as in science causes are sometimes unobservable (sub-atomic particles, radio and electromagnetic waves, molecular structures, and so forth), but in these latter cases there are clear ‘correspondence rules’ connecting the unobservable causes with observable phenomena. The difficulty with Freud’s theory is that it offers us entities (for example repressed unconscious conflicts), which are said to be the unobservable causes of certain forms of behavior But there are no correspondence rules for these alleged causes–they cannot be identified except by reference to the behavior which they are said to cause (that is, the analyst does not demonstratively assert: “This is the unconscious cause, and that is its behavioral effect;” rather he asserts: “This is the behavior, therefore its unconscious cause must exist”), and this does raise serious doubts as to whether Freud’s theory offers us genuine causal explanations at all.
At a less theoretical, but no less critical level, it has been alleged that Freud did make a genuine discovery which he was initially prepared to reveal to the world. However, the response he encountered was so ferociously hostile that he masked his findings and offered his theory of the unconscious in its place (see Masson, J. The Assault on Truth). What he discovered, it has been suggested, was the extreme prevalence of child sexual abuse, particularly of young girls (the vast majority of hysterics are women), even in respectable nineteenth century Vienna. He did in fact offer an early “seduction theory” of neuroses, which met with fierce animosity, and which he quickly withdrew and replaced with the theory of the unconscious. As one contemporary Freudian commentator explains it, Freud’s change of mind on this issue came about as follows:
Questions concerning the traumas suffered by his patients seemed to reveal [to Freud] that Viennese girls were extraordinarily often seduced in very early childhood by older male relatives. Doubt about the actual occurrence of these seductions was soon replaced by certainty that it was descriptions about childhood fantasy that were being offered. (MacIntyre).
In this way, it is suggested, the theory of the Oedipus complex was generated.
This statement begs a number of questions, not least, what does the expression ‘extraordinarily often’ mean in this context? By what standard is this being judged? The answer can only be: By the standard of what we generally believe–or would like to believe–to be the case. But the contention of some of Freud’s critics here is that his patients were not recalling childhood fantasies, but traumatic events from their childhood which were all too real. Freud, according to them, had stumbled upon and knowingly suppressed the fact that the level of child sexual abuse in society is much higher than is generally believed or acknowledged. If this contention is true–and it must at least be contemplated seriously–then this is undoubtedly the most serious criticism that Freud and his followers have to face.
Further, this particular point has taken on an added and even more controversial significance in recent years, with the willingness of some contemporary Freudians to combine the theory of repression with an acceptance of the wide-spread social prevalence of child sexual abuse. The result has been that in the United States and Britain in particular, many thousands of people have emerged from analysis with ‘recovered memories’ of alleged childhood sexual abuse by their parents; memories which, it is suggested, were hitherto repressed. On this basis, parents have been accused and repudiated, and whole families have been divided or destroyed. Unsurprisingly, this in turn has given rise to a systematic backlash in which organizations of accused parents, seeing themselves as the true victims of what they term ‘False Memory Syndrome’, have denounced all such memory-claims as falsidical – the direct product of a belief in what they see as the myth of repression. (see Pendergast, M. Victims of Memory). In this way, the concept of repression, which Freud himself termed “the foundation stone upon which the structure of psychoanalysis rests,” has come in for more widespread critical scrutiny than ever before. Here, the fact that, unlike some of his contemporary followers, Freud did not himself ever countenance the extension of the concept of repression to cover actual child sexual abuse, and the fact that we are not necessarily forced to choose between the views that all “recovered memories” are either veridical or falsidical are, perhaps understandably, frequently lost sight of in the extreme heat generated by this debate.
It does not follow that, if Freud’s theory is unscientific, or even false, it cannot provide us with a basis for the beneficial treatment of neurotic illness because the relationship between a theory’s truth or falsity and its utility-value is far from being an isomorphic one. (The theory upon which the use of leeches to bleed patients in eighteenth century medicine was based was quite spurious, but patients did sometimes actually benefit from the treatment!). And of course even a true theory might be badly applied, leading to negative consequences. One of the problems here is that it is difficult to specify what counts as a cure for a neurotic illness as distinct, say, from a mere alleviation of the symptoms. In general, however, the efficiency of a given method of treatment is usually clinically measured by means of a control group–the proportion of patients suffering from a given disorder who are cured by treatment X is measured by comparison with those cured by other treatments, or by no treatment at all. Such clinical tests as have been conducted indicate that the proportion of patients who have benefited from psychoanalytic treatment does not diverge significantly from the proportion who recover spontaneously or as a result of other forms of intervention in the control groups used. So, the question of the therapeutic effectiveness of psychoanalysis remains an open and controversial one.
Stephen P. Thornton
University of Limerick
Last updated: December 29, 2010 | Originally published: