Galen was one of the most prominent ancient physicians as well as a philosopher (though most of his philosophical writings are lost). Nonetheless, his philosophical interests are quite evident in his practice of biological science. Galen made some key anatomical observations (though most of these were on other primates). However, this inclination toward observation moved his theory into the class of critical empiricism.
Galen was also a well-read scholar who combined extensive erudition with ‘cutting edge’ observational practice to completely change the understanding and teaching of medicine. He frequently integrates his observational practice with the natural philosophy of Plato and Aristotle. His position as the leading authority in medical theory extended for at least fourteen hundred years.
Galen correctly saw that there is a methodological difference between taking account of the patient in front of you in all of the patient’s particularity and, instead, understanding the patient in front of you as representing an instance of a general rule of biomedical science. The way that Galen sought to insert himself into this debate makes his conclusions relevant to medicine today.
Galen of Pergamum was a physician who was born in Pergamum was a bustling and vibrant city at the time and was particularly famous for its statue of Asclepius, a god of healing. Throughout Galen’s life, he avowed a devotion to Asclepius. The city also had a library that almost rivaled Alexandria’s in its size. Galen’s father, Nicon, was a prosperous architect. This allowed Galen the leisure to get an education and choose a path of life unencumbered by the need to earn money. However, this affluence did not mean that Galen was brought up “soft” (as per Plato’s discussion in the Republic 544b-570e in which he discusses the devolution of political systems due to the decay of personal arête). Galen’s education was broad and directed by his father. Galen studied in mathematics (a particular favorite of his father), grammar, logic, and philosophy–that included inquiry into the four major schools of the time: the Platonists, the Peripatetics, the Stoics, and the Epicureans. This pluralistic sensibility influenced the philosophical/scientific method of Galen. According to pluralism, one should look at all the prevalent theories and then make up one’s own mind choosing either one of the theories or perhaps a new mixture of those presented according to their strengths.
Galen began his study of medicine around the age of sixteen when his father had a dream suggesting this direction. Galen traveled to Smyrna and Corinth to study with both a Rationalist and with an Empiricist. When Galen’s father died, Galen traveled to Egypt (Alexandria) where he lived for perhaps five years (152-157). What Galen might have studied in Alexandria is highly speculative. However, Galen, himself, later declares that students should “look at the human skeleton with your own eyes. This is very easy in Alexandria, so that the physicians of that area instruct their pupils with the aid of autopsy” (Kühn II, 220, translation L. Edelstein). This quotation points to the practice of autopsy (dissection of cadavers) in Alexandria. Whether Galen also studied anatomy this way is unclear. It is clear that Galen (at least) engaged in comparative anatomy by dissecting monkeys.
In 157 Galen returned to his hometown to become a surgeon to the gladiators. When civil unrest broke out in 162, Galen left for Rome. The medical community in Rome was competitive and corrupt. In Rome, Galen’s ambition got the best of him with the result that his high profile created powerful enemies who caused him to depart secretly in 166. After a couple of years in obscurity, Galen was recalled by the Roman Emperors Marcus Aurelius and Lucius Verus to serve the army in their war against the Germans. When the plague hit Rome, Galen was made personal physician to Marcus Aurelius and Aurelius’ son, Commodus. For many years it has been held that Galen remained in Roman society until his death around 199-200 (based upon the Suda Lexicon written around 1000); however, new research by Vivian Nutton has persuasively set the date of Galen’s death much later. Nutton proposes that Galen may have lived into his eighties (possibly as old as 87). The source for this new information comes from Byzantine and Arab scholars from the sixth century onwards. On the basis of this, it seems that Galen died around 216, give or take several years, in the reign of Caracalla.
A great many of Galen’s works have survived. The Kühn edition of Galen (Greek with a Latin translation) runs over 20,000 pages. There are other Galenic works that only exist in Arabic translations. However, many of Galen’s works are lost, e.g., many of his treatises on philosophy (logic, physics, and ethics) perished in a fire that consumed the Temple of Peace in 191.
During the end of the fourth century BCE and throughout the third century BCE there were enormous advances in medicine revolving around the principal practitioners: Diocles, Praxagoras, Herophilus, and Erasistratus. During this period the debate about the relative roles of theory and observation were central to these writers (Kühn X, 107). It is, in fact, a perennial question in the philosophy of science. What is at issue is when does one impose a theoretical structure on the world? Part of the answer concerns the origins of the theoretical structure. From whence did it arise? In part, this is a struggle for a logic of induction that might assist the practitioner. Without such a theory of inductive logic, it is unclear whether nature is revealing her nature to the careful observer or whether the observer is imposing his own ideas upon nature. Aristotle discusses some of these issues in Posterior Analytics II.19 and in The Parts of Animals I. However, this is not the end of the question. Some of this tension can be seen in the biomedical writers in the Hippocratic era. However, it is also true that in the construction of scientific theories there must, of necessity, be a tension between those who embrace theoretical structures and those who are skeptical of them. The latter group generally bases their misgivings upon a possible tendency among theorists to create an a priori science. What makes a priori science troublesome is that it breaks contact with the empirical world. It suggests that ratiocination about natural causes is sufficient for the production of scientific theories. For most natural philosophers such a stance is entirely unacceptable. Setting the proper balance between theory and observation was (and continues to me) an important question in the philosophy of science.
One group that added to the debate on the role of observation were the Empiricists. The origins of the Empiricist School might be found in Acron of Akragas, a fifth century BCE follower of Empedocles. This conjecture is based merely upon the testimony of later writers. It could certainly be the case that there was no real medical empiricism, as such, before Serapion, a third century BCE doctor .
Another interesting speculation on the origins of the empiricist physicians comes from Michael Frede. Frede has suggested that from a reference in Plato’s Laws 720a-c; 857c-d that there was a two-tired medical system with physicians for the wealthy (who employed theoretical principles) and physicians for the slaves (who relied merely upon trial-and-error experience). If this speculation is correct, then the burden of proof for the empiricists is to show that the theoretical “book learning” of upper class doctors could be reduced to mere experience. In other words, experience, itself, could generate competence. The result would be an elevation of the second-level physician. If Frede is correct on this, then perhaps social situation is partially responsible for the rise of the medical empiricists.
Sextus Empiricus (circa 160-210) set out a loosely woven doctrine of “consideration” or skepsis. Sextus is a key source of our knowledge of Pyrrhonism and is also said to have been a physician (though his writings on medicine have not survived). It is not clear whether Sextus was an original thinker or merely a reflection of his era. However, at the very least, one can garner background information of what might have influenced the empiricists through the doctrine of skepsis. Under this doctrine the theoretical structures of the philosophers (Dogmatists) would be held in abeyance (neither accepted nor rejected). What would rule the day would be the case before the physician right now. The case and the physician’s experience would dictate the treatment.
Against the Empiricists, on the other hand, were the philosophers (Dogmatists). In one important way the Dogmatists are not a “school” as such. They are often depicted by their detractors, such as the Empiricists, rather than being self-identifying. This may relate to the social class dynamics noted earlier. Thus, one should keep in mind that the group is not so much a school of practitioners but a depiction of a group by objectors to those who profess a foundation in medical theory. Perhaps the best way to characterize the Dogmatists would be on the issue of aetiology. The Empiricists attacked the Dogmatists for asserting that there might be hidden causes of disease, and that these hidden causes might be grasped via ratiocination. This was because (under this characterization) the Dogmatists were advocating reasoning and conjecture over experience. To the Empiricists, this was akin to creating a priori science.
The Dogmatists (even in this quasi-class depiction) were identified with one of the four prominent philosophical schools (Platonists, Aristotelians/Peripatetics, Stoics, and Epicureans). Detractors said that the Dogmatists honored theory over observation and experience. Of course, from the point of view of the philosophical schools, rational theories create a critical structure that aid in the interpretation and explanation of nature. The sense of explanation here harkens back to Aristotle, who distinguished knowing the fact (hoti) and the reasoned fact (dioti, APo II, i). It may not be enough to know that if I (as a physician) do x, then y will result (anecdotal correlation of two events). That sort of hoti (or merely event + consequence unit) is insufficient. The reason for this is that when circumstances alter slightly, how is the practitioner to know whether this alteration is significant unless he also has an appreciation of the mechanism that underlies the process? For example, anecdotal correlation might (in a non-medical modern example) suggest that every time I wash my car, it will rain. My personal experience may be almost perfect, but that does not mean that such a causal connection actually exists. The reluctance to embrace a non-observable causal mechanism leaves this dilemma to those who profess an aversion to theory in favor of experience.
Somewhat in the middle of these two schools were the Methodists. Aside from Soranus there are no surviving texts of the Methodists. Therefore most of what we have comes from the descriptions of Galen and pseudo-Galen on these writers. The following are cited as being Methodists: Thessalos, Themison, Proklos, Reginos, Antipatros, Eudemos, Mnaseas, Philon, Dionysios, Menemachos, Olympikos, Apollonides, Soranus, Julianus (Kühn X, 52-53, XIV, 684). There is some controversy about the characterization and origins of this school but many relate it to Themison of Laodicea a pupil of Asclepiades of Bithynia. However this attribution is disputed by Celsus and Soranus who state that Themison is not the first but merely a representative of Methodism. At any rate, the Methodists paid attention (in contrast to the Dogmatists and Empiricists) to the disease alone as opposed to the situation of the individual patient, that is, his medical history and personal situation. The disease alone dictates treatment (Kühn III, 14-20). Thus, the physician does not have to have anatomical or physiological knowledge of the body. Instead, he observes the body in a holistic manner (koinotetes). The three principle conditions of a body viewed in this way are: (a) the body’s dryness, (b) the body’s fluidity, and (c) the mixture of the two. The “method” to be followed was to follow the phenomena. Underlying this assumption was the notion about the status of pores in the mechanism of the body’s common balance. The body’s pores allowed atoms to enter and exit the body. When the atoms came and went freely health was the result. When there was a disruption, then sickness was the result. When the pores were either too small (constriction) or too large (dilatation) then an imbalance occurred in the normal atomic flow. Atoms are invisible to the naked eye. Pores are visible, but their subtle alterations are often not visibly detectable. Thus, on the face of it, the Methodists seem to be contra-Empiricist. However, the atomist tradition (upon which this theory rests) was taken to be Empiricist. (In principle, one could view an entirely physical event-if it were possible to witness it.) Thus, the Methodists seem to have affinities to both. This is evident in Themison (first century, BCE) and Thessalus (first century, AD). Disease was depicted as a community of constriction or dilatation (or some combination of the two) that, in principle, was observable even though, in practice, it couldn’t be observed except through its effects, namely, the disease. Thus, though the intent of the Methodists was probably to lean toward the Empiricists, the actual practice put them more in-between.
Galen often characterizes himself as an eclectic belonging to no school. It is true that Galen was an innovator in observation, for example he gave the first depiction of the four-chambered human heart. But his epistemology was grounded in his philosophical training. Over and over Galen relies on an over-arching medical theory to drive his aetiology (Kühn X, 123, 159, 246). In this way his practice is closest to Aristotelian critical empiricism that requires careful observation and a comprehensive theory that will make those observations meaningful.
Because of Galen’s pluralistic method, it is appropriate that (for the most part) his own method draws upon his predecessors with additions and corrections. For example, Galen employed the four-element theory (earth, air, fire, and water) as well as the theories of the contraries (hot, cold, wet, and dry). Though Aristotle interrelated these two descriptive accounts in his work Generation and Corruption, it is Galen who attempts to create a more gradated form by making quasi-quantitative categories of the contraries to describe the material composition of the mixtures (On Mixtures). From the perspective of modern science, this is an advancement upon Aristotle. This work on mixtures is also used to account for the properties of drugs (On Simples). Drugs were supposed to counteract the disposition of the body. Thus, if a patient were suffering from cold and wet (upper respiratory infection), then the appropriate drug would be one that is hot and dry (such as certain molds and fungi-does this remind you of penicillin?). The use of broad-reaching natural principles enhanced the explanatory power of Galen’s theory of biological science.
Galen speaks at length about the philosophers Plato (from whom he accepts the tri-partite soul) and Aristotle (whose biological works are well known to him). In medicine, he is also greatly influenced by historical figures such as Hippocrates (who he describes as a single individual opposed to our modern understanding of a group of writers-even though Galen was aware of the Hippocratic Question), Herophilus, and especially Erasistratus. In his avowed work on biological theory, On the Natural Faculties, Galen goes to great lengths to refute the principles of Erasistratus and his followers.
Contemporary figures are also discussed such as Aclepiades, and the Methodists Themison and Thessalus. This thorough use of the context of medicine allows Galen to consider, for example, Eristrates’ theory of mechanical digestion via a vacuum principle and to supplant it with his own theory of attraction (holke). Galen’s theory of attraction may have had its roots in the theory of natural place that always lacked a material force to implement it. At any rate, when the mechanisms are inscrutable, it was important for Galen to offer an account that fits into other parts of his theory (such as the mixture of the contraries in the composition of the elements).
One of the most influential aspects of Galenic practice was his implementation of (or invention of-as per Wesley Smith) the Hippocratic theory of the four humours (phlegm, blood, black bile, and yellow bile). These points of focus relate to a theory of health as balance. Each of these four humours is related to the three principal points of the body: head (phlegm), heart (blood), black bile (liver) and yellow bile (the liver’s complement, the gall bladder). The three principal points of the body are also loosely linked to the Platonic tripartite soul: head (sophia, reason), heart (thumos, emotion or spiritedness), liver (epithumos, desire). Thus, the sort of just balance of the soul that Plato argues for in the Republic is also the ground of natural health. When one part of the soul/body is out of balance, then the individual becomes ill. The physician’s job is to assist the patient in maintaining balance. If a person is too full of uncontrollable emotion or spiritedness, for example, then he is suffering from too much blood. The obvious answer is to engage in bloodletting (guaranteed to calm a person down). As in the case of pharmacology and the contraries, the four humours provide a comprehensive account of what it means to obtain and maintain health via the balancing of various primary principles.
One of the striking features of ancient medicine is the extent that very limited observations had to be interpreted in order to explain natural function. For example, given that blood was considered to be nourishment, trophe, it seemed reasonable (following Aristotle) that the blood would be entirely consumed by the body’s tissue. Thus, the blood would be manufactured in the liver and heart and then would flow to the rest of the body and be consumed. The flow of blood went one-way. However, there was a problem: there were two sorts of blood vessels (veins and arteries). These were structurally distinct. This was known through dissection of primates. Then it is assumed that Nature does nothing in vain (discussed at length in On the Use of the Parts as a key biomedical explanatory principle). This means that the veins and arteries have different functions. But they cannot be too disparate. The answer to this dilemma for Galen is that the arteries carry blood mixed with aer or pneuma that acts as a vital force whereas the venous blood is ordinary-though Galen held (correctly) that the two systems were connected by tiny almost invisible vessels (capillaries).
Thus Galen began with a problem and a number of observations and sought to make sense of the seeming anomalies via his overarching biomedical principles. In this way, Galen was acting according to the mathematical training from his father and a desire to create a unified (quasi-axiomatic) explanatory system. Without observation, this could have led to a priori or “armchair” science. But when combined with careful observation, it leads to critical empiricism.
Another example of this mixture of observation and inference is in the area of conception theory. Galen says in his treatise, On Seed,
These things have been said by me because of some of the philosophers who call themselves Aristotelians and Peripatetics. I, at least, would not address these men so, they being so greatly ignorant of the opinion of Aristotle that they think it is pleasing to him that the sperm of the male being cast into the uterus of the female places the principle of motion in the katamenia (the female seed) and, after this is expelled, the principle of motion in the katamenia and, after it is expelled, does not any part become the corporeal substance of the fetus. They have been deceived by the first book of the Generation of Animals that alone of the five they seem to have read. These things are written there, “As we said, of the generation of the principles we may say that chiefly there are the male principle and the female principle. The male offers the motive principle and the efficient cause of generation while the female offers the material principle” [Galen quoting Aristotle, G.A. 716a 5].
These are not far after the beginning: in still later parts of the tract he writes as well, “But this may be well concluded that the male provides the form and the principle of motion and the female provides the body and the matter just as the example of curding milk. Here the body is the milk and the fig juice contains the principle that makes it curdle” [Galen quoting Aristotle, G.A. 729a 10; Kühn IV, 516-517, my tr.].
The biological accounts of human reproduction in the ancient world offer excellent examples of the interaction between observation and inference. There are a number of issues involved in this issue that pre-dates even the Hippocratic writers. The one that is mentioned here is the issue of whether there is one seed (the male’s only) or two (the male’s and the female’s). In the above example Galen seems to be saying that the first reading of Aristotle in which the male provides the efficient cause and the female provides the material cause, simpliciter, is a misreading of Aristotle. Instead, the event (conception) is depicted as a more involved process in which principles of both parents come into play. These principles revolve around the empirically observable facts that children as often as not resemble the mother as much as the father. The “one seed” theory in which the father’s seed, alone, fashions the child can only account for such an outcome by calling it a sort of mutation (agone, para physin). But regularity counts for something. It is odd when an event that may approach or exceed 50% is called a mutation. This turns the entire idea of mutation (a statistical anomaly) on its head.
Galen approaches the issue with a balanced approach beginning with anatomical observations. Galen did some of the most extensive work in the ancient world on the study of the female anatomy (albeit mostly upon apes, On Anatomical Procedures, I.2). Galen’s observation of a fluid in the horns of the uterus (Kühn IV, 594, 600-601) were the basis of his (mistaken) view that he had discovered female seed. However, in the midst of this mistake he was on the right track in viewing the ovaries as analogous to the male testes.
The point in this second example is that Galen wanted to combine his observations gained in dissections of apes to his pronouncements vis-à-vis the debate concerning “one seed conception” vs. “two seed conception.” This commitment to integrating observation and theory contributed to making Galen a towering figure in medicine and the philosophy of science.
1986 3rd Italian
1989 4th German
1995 5th English
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 9, 2005 | Originally published: