Gauḍapāda is one of the early and most reputed philosophers of the Vedānta school in the Indian system of thought, who is believed to have lived roughly during 500 C.E. In the spiritual lineage, Gauḍapāda is regarded as the grand preceptor of Śaṅkaracarya [8th c. C.E.], the systematizer of Advaita Vedānta. Gauḍapāda is best known for his analytical exposition on the tenets of Advaita Vedānta that provided a firm ontological grounding to Vedānta philosophy. Gauḍapāda’s expository interpretation of the Upaniṣadic literature in the light of logical reasoning is a critical apparatus of epistemological exposition in the Advaita tradition.
According to Gauḍapāda’s thesis, the ultimate ontological reality is the pure consciousness, which is bereft of attributes and intentionality. The world of duality is nothing but a vibration of the mind (manodṛśya or manaspandita). The pluralistic world is imagined by the mind (saṁkalpa) and this false projection is sponsored by the illusory factor called māyā. The origination of the individual soul, which experiences the world of duality, is figurative. The finitude of the individuality of the soul is caused due to nescience (avidyā), while in reality its nature is identical with the ultimate soul – pure consciousness. The knowledge of non-difference between the individual and the supreme soul alone leads to liberation.
Gauḍapāda’s influence has probably been most far-reaching in the development of Advaita Vedānta through the ages. He is well-known for his conception of ‘contact-less contemplation’ (asparśa yoga) a key soteriological notion of Advaita Vedānta. More famous is his doctrine of non-origination (ajāti-vāda), with which he establishes the eternality and non-duality of consciousness. The philosophy of Gauḍapāda may be characterized as absolute non-dualism and establishes this doctrine both by the method of affirmation and negation (adhyāropa and apavāda). He explains the doctrine of advaita-vāda using illustrations such as “quenching of fire-brand” (alātaśānti) and the phantasmagoric city (gandharva-nagara) to systematically expound the falsity of the world.
Within the Advaita tradition, Gauḍapāda is regarded as the disciple of the legendary sage śukha and is the teacher of Govinda bhagavadpāda, who is śaṅkarācārya’s direct preceptor. śaṅkara, in his works, exhibits extreme reverence to Gauḍapāda. Gauḍapāda is referred to by the terms sampradāyavit – knower of the tradition, paramaguru – grand preceptor, ‘vṛddha ācārya’ – ancient preceptor, and so on. All that is known about Gauḍapāda is mostly derived from his name. The term ‘Gauḍa’, according to some scholars, indicates his geographical origin, which is the region of Bengal. Alternatively, we find some references to Gauḍapāda by the term ‘Gauḍācārya’ – a compound word which means the ‘teacher of the Gauḍa’. Here again the term ‘Gauḍa’ clearly denotes a place and is not a proper name. Also, Sureśvarācārya (a direct disciple of śaṅkara), in his work Naiṣkarmya Siddhi IV.44, refers him as ‘Gauḍaḥ’. From a 13th century prolific glossator, ānandagiri, we gather that Gauḍapāda spent some time in Badrikāśrama absorbed in deep meditation. Another legend about Gauḍapāda, narrated by a 17th c. advaitin, informs us that there was a place near a river Hīraravati in Kurukshetra (the northern region of today’s Bengal), a place where some Gauḍa people lived. According to this note, the term ‘Gauḍa’ connotes a specific ethnic group belonging to a particular geographical origin. It was in this place the ācārya was absorbed in meditation and hence the name Gauḍapādācārya. Apart from these abstract conjectures on the life of Gauḍapāda, his dates are also not clearly established. From the references from the Buddhist writers who cite Gauḍapāda as the source of substantial evidence, some scholars attempt to give a rough idea on Gauḍapāda’s date. Vidhushekhara Bhattacarya and T. M. P. Mahadevan bring to our notice that three Buddhist writers, namely, Bhavaviveka, Santaraksita and Kamalasila have cited Gauḍapada’s kārikā-s in their works. Karl Potter suggests that Bhavaviveka is the younger contemporary of Dharmapala, who according to early Chinese travel accounts seems to have flourished during 5th c. C.E From this information we may fix Gauḍapada’s date not later than 5th c. C.E. A few other scholars fix Gauḍapāda’s date in accordance to śaṅkara’s date, which then would push his date further to 6th c. C.E. Some other scholars bring to our notice that Gauḍapāda himself cites some Buddhist views of Nāgārjuna and Asanga, with which we could fix the upper limit to 4th c. C.E.
All the scholars agree that Gauḍapāda’s most prominent work, is his metrical commentary on the Māṇdūkya Upaniṣad called the Māṇdūkya kārikā. It is otherwise called Gauḍapādīya or Gauḍapāda kārika. Thanga Swamy and Tandalam Narayana Swamy Iyer indicate that there is a commentary on the Nṛsimha Uttara Tāpini Upaniṣad authored by Gauḍapāda. A commentary (bhāṣya) on the Sāmkhya kārikā of īśvara Krsna is attributed to Gauḍapāda. There is yet another commentary – a vṛtti on the Uttara gīta is also attributed to Gauḍapāda. In the tantric tradition, works like the Durgāsaptasati, Subhagodaya stuti and śri Vidyāratna Sūtra’s authorship is ascribed to Gauḍapāda. These works are supposedly on the śri Vidyā tradition. Some scholars maintain that there are multiple Gauḍapāda-s who belong to different times and places while the Māṇdūkya kārikā is the only work of Gauḍapāda who is śaṅkara’s grand preceptor.
A kārikā is usually a crisp condensation of a subject matter or an explication of a specific doctrinal position. The Māṇdūkya kārikā is a metrical commentary on the Māṇdūkya Upaniṣad, which belongs to the Atharva Veda. The Gauḍapāda kārikā seems to be a collection of terse aphorisms consolidated under different topics of Advaita Vedānta. The kārikā is pedagogically instructive in its tone. Traditionally, the Māṇdūkya kārikā is regarded as an exhaustive manual for the fundamentals of Advaita Vedānta and hence called Upadeśa grantha. Gauḍapāda’s kārikā has 215 verses distributed in four chapters. The relation between the Māṇdūkya Upaniṣad and the kārikā-s remains abstract. The four chapters are namely, a. āgama prakaraṇa – the chapter regarding the scriptures consisting of 29 verses b. Vaitathya prakaraṇa – the chapter regarding illusion consisting of 38 verses c. advaita prakaraṇa – the chapter on non-duality constituting 48 verses and d. alātaśanti prakaraṇa – the chapter on the fire-brand comprising of 100 verses. There are some traditional views, which consider the 29 verses in the first chapter of the kārikā as the Upanisad itself. The main purport of these four chapters of the kārikā is to delineate the quintessence of Vedāntic content as commenced in the Upanisad. The first chapter is an exposition of the Upanisadic content mainly to describe the nature of the absolute ontological being. Expounding upon the states of psycho-physical experiences (waking, dream and profound sleep) as primary constituents of metempsychic existence, the kārikā discusses various positions on the theories of creation. Based on the Upanisadic cohort, the kārikā, in this chapter, attempts to initiate the Advaitic position that the template of creation is temporally apparent and ultimately unreal. The second chapter of the kārikā proposes to logically establish the theory of illusion. The rationality of the third chapter of the kārikā is to firmly establish the position of non-duality (advaita) by the method of methodical assertion and negation (adhyāropa and apavāda). Finally, the objective of the fourth chapter mainly seeks to explicate the notion of the ‘contactless yoga’ (asparśa) to assert the theory of non-origination (ajāti) of the eternal soul as expounded in the third chapter. The refutation of the creation theories remains to be the prime focus of all the four chapters.
There is an intense controversy in modern scholarship over the correct interpretation of the philosophy and the structure of Māṇdūkya kārikā. Vidhushekhara Bhattacarya advocates that the four chapters do not constitute a unitary text of the Māṇdūkya kārikā. According to Bhattacarya, the four chapters of the Māṇdūkya kārikā are four independent treatises and were later consolidated into one title called āgamaśāstra. He also observes that the first chapter of the Māṇdūkya kārikā does not systematically expound the prose content of the Māṇdūkya Upaniṣad and this led Bhattacarya to conclude that the first chapter of the kārikā predates the Upaniṣadic content. Owing to copious references to ‘Buddha’ in the fourth chapter (IV.19, 42,80, 88, 98, 99) and for the claim that the term ‘alātaśānti’ is a peculiar to Buddhists, Bhattacarya advocates that Māṇdūkya kārikā is more inclined to Buddhist philosophy than to Vedānta. However, Richard King in his detailed analysis on the date and authorship of the text rejects the Bhattacarya’s hypothesis, while he arrives at a conclusion that the final or the fourth chapter (the alātaśanti prakaraṇa) is a later text composed perhaps for a different audience by some other author who is heavily influenced by Gauḍapāda. According to King, the fourth chapter profusely adopts Buddhist terminologies especially from the Mādhyamaka and the Yogācāra philosophical traditions. Richard King also shows that the prominent Advaitins (beginning from 8th to 17th C.E) completely omit any reference to the fourth chapter in their respective works. King also contends that the first three chapters of the Māṇdūkya kārikā were linked by the śaṅkarite tradition by the 8th century of the Common Era and was eventually attributed to the author who bore the title ‘Gauḍa’.
The sacred syllable OM, also known as praṇava is regarded as the absolute being. Gauḍapāda suggests that the structure of the sacred syllable has linguistic connections to, and homologically implies, onto-theological connotations. The kārikā of the āgama prakaraṇa begins with the appraisal of the method of contemplation of the praṇava. Gauḍapāda regards OM as the sound from which the entire creation springs forth. OM is the root for all speech. Gauḍapāda suggests that the sonic praṇava is discerned with its four fold linguistic measures (mātra-s) representing the gradational states of consciousness. The four mātra-s are a, u, m & the OM. According to the phonetic rules of Sanksrit, the first two mātra-s, ‘a’ & ‘u’ combine to render a diphthong ‘o’ resulting in the sonic OM. Each of these phonetic elements is homologous to the states of experience of the individual soul. The sound ‘a’ of the praṇava represents the waking state (jāgrat), which Gauḍapāda calls the all pervasive, external, universal consciousness known by the term ‘āpti’. In this state, the individual soul bears the name viśva – who is the enjoyer of the gross objects (sthūla bhuk). Secondly, the phonetic element ‘u’ represents the dream state in which the individual soul becomes the enjoyer of the internal objects (antaḥprajña) and is called the sūkṣma bhuk. In this state the soul bears the name ‘taijasa’. Gauḍapāda refers to the nature state of the internal consciousness by the term ‘utkarṣa’ meaning ecstasy. The third state is of profound sleep (suṣupti) and is represented by the sound ‘m’. The individual soul in profound sleep is the enjoyer of bliss (ānanda bhuk). The profound sleep, as Gauḍapāda describes, is a state of intense consciousness in its causal state in which the gross and subtle state of objective experiences get dissolved (laya). Finally, the fourth state is known as the turīya and is absolutely transcendental to all the phenomenal states of apparent realities. The fourth state is measureless (amātra) and is devoid of all attributes whatsoever. This turīya, as Gauḍapāda conveys, is non-dual (advaita), the reality of Lord-hood (īśāna), the seer of everything (sarva dṛk). It is in this state, as Gauḍapāda in kārikā I.17 points out, all the phenomenal realities of the world would cease (prapañcopaśamam) to have any existence. All the dualities are merely sponsored by the indiscernible factor of māyā and in reality they do not exist at all.
Gauḍapāda identifies this fourth state of the absolute attributeless Being – the praṇava and the phonetic components of praṇava with the state of individual experience relegated in different gradations of consciousness. The realization of turīya as the attributeless consciousness is the real awakening from the state of profound sleep. The awakening is accomplished by contemplating on the praṇava and this is called the praṇava yoga. Apophatically, the praṇava yoga is the final salvific process and Gauḍapāda considers it to be an onto-soteriological guarantee for the emancipation of the individual soul.
The fulcrum of Gauḍapāda’s philosophy of non-duality is the theory of non-origination known as the ajāti vāda in Sanskrit. The theory of non-origination is constructed on the fundamental premise that ‘nothing is ever born, nothing is created whatsoever and there is no transactional reality at any rate’. The phenomenal reality is figurative and is imagined upon the Self by its own magical power called māyā. In the second and the third chapter of the kārikā, Gauḍapāda discusses this theory in detail. Gauḍapāda primarily adopts the logical method of superimposition and subsequent negation (adyāropa-apavāda) to establish the concept of non-origination of the Self. The Self is the only non-dual reality and whatever exists apart from that reality is logically reduced as unreal and is subsequently negated to absolute non-existence.
The doctrine of ajāti vāda – the theory of non-origination aims at dismantling all the theories of creation in order to suggest that there is no creation that has ever occurred. Gauḍapāda’s logical postulation is that when the Self is the only reality that remains eternal, whatever it is that seems to exist apart from the non-dual self must be unreal and hence non-existent. Gauḍapāda in the kārikā I.17 maintains the premise that ‘if the world ever existed then it would at some point cease to exist. But since the Self alone is the eternal existence, the phenomenal world is known to be absolute non-existence only’. Gauḍapāda also points out that the creation has no purpose in any metaphysical sense. Creation cannot serve the purpose of any experience to the divine Being since the Upaniṣadic import insists that the ultimate being is ever-accomplished and it transcends all phenomenal relations. Secondly, purpose of creation cannot be taken as the God’s sport or the divine play (līla) since it is an unwelcome position to suppose that the cosmogenically omnipotent God has some desire to be accomplished.
Gauḍapāda introduces the concept of non-origination in the vaitathya prakaraṇa where he aims to prove the falsity of the phenomenal world. He maintains that the existence of conventional mundane reality of the material world is an apparatus or the means (upāya) to apprehend the absolute non-dual being. In kārikā II.31, Gauḍapāda points out that the existence of the world is false; just as a city that exists in the sky (gandharva nagara), so does the whole universe upon the Self. Likewise, the modifications of material reality in terms of creation, subsistence and dissolution are merely imagined upon the Self. Gauḍapāda also uses the illustration of dream to posit that just as the dream vanishes to non-existence once the individual returns to the waking state; so does the world cease to exist once the reality of the absolute is known. Gauḍapāda insists on the point that there exists neither the dream nor the waking and hence the universe never existed at all upon the unborn Self. Gauḍapāda also uses the analogy of rope-snake in this context. The kārikā II.17 states that ‘as a rope whose nature has not been well known is imagined in the dark like a snake, so also is the pattern of duality imagined being manifested from the unborn Self’. The final illustration that Gauḍapāda employs can be noted from the kārikā III.8 that says ‘Just as the sky is seen by the ignorant young boys as being covered by the dust etc., so does the Self in being associated with the impurities of mundane transformations’ (yathā bālānaṁ gaganaṁ malinaṁ malaiḥ). Origination (jāti) is a magical projection (vivarta) of the Self and is operative only through māyā (sato hi māyayā janma – GK.III.27.) The Self that is bereft of any transformation in terms of origination and so forth, by its own innate nature is self-established (svastha), tranquil (śānta), self-effulgent (sakṛd vibhāta), nameless and formless (anāmaka, arūpaka).
The third chapter of Māṇdūkya kārikā, introduces the notion of ‘contact-less contemplation’ (asparśa yoga). According to Gauḍapāda, asparśa yoga is a transcendental mental state in which the mind is stripped from all desires and afflictions. Sparśa in Sanskrit means contact. In this context, it is the contact with the sense organs that results in the identification of Self with the non-Self causing bondage. Asparśa is the counter state in which there no contact with the sense organs (sarva abhilāpa vigatah; sarva cintā samutthitaḥ III.37) and the function of the mind in material sense is nullified. The ephemeral realities in multitude names and forms, those that are movable and immovable and so on, are perceived only by the mind (manodṛśya) causing desires, disappointments, pleasure, pain and so on. Once the mind is nullified, the duality does not exist. When mind is pure, the Self dwells in the supra-sensible state of tranquillity. Gauḍapāda, in the kārikā IV.2, offers salutations to the transcendental state of asparśa stating that this yogic state is free from all mundane relations in the nature of highest bliss, free from any dispute or doubt and that which is well established in the Vedic scriptures. ‘Those who perceive the contact of the consciousness with the external objects, may as well see footmarks in the open space’ (kārikā IV.28). Control of mind, according to Gauḍapāda, is the key to accomplish this state of asparśa. The mind when under complete control (manonigraha) through the ability to discriminate between the eternal Self and the ephemeral non-Self, in Gauḍapāda’s opinion, is equated with the nature of mind in the state of profound sleep. Gauḍapāda calls this state of non-mind ‘amanībhāva’.
The Advaita philosophy holds the position that the consciousness is attributed with the functionality of perception only with regard to the waking state wherein the objectivity is merely projected and thus appears in various names and forms. This figurative intentionality of consciousness is merely a mental simulation caused by the apparent conjugation of Self and the non-self. The objectivity provided by the mind attributes the intentionality to the consciousness. Thus consciousness acquires varied degrees of functionality in terms of intentional acts such as perception, memory, imagination and the like. In reality, however, suspending the objective world constituting the universals and particulars, the phenomenological residuum is the pure supra-Consciousness that does not stand in any causal relation with the objective entities; nor does it have any intentionality and hence is apodictically transcendental. Though the consciousness is the substratum for all cognitive experiences that precipitate out of subject-object interactions, it in ‘actuality’ remains untouched by any of these transactions.
Gauḍapāda uses the simile called ‘fire-circle’ (alāta cakra) in order to explain the onto-phenomenology of consciousness. When a stick with a fire tip is waved (alāta spandita) during the night, it forms different appearances in accordance to the movement of the fire-brand and so does the vibration of the consciousness that appears to exist in terms of known, knower and the like, (grahaṇa-grāhaka) in accordance to the nature of limiting adjuncts (kārikā IV.47). Just as the same fire-brand when not in motion is free from all appearances, the consciousness too when not vibrated remains in its true intrinsic nature is free from all names and forms. Gauḍapāda insists that, even when the fire-brand is in motion the appearances that seem to exist do not come from anywhere and they do not go anywhere. Appearances do not originate from the fire-brand and they do not dissolve into it. There is no causal relation between the resultant products of appearances with the seeming cause. Similarly, the entire universe that exist in pairs of dualities are not products of consciousness and nor is the consciousness a product of the physical universe. The existence of cause-effect result, according to Gauḍapāda , is a mental pre-occupation (phala-āveśaḥ) which is a mere projection (phala-udbhavah). In the domain of ignorance these mental pre-suppositions manifest as multi-fold appearances, which is purely due to concealment (samvṛtya – samvaraṇa) of the nature of absolute self as pure consciousness.
University of Toronto
Last updated: March 24, 2012 | Originally published: