Ge Hong was an eclectic philosopher who dedicated his life to searching for physical immortality, which he thought was attainable through alchemy. He lived during China’s tumultuous Period of Disunity (220-589 C.E.), a time in which alien conqueror regimes ruled northern China, the cradle of Chinese civilization, while a series of weak, transplanted Chinese states occupied recently colonized southern China. These political conditions, along with the social chaos they engendered, no doubt gave rise to Ge Hong’s ardent desire to establish order and permanency in both his spiritual and secular worlds. His most important contribution to Chinese philosophy was his attempt to reconcile an immortality-centered Daoism with Confucianism. Equally important, to establish political order, he also tried to reconcile Legalism with Confucianism. His penetrating insight was that the teachings of no one school could solve the problems that his world faced – only a combination of the best methods of each could do so.
In 283 C.E., Ge Hong was born into a southern magnate family whose native place was the Jurong district in Danyang prefecture, which was near Nanjing, in the southwest corner of present day Jiangsu province. Both his grandfather and father had reputations for broad learning and served as high ministers for the Wu state, which ruled over southeastern China from 220-280. Ge’s father continued to hold a number of middle level positions under the Western Jin dynasty (265-317) that briefly reunited China. Upon his father’s death in 296, Ge endured a period of relative poverty and lost his family’s extensive library due to civil strife. To educate himself, from this time on, he started copying books and reading voraciously. He began with the Confucian classics, but soon turned his attention to the various philosophical writings. Under the tutelage of Zheng Yin, who was both a Confucian classicist and a Daoist adept, Ge began his studies of the immortality arts. Zheng Yin himself was a disciple of Ge’s uncle, Ge Xuan (164-244), a Daoist adept who was reputed to have become an immortal.
Like other southern gentry, Ge Hong’s early career was spent in military positions. He had an extensive knowledge of martial affairs and was trained in the use of arms. In 303, at the age of twenty, he was called upon to organize and lead a militia in his native place against a rebel army, which he handily defeated. In a rare admission of violence for a Chinese literatus, he even relates that, with bow and arrow, two men and a horse died at his hands. In 305, after being promoted to the rank of a General Who Makes the Waves Submit, Ge tried to make his way to Luoyang, the capital. Although his autobiography tells us he did so “to look for unusual books,” he was probably also hoping to obtain a promotion. However, due to the Rebellion of the Eight Princes that was being fought throughout northern China, he never made it; instead, he wandered throughout southern China. To escape from the turmoil that was embroiling the rest of China, he finally accepted a position as a military councilor under his friend who was appointed to be the governor of Guangzhou (Canton), a port city in the far south.
After his patron was killed enroute to assuming the governorship, Ge refused many other military appointments and remained in Guangzhou for the next eight years, living the life of a recluse at nearby Mount Luofu. In 314, he returned to his native place of Jurong. There, he studied under another Daoist adept named Bao Qing (260-330), the former governor of Nanhai prefecture, who was so impressed that he gave Ge his eldest daughter in marriage. It was during this long period of reclusion that Ge wrote his two part magnum opus whose title bore his sobriquet: the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity and the Outer Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity. Ge used the Daoist Inner Chapters to substantiate the reality of immortality and convey the methods for realizing it, while the Confucian Outer Chapters describe the problems afflicting the secular world and his proposed solutions. In fact, until the fourteenth century, the Inner Chapters and Outer Chapters circulated independently from each other. With these two works, Ge aspired to establish his own school of philosophy. Also at this time, illustrative of his aspirations, Ge compiled hagiographical works entitled Biographies of Divine Transcedents and Biographies of Recluses.
With the establishment of the Eastern Jin dynasty in southern China in 317, the transplanted throne was eager to gain the allegiance of powerful southern gentry families; thus, men such as Ge Hong were showered with official appointments, which were usually more honorary than substantive in nature. In recognition of his past military successes, Ge himself was given the title of Marquis of the Region Within the Pass. Finally, in 326, Wang Dao (276-339), the prime minister, appointed him to a series of positions, ending with that of military advisor. By 332, due to his advanced age (he was 50) and desire to find ingredients for immortality elixirs, he begged to be given a post in northern part of present-day Vietnam. On his way there, the governor of Guangzhou, Deng Yue, detained him there indefinitely. He thus took up residence at nearby Mount Luofu where he engaged in immortality practices until his death in 343.
By his own admission, Ge Hong was a man that was out of sorts with his age. He was a southerner in an age where only northern émigrés were given posts of substance. Due to his lack of verbal eloquence, he could never obtain social prestige in the salons where men were prized for their ability to engage in “Pure Talk” – abstract philosophical discussions. Nor did his strong Confucian sense of morality sit well with the libertine tendencies of that prevailed among the northern émigrés. The outlet of his frustrations became his writings, in which he attacked the fashions and trends of his day and proposed his own vision of how people should obtain stability in an instable world.
Ge Hong wholeheartedly believed that anyone, through unrelenting effort and study, could obtain immortality. One does not have to be either rich or powerful to do so; in fact, wealth and position are harmful because they inhibit one from attaining the necessary moral and physical serenity. Moreover, it is not up to the arbitrary decisions of deities to extend our lives – they are merely divine administrators who keep track of our sins and good deeds; consequently, sacrifices and prayers to them for this purpose are useless. Thus, whether one can obtain immortality is entirely based on his or her own diligence and determination. It was precisely for those educated people who wanted and were willing to work towards obtaining immortality that Ge wrote his Inner Chapters. The overriding importance that he attached to obtaining eternal life is evident in that the inner, and thereby his most important, chapters of his magnum opus were dedicated to the topic.
Ge Hong firmly believed that physical immortality was possible. This is because all things are permeated by the metaphysical oneness, xuan (the mystery), which creates and animates all things. Significantly, for Ge, xuan is synonymous with the words dao (the way, the ultimate reality) and yi (the one, the unity). In this light, he describes xuan in the following manner: it “carries within it the embryo of the Original One, it forms and shapes the two Principles (Yin and Yang); it exhales and absorbs the great Genesis, it inspires and transforms the multitude of species, it makes constellations go round, it shaped the primordial Darkness, it guides the wonderful mainspring of the universe, it exhales the four seasons … if one adds to it, it does not increase. If one takes away from it, it does not grow less. If something is given to it, it is not increased in glory. If something is taken from it, it does not suffer. Where the Mystery is present, joy is infinite; where the Mystery has departed, efficacy is exhausted and the spirit disappears” (Robinet, 82-83). In other words, the key to immortality is maintaining this everlasting oneness within oneself – if one cannot do so, he or she will soon die. The reason why people lose it is that they become attached through their desires to the outside world, thereby forgetting the jewel that resides within. As Ge put it, “The way of xuan is obtained within oneself, but is lost due to things outside oneself. Those who employ xuan are gods; those who forget it are merely [empty] vessels.”
How does one maintain the unity within oneself? For Ge Hong it had much to do with preserving, enhancing, and refining one’s qi, which for him embodied the metaphysical mystery. Qi, which originally meant “breath” or “vapor,” came to designate the vital energy that exists within and animates all things. As Ge Hong relates, “people reside within qi and qi resides within people. From heaven and earth down to the ten thousand things, each one requires qi to live. As for those who excel at circulating their qi, internally they are able to nourish their body; externally, they are able to repel illnesses.” Since each person receives a finite amount of qi at birth, he recommends various methods to retain and enhance it, which include breathing exercises, sexual techniques, calisthenics, dietary restrictions, and the ingestion of herbal medicines. Since none of these methods is infallible, he recommends that an adept should practice a number of them in combination with each other. By doing so, one protects oneself from manifold disasters, such as illnesses, demons, savage beasts and weapons, while also lessening desires, transforming the body, and extending one’s lifespan. These methods could even give their practitioners supernatural powers, such as curing illnesses, raising the dead, seeing the future, commanding gods and ghosts, forgoing food for years, and the ability to disappear.
Nevertheless, none of these techniques could permanently keep xuan within oneself. To do that, nothing was comparable with taking alchemically created medicines. Ge thus informs us that, “Even if one performs breathing exercises and calisthenics, as well as ingests herbal medicines, this can only extend the years of your lifespan, but it will not save you from death. Ingesting divine cinnabar will make your lifespan inexhaustible. You will last as long as heaven and earth, be able to travel on clouds and ride dragons, and ascend at will to the Heaven of Highest Clarity.” Alchemically derived medicines, the best of which contained either liquefied gold or reverted cinnabar, were able to have this marvelous effect because the substances from which they were made had shown themselves, through repeated firings in the alchemist’s stove, to be impervious to decay or dissolution. According to Ge, “As for forging of gold and cinnabar, the longer one burns them, the more marvelous their transformations. When gold enters the flames, even after one hundred firings, it will not disappear. If you bury it forever, it will never decay. If one ingests these two substances, they will refine that person’s body, and make it so that he or she will neither age nor die.” In other words, one makes one’s own body imperishable by ingesting imperishable things. Mechanically what happens is that, upon ingestion, these substances seep into one’s blood and qi, thereby making them stronger. Ge Hong calls this using an outside substance to fortify one’s self. The reason why herbs are inferior to gold and cinnabar is that they are perishable; thus, they lack the capacity to make the body imperishable. Unfortunately though, the ingredients for making these mineral medicines are difficult to obtain, the process of smelting them is arduous, and the ritual circumstances under which they must be made are elaborate; as a result, Ge Hong several times admits that he has never had enough resources to attempt to produce these superb formulas.
It is often said of premodern Chinese literati that they were Daoist at home while Confucian in the office. Ge Hong was in fact probably one of the first Chinese thinkers to consciously try to reconcile Confucianism and Daoism. As the division of his major work into inner and outer chapters indicates, he did so by asserting that Confucianism and Daoism addressed different aspects of life. Confucianism addressed the external world and provided means by which to ameliorate its many problems; Daoism concerned the inner world and provided means by which to attain immortality. As Ge succinctly put it, “For an extraordinarily talented person, what difficulty could there be in practicing both (Confucianism and Daoism) at the same time? Inwardly, such people treasure the way of nourishing life; outwardly, they exhibit their brilliance in the world. If they regulate their persons, their persons then will be cultivated for a prolonged time; if they rule the country, the country will achieve the state of great peace.” Cultivating one’s spirit for immortality thereby automatically enables one to rule a country well. Thus, if one becomes a terrestrial immortal, Ge Hong sees no reason why such a person cannot hold office and contribute to the welfare of his generation.
Nevertheless, even though both were important, Daoism was even more so. That is because in the far past the sage kings followed the Dao “the oneness” or “the natural order of things,” as a result, the people’s conduct was flawless and natural processes transpired smoothly without disruption or disaster. Later kings, however, no longer followed the Dao; consequently, natural disasters occurred frequently and people became evil and unruly. It was only at this point that Confucianism was introduced in an attempt to rectify this situation. Thus, Daoism is superior because it kept the world from becoming chaotic; Confucianim, on the other hand, only appeared when the world declined into disorder and its practitioners have often become entangled in the resulting mess. Thus, Daoists, like Confucians, provide the world with moral order, but they do so without becoming soiled in the process. As Ge Hong put it, “In regard to the Daoists, their making consists of excelling in cultivating the self to complete their duties; their repose consists in excelling in doing away with the impurities of people; their governance consists of excelling in cutting off misfortune before it occurs; their giving consists in excelling at saving things, but not considering it virtuous; their activity consist in excelling at using their heart-mind to urge the people [to do good]; their quiescence consists in excelling at being cautious and without rancor. These characteristics are why Daoism is the ruler and leader of the hundred schools of philosophy and why it is the ancestor of [Confucian] righteous and benevolence.” Nevertheless, since only a few people are able to correctly pursue Daoism and present times are disordered, Confucianism is necessary to maintain the social order that is embodied in the family and the state. Very much in a Confucian vein, he evaluates both philosophies through a moral lenses.
One of the ways in which Ge Hong connected Confucianism and Daoism is by stating that one needed to perfect oneself ethically to pursue immortality. In his Inner Chapters, Ge Hong makes it clear that none of the methods for prolonging one’s life will work unless one is morally pure, which can only happen by realizing Confucian virtues. Ge explicitly states that, “those who seek to become immortals must regard loyalty, filiality, peacefulness, obedience, benevolence and trustworthiness as fundamental. If one does not cultivate his or her moral behavior, and merely instead devotes oneself to esoteric methods, he or she will never obtain an extended lifespan.” Since these virtues, particularly that of benevolence (ren), emphasize putting the interests of others before one’s own, they cultivated a sense of selflessness and detachment that Ge viewed as essential for maintaining the mysterious oneness within oneself.
His strong emphasis on morality led him to systematize and quantify earlier ideas about how spirits punished immoral behavior. Ge Hong maintained that for each minor moral transgression one committed, the Director of Fates would subtract three days from his or her lifespan; for each major transgression, three hundred days would be deducted. To guide people’s behavior, he even listed sixty-four possible sins. Very few of these prohibitions are religious in nature – the overwhelming majority concern secular life and many are Confucian inspired. Furthermore, he posited that, to achieve spiritual benefits, one had to continuously accumulate good deeds: 300 were needed to become an earthbound immortal and 1200 to become a celestial immortal. One mishap and the balance would be canceled. Ge Hong even transformed the three corpses, evil entities within the body who endeavor to destroy it to earn their freedom, into ethical agents that try to decimate their host’s health by disclosing his sins to the celestial authorities. This system of measuring good and bad deeds would later giver rise to the Ledgers of Merit and Demerit, popular books that let people keep track of their moral progress by assigning numerical scores to virtuous and immoral behavior.
Ge Hong also attempted to reconcile Daoism with Confucianism by both emphasizing the importance and naturalness of hierarchy and attacking Daoism’s equalitarian tendencies. Although Laozi and Zhuangzi always assumed that kings would exist, their utopian vision of society was a small village society whose inhabitants never leave their hamlets, do not use contrivances, and have few material goods. In order to attack this line of thinking in his Outer Chapters, Ge Hong puts forth the views of a man named Bao Jingyan who extended the Daoist arguments to their logical conclusion. Bao maintains that the simple agrarian utopias in which people lived simply and equally were lost due to the creation of hierarchy, which was based on the strong oppressing the weak and the smart deceiving the foolish. With the lord/subject tie came a host of evils such as weapons, armies, rebellions, greed, thievery, deceit, extravagance, and crime. Thus, Bao advocated the abolishment of rulers as the key to securing peace and happiness. Incidentally, Bao is the earliest known Chinese advocate of anarchy. Ge Hong, on the contrary, thinks that in a state of nature people think only of their own desires, hence they vie with each other like beasts for scarce resources. Hierarchy was thus established to put an end to the strong oppressing the weak. Moreover, hierarchy is natural: as the oneness unfolds into the ten thousand things, it divides itself into high and low; hence, heaven is above and earth is below. Thus, it is only natural that some people are more important than others. This is true to the extent that even immortals are hierarchically organized: freshly minted immortals must occupy the lower rungs of the celestial bureaucracy and serve their superiors, while terrestrial immortals are inferior to their celestial counterparts. Ge also recognized that civilization could not be undone and that hierarchy had brought about material progress, as the following passage indicates: “Now, [would you be at ease] if I made you reside in the cramped quarters of a nest or cave? [Would you be at ease] if upon your death, your body was abandoned in the fields? [Would you be at ease] if upon being impeded by a river, you had to swim to cross it? [Would you be at ease] if upon traveling through the mountains, you had to walk and shoulder luggage? [Would you be at ease] if your cooking implements were cast away and you had to make do with raw and smelly food? [Would you be at ease] if you no longer had stone needles for acupuncture and had to merely rely on nature to [cure] your illness? [Would you be at ease] if nakedness was your only ornament and you had no clothes? [Would you be at ease] if you came across a female and made her your mate without an intermediary? You and I would both likely say, ‘to do these things would be impossible.’ How much less could we do without a lord!” In other words, progress and hierarchy are realities, and beneficial ones at that, which can neither be ignored nor abandoned.
Since Ge Hong recognized that this world cannot be ignored, he believed that one must find a way to improve it. Given the corruption and chaos that ruled his age, like many of his contemporaries, he looked for answers beyond Confucianism to its arch nemesis, Legalism. His reform program was thus a synthesis of both Confucian and Legalist political ideas. First of all, even though he believed that the ruler, like a good Confucian sovereign, should cultivate his person, lead the people through his own moral example, and take their welfare as his overriding concern, he admitted that this was not sufficient to guide society. To govern well, one had to have clear laws to punish miscreants. He warns us that, “It is not that governing with benevolence is not wonderful, it is just that the black-haired masses can be crafty and deceitful. They hanker after profit and forget righteousness. If one does not order them with one’s authority and correct them with punishments, if one only admires the ways of Fuxi and Shennong (Confucian cultural heroes), then chaos cannot be avoided and the resulting calamities will be numerous. [Yet] to use killing to stop killing, how could anyone find joy in that?” In short, although leading through one’s moral example is preferable, it is not realistic: it is sometimes necessary to use the harsher methods. Since Confucian moral example was not enough, the ruler must turn to the law and mete out punishments. Following Legalist ideas, Ge argues that the laws must be clear, explicit, and fair; i.e., they must be applicable to everyone. Moreover, the punishments for misbehavior must be severe. It is precisely generous rewards and harsh punishments that will keep the strong from oppressing the weak. Regimes are weak because their laws are neither severe nor enforced. In line with this thinking, Ge was in favor of reviving punishments that mutilated the guilty. Convicts suffering from such punishments would be constant reminders to the people of the terrible price to be paid for violating the law. Lest the modern reader judge Ge harshly for supporting such draconian measures, since the death penalty largely replaced the mutilation punishments, Ge thought the latter was more humane, since at least the criminal would escape with his or her life.
Another way in which Ge Hong tried to reconcile Confucianism and Legalism was through the type of training officials should receive. Under the Legalist Qin dynasty (221-207 BCE), which unified China for the first time, officials were largely men who excelled in legal and administrative matters. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE – 220 CE), particularly during its latter half, Confucianism gradually became the dominant ideology, hence the education and knowledge of officials became more centered on the Confucian classics. Men who primarily specialized in legal matters were slighted and only given clerical positions. Due to this situation, Ge complained that officials, no matter what their level, no longer understood the laws, hence they often issued incorrect judgments and were deceived by their more legally savvy underlings. Consequently, he thought that aspirants to officialdom should be tested not only on the Confucian classics, but also on the law.
That officials should be knowledgeable in both the classics and the law highlights one of his most consistent teachings: a person must be broadly educated and that deep study leads to the mastery of all things. For Ge Hong, through the diligent acquisition of knowledge, anything was possible, whether it be ruling a country or attaining immortality. In this vein, he said, “When one peels away dark clouds, one exposes the sun; as a result, the ten thousand things cannot hide their shapes. By unrolling bamboo and silk (that is, by reading books) and investigating the past and present, heaven and earth thereby hide none of their facts. How much less so gods and demons? And how much less so the affairs of people?” Nevertheless, one could not just specialize in one kind of learning, but had to learn the teachings of many different schools. Likewise, in seeking immortality, one should study many techniques and never merely practice one exclusively. Similarly, in terms of book learning, one should not merely confine oneself to learning the classics because all written works had something of worth. Indeed, he propounded the revolutionary sentiment that the elaborate writings of his day were superior to the simplistic classics. The more widely one read, and the more techniques one acquired, the more one would be likely to excel in both the spiritual and secular worlds. Study was also a means of self-cultivation – through it one could eliminate desires by becoming indifferent to his or her physical circumstances.
According to Ge Hong, one of the primary reasons governance of his time was so inept and ineffective was that officials were not selected on the basis of their intelligence, but only due to their connections, bribery, or their ability to speak eloquently. Ge thought the solution to this problem would be to use examinations to select men on the basis of their knowledge of the classics and administrative matters. The examinations should be held in the palace, supervised by high officials, and their contents should be kept in the utmost secrecy. By this means, there would be little opportunity to pass the examinations through deceit or bribery. Moreover, when the only way to become an official is through examinations, everyone will value study. Although he admitted that passing the examinations would not guarantee that that person would be a good official, he thought that the ability to do so was a fair indicator of talent. In other words, Ge Hong was one of the earliest proponents of selecting officials through a vigorous and fair examination system, one of the hallmarks of Chinese civilization.
In sum, Ge Hong was a philosopher who, due to the topsy-turvy world in which he lived, was willing to look for solutions in the wisdom of any philosopher, regardless of his sectarian background. With Ge’s overriding sense of the importance of morality and his overwhelming urge for permanency in the form of immortality, he reconciled Confucian and Daoism by saying that both were trying to improve the condition of mankind and that practicing Confucian virtues was necessary for attaining immortality. Likewise, this search for concrete, no-nonsense answers also led him to reconcile his Confucian leanings with the real politick teachings of Legalism. Thus, although he maintained that the ruler must endeavor to mold his people’s behavior through his own example, generous rewards and severe punishments were even more important in regulating the affairs of the troublesome masses. In order to manifest both these philosophies, Ge advocated that officials be both experts in the classics and legal matters. Thus, Ge helped fashion the values that allowed latter Chinese to unproblematically simultaneously use Daoist, Confucian, and Legalist assumptions in both their public and private lives.
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 9, 2005 | Originally published: