Gender in Chinese Philosophy

The concept of gender is foundational to the general approach of Chinese thinkers. Yin and yang, core elements of Chinese cosmogony, involve correlative aspects of “dark and light,” “female and male,” and “soft and hard.” These notions, with their deeply-rooted gender connotations, recognize the necessity of interplay between these different forces in generating and carrying forward the world. The major thinkers of China’s first philosophic flourishing—traditionally referred to as the Hundred Schools, c. 500s-200s B.C.E.—inherited and further developed this comprehensively gendered view of the world. These concepts continue to shape contemporary Chinese thought, as well. Historically, the most influential Chinese perspectives on the issue of gender come from what are commonly referred to as Confucian and Daoist traditions of thought, which take somewhat opposing positions. Many texts associated with Confucianism emphasize yang’s dominant, male-related characteristics, whereas those linked to Daoism, especially the Laozi, reverse this view, finding value in yin’s subordinate, female characteristics. However, it should be noted that Chinese thinkers, regardless of their classification as Confucian or Daoist, generally see the opposing qualities of yin and yang as integral parts of a whole that complement one another. Accordingly, the closest word to “gender” in modern Chinese is xingbie, which can be quite literally understood as a difference (bie) of individual nature or tendencies (xing). The word generally, however, refers to the physiological characteristics that then provide the basis for corresponding social identities. The genders, in terms of social roles, are not defined absolutely or theoretically, but rather through the mutually reciprocal, physical, generative relationship between male and female. They are understood correlatively, and determined by their context and dynamic tendencies as they interact with one another. Such traditions within Chinese thought may be applied as resources for contemporary feminist philosophy, albeit not without considerable caution.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender
  3. Gender Cosmology
  4. Gender and Social Order
  5. Family Patterns
  6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

There is a debate in contemporary Chinese academic circles about whether or not the idea of “gender” or “gender concepts” actually applies to traditional Chinese thought. Chinese scholars argue about the presence of “male” (xiong) and “female” (ci) characteristics, differences, and relations in the context of ancient Chinese philosophy. Although affirming this interpretation would provide a space for comparative studies with Western traditions, some thinkers believe that doing so distorts traditional Chinese thought.

Zhang Xianglong is a prominent representative of those who think that Chinese philosophy and culture have long been influenced by concepts of gender. For him, Chinese thinking is fundamentally gendered as it takes the interaction between male and female as the basic model for philosophical investigations. He further argues that it is one of the core aspects of mainstream thought in China. Zhang demonstrates that yin and yang strongly connote ideas of female and male, and identifies such gendered thought in works as early as the Zhouyi, or Yijing (Book of Changes), a traditional Chinese divinatory text of uncertain antiquity consisting of hexagrams and their interpretations, as well as throughout the later traditions of Confucianism, Daoism, and Chinese Buddhism. Accordingly, he argues that yin and women have “in principle never been doomed to be inferior” and “discrimination against women in ancient Chinese culture is neither deterministic nor universal” (Zhang 2002:5). Such a claim is dubious, as the dualistic dynamic of yin and yang, while positing both aspects as essential to existence and in this way ontologically equal, has been generally presented as inherently hierarchical. Chen Jiaqi opposes Zhang’s broader position, arguing that yin and yang are not necessarily related to gender. For Chen, yin and yang primarily involve social relationships, political forms, and weighing advantages and disadvantages. He holds that gender characteristics are too abstract to be practically relevant in this context, and do not apply directly to social forms (Chen 2003).

From a historical perspective, Chen’s interpretation is less convincing than Zhang’s. There are numerous Chinese texts where yin and yang are broadly associated with gender. While yang and yin are not exclusively defined as “male” and “female,” and either sex can be considered yin or yang within a given context, in terms of their most general relation to one another, yin references the female and yang the male. For example, the Daoist text known as the Taipingjing (Scripture of Great Peace) records that “the male and female are the root of yin and yang.” The Han dynasty Confucian thinker Dong Zhongshu (195-115 B.C.E.) also writes, “Yin and yang of the heavens and the earth [which together refer to the cosmos] should be male and female, and the male and female should be yin and yang. Thereby, yin and yang can be called male and female, and male and female can be called yin and yang.” These and other texts draw a strong link between yin as female and yang as male. However, it is important to also recognize that gender itself is not as malleable as yin and yang, despite this connection. While gender remains fixed, their coupling with yin and yang is not. This close and complex relationship means yin and yang themselves require examination if their role in Chinese gender theory is to be properly understood.

The original meaning of yin and yang had little to do with gender differences. Some of the earliest uses of yin and yang are found in the Shangshu (Book of Documents). Here, the word yang is employed six times, and five times it denotes the southern side of mountains, which receives the most sunlight. The term yin appears three times in the text, and refers to the shadier northern side of mountains. These examples are characteristic of how yin and yang function throughout Chinese intellectual history; they do not refer to particular objects, but act as correlative categorizations. In most instances yin and yang are used to indicate a specific relationship within a determined context. The way sunshine falls on a mountain is the context, and the difference between the northern and southern sides, where the latter receives more light and warmth, determines their association, which is understood as yin and yang. The terms are thereby an expression of the function of the sun on a particular place, but they do not speak to the actual substance of the objects (the sun or mountain) themselves. The specific traits of the objects can only be designated yin and yang in their functional correlation to one another. Within this matrix, yin things share commonalities when viewed in relation to yang things.

In this way, the early association of yin and yang with gender can be seen as speaking to the relationship between genders, and not to their essential or substantial natures. Yin and yang traits were thus seen as able to accurately describe broad differences between males and females as they interact with one another. Fixing the link between these categorizations, having men be yang in relation to women, who are yin, only works in a highly abstract or broad sense. For example, the Book of Changes states that the emperor is supposed to have six male ministers at the south palace (a yang position) and six wives or concubines at the north palace (a yin position). Like the southern and northern sides of a mountain, men and women are yang and yin in the way they serve the emperor. Social positions are linked to gender and understood through yin and yang. The Liji (Record of Rituals) states that “the male is outside, and the wife inside the home. The sun starts in the east and the moon starts in the west. This is the distinction of yin and yang, the positions of husband and wife.” However, in specific contexts, it is possible for the association to be reversed. For instance, in Dong Zhongshu’s Chunqiu Fanlu (Spring and Autumn Annals), we also find that “the sovereign is yang, the minister is yin; the father is yang, the son is yin.” Here males, such as ministers or sons, can also be considered yin. The entire pattern can be overturned, as well, such as in the relationship between an empress and her male ministers, where the woman is yang and the men are considered yin. However, such a situation was often considered something that should be approached with caution, as it violated natural patterns. For example, Wang Bi (226-249 C.E.), who did not care much for Dong Zhongshu’s cosmological interpretation, still argued that a woman who was too strong was not to be married.

In terms of actual practice, the more generalized and stable affiliation between yin as female and yang as male often won out, as exemplified by Wang’s idea. It was commonly appropriated as an ideological tool for backing the oppression of women, especially after Dong Zhongshu’s theories took hold. Dong, whose version of Confucianism won imperial backing during the Han dynasty, was also responsible for promoting the official establishment of a formal cosmology based on yin and yang, which became quite influential in the Chinese tradition. While he allows for men to be understood as yin and women as yang in certain contexts, overall he sought to limit the scope of such reversals. For Dong, males are dominant, powerful, and moral, and therefore yang. Women, on the other hand, are precisely the opposite—subservient, weak, selfish, and jealous—and best described as yin. As a result, female virtues became largely oriented toward social roles, especially women’s duties as wives (for example, the female virtues of chastity and compliancy). Against this biased intellectual background, oppressive practices were supported and initiated. For instance, the widespread acceptance of concubinage and female foot binding in Chinese social history expressed the inequality between genders.

However, this social inequality did not accurately reflect its culture’s philosophical thought. Most Chinese thinkers were very attentive to the advantageousness of the complementary nature of male and female characteristics. In fact, in many texts considered Confucian that are predominant for two millennia of Chinese thought, the political system and gender roles are integrated (Yang 2013). This integration is based on understanding yin and yang as fundamentally affixed to gender and thereby permeating all aspects of social life. Sinologists such as Joseph Needham have identified a “feminine symbol” in Chinese culture, rooted in the Daoist concentration on yin. Roger Ames and David Hall similarly argue that yin and yang indicate a “difference in emphasis rather than difference in kind” and should be viewed as a whole, and that therefore their relationship can be likened to that of male and female traits (Ames and Hall 1998: 90-96). Overall, while the complementary understanding of yin and yang did not bring about gender equality in traditional Chinese society, it remains a key factor for comprehending Chinese conceptions of gender. As Robin Wang has noted, “on the one hand, yinyang seems to be an intriguing and valuable conceptual resource in ancient Chinese thought for a balanced account of gender equality; on the other hand, no one can deny the fact that the inhumane treatment of women throughout Chinese history has often been rationalized in the name of yinyang” (Wang 2012: xi).

2. Human Tendencies (Nature) and Gender

Gender issues play an important role in the history of Chinese thought. Many thinkers theorized about the significance of gender in a variety of areas. The precondition for this discussion is an interpretation of xing, “nature” or “tendencies.” The idea of “differences of xing” constitutes the modern term for “gender,” xingbie (literally “tendency differences”) making xing central to this discussion. It should be noted that the Chinese understanding of xing, including “human xing,” is closer to “tendency” or “propensity” than traditional Western conceptions of human “nature.” This is mainly because xing is not seen as something static or unchangeable. (It is for this reason that Ames and Hall, in the quote above, highlight the difference between “emphasis” and “kind.”) The way xing is understood greatly contributes to the way arguments about gender unfold.

The term xing first became an important philosophical concept in discussions about humanity and eventually human tendency, or renxing. In terms of its composition, the character xing is made up of a vertical representation of xin, “heart-mind” (the heart was thought to be the organ responsible for both thoughts and feelings/emotions) on the left side. This complements the character sheng, to the right, which can mean “generation,” “grow,” or “give birth to.” In many cases, the way sheng is understood has a significant impact on interpreting xing and gender. As a noun, sheng can mean “natural life,” which gives rise to theories about “original nature” or “foundational tendencies” (benxing). It thereby connotes vital activities and physiological desires or needs. It is in this sense that Mengzi (372-289 B.C.E.) describes human tendencies (renxing) as desiring to eat and have sex. He also says that form and color are natural characteristics, or natural xing. The Record of Rituals similarly comments that food, drink, and relations between men and women are defining human interests. Xunzi  (312-238 B.C.E.), generally regarded as the last great classical Confucian thinker, fundamentally disagreed with Mengzi’s claim that humans naturally tend toward what is good or moral. He did, however, similarly classify xing as the desire for food, warmth, and rest.

Sheng can also be a verb, which gives xing a slightly different connotation. As a verb, sheng indicates creation and growth, and thus supports the suggestion that xing should be understood as human growth through the development of one’s heart-mind, the root, or seat, of human nature or tendencies. The Mengzi expressly refers to this, stating that xing is understood through the heart-mind. This also marks the distinction between humans and animals. A human xing provides specific characteristics and enables a certain orientation for growth that is unique in that it includes a moral dimension. It is in this sense that Mengzi proposes his theory for natural human goodness, a suggestion that Xunzi later rebuts, albeit upon a similar understanding of xing. Texts classified as Daoist, such as the Laozi and Zhuangzi, similarly affirm that xing is what endows beings with their particular virtuousness (though it is not necessarily moral).

It is on the basis of human nature/tendencies that their unique capacity for moral cultivation is given. The Xing Zi Ming Chu (Recipes for Nourishing Life), a 4th century B.C.E. text recovered from the Guodian archaeological site, comments that human beings are defined by the capacity and desire to learn. Natural human tendencies are thereby not simply inherent, they also need to be grown and refined. The Mengzi argues that learning is nothing more than developing and cultivating aspects of one’s own heart-mind. The Xunzi agrees, adding that too much change or purposeful change can bring about falsity—which often results in immoral thoughts, feelings, or actions. These texts agree in their argument that there are certain natural patterns or processes for each thing, and deviating from these is potentially dangerous. Anything “false” or out of accordance with these patterns is likely to be immoral and harmful to oneself and society, so certain restrictions are placed on human practice to promote moral growth. These discussions look at human tendencies as largely shaped in the context of society, and can be taken as a conceptual basis for understanding gender as a natural tendency that is steered through social institutions. For example, when Mengzi is asked why the ancient sage-ruler Shun lied to his parents in order to marry, Mengzi defends Shun as doing the right thing. Explaining that otherwise Shun would have remained a bachelor, Mengzi writes, “The greatest of human relations is that a man and a woman live together.” Thus Mengzi argues that Shun’s moral character was based on proper cultivation of his natural tendencies according to social mores.

One’s individual nature is largely influenced, and to some extent even generated, by one’s cultural surroundings. This also produces physiological properties that account for a wide variety of characteristics that are then reflected in aspects of gender, culture, and social status. Linked to the understanding of yin and yang as functionally codependent categorizations, differences between genders are characterized on the basis of their distinguishing features, and defined correlatively. This means that behavior and identity largely arise within the context of male-female relations. One’s natural tendencies include gender identity as either xiong xing (male tendencies) or ci xing (female tendencies), which one is supposed to cultivate accordingly. Thus there are more physiological and cultural aspects to human tendencies, as well. In these diverse ways, Chinese philosophy emphasizes the difference between males and females, believing that each has their own particular aspects to offer, which are complementary and can be unified to form a harmonious whole (though this does not necessarily imply their equality).

3. Gender Cosmology

The idea of gender as being fundamentally understood through respective dissimilarities (nan nü you bie) is based in the physiological differences between men and women, but also manifests in philosophic thought. In fact, in one of the earliest references to the distinction between men and women, the Record of Rituals asserts:

Once there is a difference between males and females, then there can be love between fathers and sons. Once there is love between fathers and sons, obligations are generated. Once obligations are generated, rituals are made. Once rituals are made, all things can be at ease.

The original difference between genders is—presumably through the generative power of their combination—the foundation for obligations (or morality) and thus ritual (or social moral patterns), which allows finally for harmony in the cosmos as a whole. Through the establishment of the concept that human tendencies are formed and act in line with nature, Chinese gender cosmology applies an analogous generative model of yin and yang to a general understanding of the world.

Another early text, the 3rd century B.C.E. medical compendium Huangdi Neijing (Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor), offers one of the most comprehensive definitions of yin and yang:

Yin and yang are the dao (“way”) of the heavens and earth, they provide the model for the net (gangji) of all beings, they are the parents of all change and transformation, and the origin of life and death, and the residence for spirit and insight. To heal illness [one] must seek its root. (Zhang 2002: 41)

Here, yin and yang are taken as a pattern embedded in the existence of all beings, thus providing the foundation for a coherent worldview. This weaves together human beings, nature, and dao (way) in a manner that creates a dynamic wholeness pervaded by and mediated through the interaction of yin and yang. This Chinese cosmological view sees all things, including humans, as borne of both yin and yang and thus naturally integrated with one another. In essence, dao represents the interaction between yin and yang, and it is in this respect that the Laozi tells us that dao is both the source and the model, or pattern, for all things (Laozi 25). More directly, the Laozi comments that all things in turn carry yin and embrace yang (Laozi 42). This shows that through yin and yang and their patterns of interaction dao provides the rhythm of the cosmos. From this perspective the genders also complement and nourish one another, and are even vital to one another.

The idea that the interaction of yin and yang generates the myriad things in existence corresponds to intercourse between male and female as the only means for reproducing life. Therefore, the nature of men and women in Chinese philosophy is not only based on purely physiological characteristics and differences, but is also the embodiment of yin and yang forces in gender. The dao of men and women are linked to the dao of the universe in terms of reproducing life. This is systematically discussed in the Book of Changes, one of China’s most ancient and influential texts. There, eight trigrams are given, which represent eight natural phenomena and can further be combined to form sixty-four hexagrams. These are expressions of the function and movement of yin and yang. They are composed of two contrasting symbols: the yang-yao unbroken horizontal line, and the yin-yao broken horizontal line. Some scholars see these as referring to the male and female genitals respectively. In this sense, the first two hexagrams qian or “heaven” (which is six yang-yaos) and kun or “earth” (six yin-yaos) can be interpreted as representing pure yin and yang. They are also responsible for the formation of general gender stereotypes in Chinese thought. They provide the gateways for change, and are considered, quite literally, the father and mother of all other hexagrams (which equates to all things in the world). The broad system of the Book of Changes attempts to explain every type of change and existence, and is built upon an identification of yin and yang with the sexes as well as their interaction with one another.

According to the “Xici Zhuan” (Commentary on the Appended Phrases) section of the Book of Changes, qian is equated with the heavens, yang, power, and creativity, while kun is identified with the earth, yin, receptivity, and preservation. Their interaction generates all things and events in a way that is similar to the intercourse between males and females, bringing about new life. The Commentary on the Appended Phrases makes the link to gender issues clear by stating that both qian and kun have their own daos (ways) that are responsible for the male and female respectively. The text goes on to discuss the interaction between the two, both cosmologically in terms of the heavens and earth and biologically in terms of the sexes. The conclusion is that their combination and interrelation is responsible for all living things and their changes. The intercourse between genders is a harmonization of yin and yang that is necessary not only for an individual’s well-being, but also for the proper functioning of the cosmos. Interaction between genders is thus the primary mechanism of life, which explains all forms of generation, transformation, and existence.

4. Gender and Social Order

Theoretically, the social order of gender in Chinese thought is broadly formed on the concepts of the heavens and earth and yin and yang. When these notions are applied to the social field, they are likened to the male and female genders. In the aforementioned Commentary on the Appended Phrases, heaven and yang are considered honorable, while the earth and yin are seen as lowly in comparison. Since the former are coupled with qian, which comprises maleness, and the latter with kun, which marks femaleness, these gender roles are valued similarly. The Inner Scripture of the Yellow Emperor says that yang’s maleness is meant for the outside, and yin’s femaleness for the inside. Men, being equated here with yang, are also associated with superiority, motion, and firmness, while women are coupled with yin and so seen as inferior, still, and gentle. Gender cosmology then largely replaced more dynamic views of gender roles with sharply defined unequal relationships, and these were generally echoed throughout the culture. The social order that emerged from this thought saw men as largely in charge of external affairs and superior to women.

The specific operational mode for maintaining this social order and its gender distinctions is li, propriety or ritual. The Record of Rituals focuses much of its discourse on specific rules regarding distinct practices reserved for certain individuals through gender categorization. In this way, wedding ceremonies are the root of propriety. Marriage is especially important because it is politically valuable for establishing and sustaining social order through designated male-female relations. In the Record of Rituals, men and women are asked to observe strict separation in society and uphold the distinction between the outer and inner. (Men being responsible for the family’s “outer” dealings, including legal, economic, and political affairs, and women the “inner” ones, such as familial relations and housework.) Social roles were thereby moralized according to gender. The Record of Rituals also tells us that the rites as a couple begin with gender responsibilities. It states, for example, that when outside the home the husband is supposed to lead the way and that the wife should follow. However, within the home women were supposed to obey men as well, even boys. Before marriage, a girl was expected to listen to her father, and then after marriage to be obedient to her husband, or to their sons if he died. These general guidelines are commonly referred to in other texts as the sancong side or “three obediences and four virtues,” which dominated theories of proper social ordering for most of China’s history.

The four virtues—women’s virtue (fude), women’s speech (fuyan), women’s appearance (furong), and women’s work (fugong)—were expounded on by Ban Zhao (45-120 C.E.) in her book Nüjie (Admonitions for Women). She believed that women should be conservative, humble, and quiet in expressing ritual or filial propriety as their virtue. In the same way, a women’s speech should not be “flowery” or persuasive, but yielding and circumspect. She should also pay close attention to her appearance, be clean and proper, and act especially carefully around guests and in public. Her work consists mainly in household practicalities, such as weaving and food preparation.

The sancong (three obediences) can also be regarded as a forerunner to the san gang, or “three cardinal guides,” of the later Han dynasty (25-220 C.E.). The three cardinal guides were put forward by the aforementioned Dong Zhongshu and contributed greatly to integrating yin and yang gender cosmology into the framework of Confucian ethics. These guides are regulations about relationships—they are defined as the ruler guiding ministers, fathers guiding sons, and husbands guiding wives. Although these rules lack specific content, they do provide a general understanding for ordering society that is concentrated on proper relationships, which is the basic element for morality in many Confucian texts. Here a strong gender bias emerges. The partiality shown toward the elevated position of husbands is only further bolstered by the other two relationships being completely male-based. The only time females are mentioned they are last. Moreover, the ranking of the relationships themselves are hierarchical, relegating women to the lowest level of this order.

Dong also elaborated on distinguishing goodness from evil based on elevating things associated with yang and its general characteristics as ultimately superior to yin, and at the same time emphasized their connections to gender characteristics. This further reinforces deep gender bias. The language of Dong’s Spring and Autumn Annals praises males and presents a negative view of females and all things feminine. The text explicitly argues that even if there are ways in which the husband is inferior to the wife, the former is still yang and therefore better overall. Even more drastically, it states that evilness and all things bad belong to yin, while goodness and all things good are associated with yang, which clearly implicitly links good and evil to male and female, respectively. There are places where, due to the interrelated correlative relationship between yin and yang, the female might be yang and therefore superior in certain aspects, but since she is mostly yin, she is always worse overall. The text even goes so far as to require that relationships between men and women be adjusted to strictly conform to the three cardinal guides. Rules require that subjects obey their rulers, children their fathers, and wives their husbands. In Dong’s other writings, he goes a step further, declaring that the three cardinal guides are a mandate of the heavens. This gives cosmological support to his social arrangement, equating male superiority with the natural ordering of all things.

In the Baihutong (Philosophical Discussions in the White Tiger Hall), which is a collection of court debates from the later Han dynasty, discourse on Dong’s guidelines is taken further. During this time, Confucianism was established as the official state ideology and heavily influenced many areas of politics, including court functioning, policies, and education. This, in turn, provided the foundation for a Confucian society in which this ideology successfully penetrated the daily lives of the state’s entire populace. Dong’s interpretation of ancient texts, including his reading of gender cosmology, became especially powerful as Confucianism believes that the basis for social order and morality begins in human interaction, not individuals. In this context, people are mainly understood according to their roles in society or relationships with others, which were already established as naturally hierarchical in the Analects (the record of Confucius’s actions and words). Dong’s work added a distinct favoring of male over female that became increasingly established and widespread as Confucianism became increasingly influential. Conceived of as analogous to the relationship between rulers and ministers, teachers and students, or parents and children, the two sexes were generally assumed to be a natural ordering of the superior and inferior.

Although these sexist trends are not found in earlier texts—at least not explicitly—they became quite common after the Han dynasty. (The most controversial exception to this is in Analects 17:25, where Confucius is recorded to have equated petty people and women; however, it is unclear exactly what he meant, and whether or not he was referring to women in general or just “petty” ones.) By the Song dynasty (960-1279 C.E.), mainstream political and intellectual discourse viewed both the ability and moral character of women as significantly inferior to males. The Confucian classic known as the Shijing (Book of Poetry) includes the controversial line “Male intellect builds states, female intellect topples states” (Zhou 2002: 489), which in the Song dynasty became understood as an argument for keeping women out of politics and state affairs. On this basis, the Neo-Confucian thinker Zhu Xi  (1130-1200) criticized Wu Zetian, China’s only female emperor, arguing that failure to observe Dong’s three cardinal guides was ultimately responsible for the chaos, violence, and civil wars that had followed the Tang dynasty (618-907 C.E.). Later, during the Ming dynasty (1368-1644 C.E.), the Confucian thinker Zhang Dai (1597-1679 C.E.) developed the idea that males express virtuousness through their ability to debate and contend with one another, while women find virtuousness in lacking this skill. Although he did not expound much on this idea, it was taken to mean that women were both unable and ought not contend with others, including their husband. Their obedience was a display of morality. Similarly, men were expected to dominate their wives in a somewhat disrespectful manner in order to display their own ethical cultivation. In more extreme interpretations, Zhang’s notion was read as “a woman without talent is virtuous.” This was linked to the cosmological understanding of gender roles so that failure to follow these guides meant the betrayal of natural patterns—the traditional foundation for ethical norms. During this time, imperial law stated that any man over forty without a male heir must take on a concubine to aid him in producing one.

The domination of these views in both culture and philosophy caused the Chinese tradition to attach great importance to hierarchical gender roles. Social order based itself on cosmological theories that were automatically normative and constituted guidelines for moral cultivation. Despite the Book of Changes and Laozi’s emphasis on the importance of the interaction between yin and yang as complementary and mutually constitutive, women were generally regarded as inferior.

5. Family Patterns

Ideal political and social order in the state was regarded as a replication of the family model on a larger scale. The way neighbors interacted, friends treated one another, and ministers served rulers were all based on models of familial relationships. Early Confucian texts provided the ideological foundation for this pattern by arguing that morality must be cultivated at home first before it could be adequately practiced in society. In terms of gender, the hierarchical relationships in socio-political spheres were simply extensions of the superiority of husbands in spousal relations. The Record of Rituals explains, “Just as two rulers cannot coexist in one country, a household cannot have two masters; only one can govern” (Zheng 2008: 2353). Dong Zhongshu’s three cardinal guides promoted this attitude by requiring that wives listen to their husbands in the same way that children should listen to fathers and then further placing the spousal relationship below that of father and son. Zhu Xi bolstered this order by arguing that children should respect both parents, but that the father should be absolutely superior to the mother. Zhu recognized that there were aspects of life, mostly household affairs (nei), that women were well suited for, but saw men’s duties as superior, and therefore advocated that males always dominate females.

In line with the mutual relationship of yin and yang emphasized by the Book of Changes and Daoism, marriages were largely understood as being a deferential equivalence. The wedding rites in the Record of Rituals say that marriages are important for maintaining ancestral sacrifice and family lineages. The text describes that when a groom gives a salute, the bride can sit, and that during the ceremony they should eat at the same table and drink from the same bottle to display their mutual affection, trust, and support. This also aligns the woman, who had no official rank of her own, with her husband’s rank. The Record of Rituals further records that during China’s first dynasties, enlightened monarchs respected their wives and children, and that this is in line with natural order or dao. The Xiaojing (Classic of Filial Piety) also says that rulers should never insult even their concubines, let alone their wives. Although only leaders are mentioned, according to Chinese ethical systems people are supposed to emanate their superiors, so this deference would ideally be practiced in every household. However, such roles were largely based on function. For men this meant learning, working, and carrying on the ancestral line. Women were in charge of household affairs and principally responsible for producing a male heir. If they failed in the latter, their martial function was largely unfulfilled, which reflected poorly on the husband, as well. Since the women’s function was largely mechanistic, her status was much lower and she was essentially anonymous, without independent social standing. Men could take on concubines to produce heirs or simply for pleasure, and while wives were “in charge” of concubines, they could also be (albeit rarely) replaced by them, and would have to serve the sons of concubines if they produced none of their own. Legally, men owned their wives, and there was often little practical recourse for a woman against her husband, even though the laws of certain periods allowed for it.

The Book of Poetry contains a large number of poems and songs describing marriage and love between men and women, some of which express the joys and sorrows of women. The collection includes lamentations of men going off on business or to war, and women’s complaints of being abandoned by their husbands after concubines are purchased. They are meant to remind husbands of social expectations and moral responsibilities. The Lienüzhuan (Biographies of Virtuous Women) and Xunzi both argue that the husband-wife relation is foundational for the family, and therefore for a stable society, as well. (The Zhongyong, or Doctrine of the Mean, adds that the sage’s virtue is found most simply in husband-wife relations.) Liu Xiang (77 B.C.E.-6 C.E.), the complier of the Lienüzhuan, firmly believed that morality starts in the family and reverberates out into society. He grouped virtuous women into six categories, or virtues: maternal rectitude (muyi), sage-like intelligence (xianming), humane wisdom (renzhi), purity and deference (zhenshun), chastity and dutifulness (jieyi), and skill in arguments and communication (biantong). Later editions of this text became less gender specific, but Liu emphasized women who were able to carry out certain female-related duties in role-specific conditions (including those of daughter, wife, daughter-in-law, and mother). Although Liu did not mention it, later texts argued that widows should not remarry or take on lovers. The Neo-Confucian thinker Cheng Yi  (1033-1107) was one of the harshest interpreters of widow fidelity, claiming that they should rather starve to death than take on a second husband. Zhu Xi, who disagreed with Cheng on many issues, argued that this was not practical; yet it was generally regarded as virtuous, even if not widely practiced. Cheng’s proposal was also important because he did not restrict such devotion to women, which created a rare sense of equality (of which Zhu also disapproved).

Analogous to yin and yang, the relationship of the wife and “inner” with the husband and “outer” is conceived of as complementary, not dualistic. According to the functional distinction of “inner” and “outer,” women were responsible for everything in the house, while men dominated external affairs. The most basic form of this division was given as “Men plow and women weave” (nan geng nü zhi). However, this distinction is not equivalent to the Western concepts of private and public. In fact, during the Wei-Jin period of national disunity (265-420 C.E.), it was common for women in northern Chinese states to handle family legal matters at court, go out to present gifts, and handle certain business matters. The woman’s role was not always marginalized, but it was focused on specific tasks. Chinese families often believed that educating their daughters well (though not necessarily in literary learning) was the precondition for improving the family and encouraging orderliness. Women were also often the primary caretakers and to some extent educators of all children, male or female—an invaluable role for the entire household. A couple’s shared goals, like obtaining wealth or educating children, were designated into separate spheres that either the wife or husband would control. The third-century B.C.E. philosophical miscellany known as Lüshi Chunqiu (Mr. Lü’s Spring and Autumn Annals) declares that husbands should have clothes to wear without weaving and wives have food to eat without farming because of their division of labor, which allows for a more efficacious family and society. Individual differences should be acknowledged so that the couple can support and assist one another.

6. Chinese Cultural Resources for Feminism

Taking yin and yang as an analogy for female and male, classical Chinese thought presents a complex picture of their interaction. Firstly, with thinkers such as Dong Zhongshu, the split between the two genders can be seen as relatively fixed. On this basis regulations on gender roles are equally stabilized, so that they are considered complementary, but not equal. The second major trend, seen most explicitly in the Laozi, values the inseparability of yin and yang, which is equated with the female and male. This interpretation explores the productive and efficacious nature of yin, or feminine powers. While not necessarily feminist, this latter view provides a robust resource for exploring feminism in Chinese thought. These two orientations were developed along the lines of their respective representatives in Chinese traditions.

Like the relationship between yin and yang, a complementary relationship can be seen between these two views on gender. Thinkers such as Confucius, Mengzi, Xunzi, Dong Zhongshu, and Zhu Xi are often taken to represent Confucianism, which belongs to the first viewpoint. The Laozi and Zhuangzi have then been seen as opposed to these thinkers, and are representative of Daoism. However, the actual relationship between these two “schools” is much more integrated. For example, Wang Bi wrote what is generally regarded as the standard commentary on the Laozi, and yet he considered Confucius to be a higher sage than Laozi. Similarly, actual Chinese social practices cannot be traced back to either Daoism or Confucianism exclusively, though one or the other may be more emphasized in particular cases. Taken as separate, they each highlight different aspects that, when integrated with one another, represent a whole. Although they are sometimes read as opposing views, both are equally indispensable for comprehending Chinese culture and history.

Despite the possibility of reading feminism into many Chinese texts, there can be no doubt that the Chinese tradition, as practiced, was largely sexist. For the most part, the inferior position of women was based on readings (whether or not they were misinterpretations) of texts generally classified as Confucian, such as the Record of Rituals, Book of Poetry, or Analects. On the other hand, other texts regarded as Confucian—such as the Book of Changes or Classic of Filial Piety—harbor rich resources for feminism in China. So while sexist practices are and were frequently defended on the basis of Confucian texts, this is limited to particular passages, and does not speak to the complexity of either Confucianism or Chinese traditions in general.

As a response to dominant practices, the Laozi—regardless of whether it was formed earlier or later than other major texts, such as the Analects—favors notions that counter (but do not necessarily oppose) early social values. While the Record of Rituals and Book of Poetry contain or promote hierarchical interpretations of gender issues, the Laozi clearly promotes nominally feminine characteristics and values. (This puts the Laozi in conflict with some branches of feminism that seek to destroy notions of “female” or gender-oriented traits and tendencies.) While this does not necessarily equate the Laozi with what is now called “feminism,” it does provide Chinese culture with a potential resource for reviving or creating conceptions of  femininity in a more positive light.

The major philosophical concept in the Laozi is dao (way). The first chapter of the text claims that the unchanging dao cannot be spoken of, but it does offer clues in the form of a variety of images that appear throughout its eighty-one chapters. Several of the descriptions associate dao with the feminine, maternal, or female “gate.” In this context, dao is given three important connotations. It is responsible for the origin of all things, it is all things, and it provides the patterns that they should follow. The comparison to a woman’s body and its function of generation (sheng) identify dao as feminine, and therefore speak to the power of the female. The Laozi can therefore be read as advocating that female powers and positions are superior to their male counterparts. In modern scholarship, this is frequently noted, and several scholars have attempted to use the Laozi to support Chinese and comparative feminist studies. Images in the text strongly support these investigations.

For example, the text speaks of the gushen, the “spirit of the valley,” which is said to “never die” and is called xuanpin, or “mysterious femininity” (ch. 6). The character for “spirit,” gu, originally meant “generation.” It is identified with sheng (part of the character for gender and tendencies), and its shape is sometimes taken to represent the female genitals. In other places, dao is referred to as the mother and said to have given birth to all things (ch. 52). Contemporary scholars also point out that there are no “male” images or traditionally male traits linked to dao in the Laozi. Dao’s characteristics, such as being “low,” “soft,” and “weak,” are all associated with yin and femininity, thereby forging a strong link between dao and the female.

Yin tendencies are not, however, exclusively valued. The Laozi offers a more balanced view, which is why it can be used as a resource of feminism, but is not necessarily feminist itself. For example, it says that all things come from dao and that they carry the yin and embrace the yang, and that their blending is what produces harmony in the world (ch. 42). Yin is arguably more basic, but is prized for its ability to overcome yang, just as the soft can overcome the hard and stillness can defeat movement. These notions are applied to many aspects of life, including sexual, political, and military examples. These examples revere female traits, arguing that yin should be acknowledged for its numerous strengths, but do not reject the importance of yang.

Taken as a political text, the Laozi argues that the ruler should take on more female than male traits in order to properly govern the world. This is supposed to allow him to remain “still” while others are in motion, ideally self-ordering. Although this confirms the usefulness of female virtue, it is not an argument for it being superior, or even equal to male counterparts. Rather, it demonstrates how female characteristics can be used to promote efficacy.

Given that sexist practices have largely be defended by reference to texts and scholars that self-identify with the Confucian tradition, it is easy to see why contemporary scholars have looked to the Laozi as one of the major sources for constructing Chinese feminism. It is certainly the first major Chinese philosophical text that explicitly promotes a variety of female traits and values, which allows room for feminist consciousness and discourse.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger T., and David L. Hall. Thinking from the Han: Self, Truth, and Transcendence in Chinese and Western Culture. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1998.
    • (This book includes a chapter on gender roles that outlines how the Confucian tradition can be used to establish a foundation for Chinese gender equality.)
  • Ames, Roger T., and Henry Rosemont Jr., trans. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. New York, NY: Ballantine Books, 1998.
    • (An excellent translation of the Confucian Analects.)
  • Bossler, Beverly. Courtesans, Concubines and the Cult of Female Fidelity: Gender and Social Change in China, 1000–1400. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012.
    • (A superb study of how female roles and virtues shaped Chinese family life, politics,and academics.)
  • Chen, Jiaqi. “Critique of Zhang Xianglong.” Zhejiang Academic Journal 4 (2003): 127–130.
    • (This article points out inequalities of gender rules in Chinese philosophy and social systems.)
  • Moeller, Hans-Georg, trans. Daodejing: A Complete Translation and Commentary. Chicago, IL: Open Court, 2007.
    • (Moeller’s commentary is sensitive to feminist interpretations of the Daodejing or Laozi.)
  • Rosenlee, Li-Hsiang. Confucianism and Women. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2006.
    • (A book-length study of gender roles in the Confucian tradition.)
  • Van Norden, Bryan, trans. Mengzi, with Selections from Traditional Commentaries. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2008.
    • (A masterful translation of the Mengzi with commentaries from traditional Chinese scholars.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Yinyang: The Way of Heaven and Earth in Chinese Thought and Culture. NY: Cambridge University Press, 2012.
    • (The best study of Chinese yinyang theory in English. The text also includes discussions of gender issues.)
  • Wang, Robin R. Images of Women in Chinese Thought and Culture: Writings from the Pre-Qin Period through the Song Dynasty. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2003.
    • (An excellent resource for gender issues in Chinese thought.)


Author Information

Lijuan Shen
Xi’an University of Architecture and Technology


Paul D’Ambrosio
East China Normal University