German idealism is the name of a movement in German philosophy that began in the 1780s and lasted until the 1840s. The most famous representatives of this movement are Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel. While there are important differences between these figures, they all share a commitment to idealism. Kant’s transcendental idealism was a modest philosophical doctrine about the difference between appearances and things in themselves, which claimed that the objects of human cognition are appearances and not things in themselves. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel radicalized this view, transforming Kant’s transcendental idealism into absolute idealism, which holds that things in themselves are a contradiction in terms, because a thing must be an object of our consciousness if it is to be an object at all.
German idealism is remarkable for its systematic treatment of all the major parts of philosophy, including logic, metaphysics and epistemology, moral and political philosophy, and aesthetics. All of the representatives of German idealism thought these parts of philosophy would find a place in a general system of philosophy. Kant thought this system could be derived from a small set of interdependent principles. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel were, again, more radical. Inspired by Karl Leonhard Reinhold, they attempted to derive all the different parts of philosophy from a single, first principle. This first principle came to be known as the absolute, because the absolute, or unconditional, must precede all the principles which are conditioned by the difference between one principle and another.
Although German idealism is closely related to developments in the intellectual history of Germany in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, such as classicism and romanticism, it is also closely related to larger developments in the history of modern philosophy. Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel sought to overcome the division between rationalism and empiricism that had emerged during the early modern period. The way they characterized these tendencies has exerted a lasting influence on the historiography of modern philosophy. Although German idealism itself has been subject to periods of neglect in the last two hundred years, renewed interest in the contributions of the German idealism have made it an important resource for contemporary philosophy.
German idealism can be traced back to the “critical” or “transcendental” idealism of Immanuel Kant (1724-1804). Kant’s idealism first came to prominence during the pantheism controversy in 1785-1786. When the controversy arose, Kant had already published the first (A) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason (1781) and the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783). Both works had their admirers, but they received unsympathetic and generally uncomprehending reviews, conflating Kant’s “transcendental” idealism with Berkeley’s “dogmatic” idealism (Allison and Heath 2002, 160-166). Thus, Kant was taken to hold that space and time are “not actual” and that the understanding “makes” the objects of our cognition (Sassen 2000, 53-54).
Kant insisted that this reading misrepresented his position. While the dogmatic idealist denies the reality of space and time, Kant takes space and time to be forms of intuition. Forms of intuition are, for Kant, the subjective conditions of the possibility of all of our sense perception. It is only because space and time are a priori forms that determine the content of our sensations that Kant thinks we can perceive anything at all. According to Kant, “critical” or “transcendental” idealism serves merely to identify those a priori conditions, like space and time, that make experience possible. It certainly does not imply that space and time are unreal or that the understanding produces the objects of our cognition by itself.
Kant hoped to enlist the support of famous German philosophers like Moses Mendelssohn (1729-1786), Johan Nicolai Tetens (1738-1807), and Christian Garve (1742-1798) in order to refute the “dogmatic” idealist interpretation of his philosophy and win a more favorable hearing for his work. Unfortunately, the endorsements Kant hoped for never arrived. Mendelssohn, in particular, was preoccupied with concerns about his health and the dispute that had arisen between himself and Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743-1819) about the alleged Spinozism of his friend Gotthold Ephraim Lessing (1729-1781). This dispute came to be known as the pantheism controversy, because of Spinoza’s famous equivocation between God and nature.
During the controversy, Jacobi charged that any attempt to demonstrate philosophical truths was fatally flawed. Jacobi pointed to Spinoza as the chief representative of the tendency toward demonstrative reason in philosophy, but he also drew parallels between Spinozism and Kant’s transcendental idealism throughout On the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785). In 1787, the same year Kant published the second (B) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, Jacobi published David Hume on Faith or Realism and Idealism, which included a supplement On Transcendental Idealism. Jacobi concluded that transcendental idealism, like Spinozism, subordinates the immediate certainty, or faith, through which we know the world, to demonstrative reason, transforming reality into an illusion. Jacobi later called this “nihilism.”
Kant’s views were defended by Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757-1823) during the pantheism controversy. Reinhold thought Kant’s philosophy could refute skepticism and nihilism and provide a defense of morality and religion which was not to be found in the rationalism of the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy. The publication of Reinhold’s Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, first in Der Teutsche Merkur in 1786-1787 and then again in an enlarged version in 1790-1792, helped make Kant’s philosophy one of the most influential, and most controversial, philosophies of the period. Jacobi remained a thorn in the side of the Kantians and the young German idealists, but he was unable to staunch interest in philosophy in general or idealism in particular.
In 1787, Reinhold assumed a position at the university in Jena, where he taught Kant’s philosophy and began developing his own ideas. While Reinhold’s thought continued to be influenced by Kant, he also came to believe that Kant had failed to provide philosophy with a solid foundation. According to Reinhold, Kant was a philosophical genius, but he did not have the “genius of system” that would allow him to properly order his discoveries. Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie (Elementary Philosophy/Philosophy of Elements), laid out in his Essay Towards a New Theory of the Faculty of Representation (1789), Contribution to the Correction of the Previous Misunderstandings of the Philosophers (1790), and On the Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge (1791), was intended to address this shortcoming and show that Kant’s philosophy could be derived from a single foundational principle. Reinhold called this principle “the principle of consciousness” and states that “in consciousness, representation is distinguished by the subject from subject and object and is referred to both.” With this principle, Reinhold thought he could explain what is fundamental to all cognition, namely, that 1) cognition is essentially the conscious representation of an object by a subject and 2) that representations refer to both the subject and object of cognition.
When Reinhold left Jena for a new position in Kiel in 1794, his chair was given to Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), who quickly radicalized Kant’s idealism and Reinhold’s attempts to systematize philosophy. In response to a skeptical challenge to Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie, raised anonymously by Gottlob Ernst Schulze (1761-1833) in his work Aenesidemus (1792), Fichte asserted that the principle of representation was not, as Reinhold had maintained, a fact (Tatsache) of consciousness, but rather an act (Tathandlung) whereby consciousness produces the distinction between subject and object by positing the distinction between the I and not-I (Breazeale, 1988, 64). This insight became the foundation of Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre (Doctrine of Science/Doctrine of Scientific Knowledge) which was first published in 1794. It was soon followed by Fichte’s Foundations of Natural Right (1797) and the System of Ethics (1798). In later years, Fichte presented a number of substantially different versions of the Wissenschaftslehre in lectures in Berlin.
When, as a result of a controversy concerning his religious views, Fichte left Jena in 1799, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854) became the most important idealist in Jena. Schelling had arrived in Jena in 1798, when he was only 23 years old, but he was already an enthusiastic proponent of Fichte’s philosophy, which he defended in early works like On the I as Principle of Philosophy (1795). Schelling had also established close relationships with the Jena romantics, who, despite their great interest in Kant, Reinhold, and Fichte, maintained a more skeptical attitude towards philosophy than the German idealists. Although Schelling did not share the romantics’ reservations about idealism, the proximity between Schelling and the romantics is evident in Schelling’s writings on the philosophy of nature and the philosophy of art, which he presented in his Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature (1797), System of Transcendental Idealism (1800), and Philosophy of Art (1802-1803).
Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770-1831) had been Schelling’s classmate in Tübingen from 1790-1793. Along with the poet Friedrich Hölderlin (1770-1843), the two had collaborated on The Oldest Program for a System of German Idealism (1796). After following Schelling to Jena in 1801, Hegel published his first independent contributions to German idealism, The Difference Between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy (1801), in which he distinguishes Fichte’s “subjective” idealism from Schelling’s “objective” or “absolute” idealism. Hegel’s work documented the growing rift between Fichte and Schelling. This rift was to expand following Hegel’s falling-out with Schelling in 1807, when Hegel published his monumental Phenomenology of Spirit (1807). Although Hegel only published three more books during his lifetime, Science of Logic (1812-1816), Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (1817-1830), and Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821), he remains the most widely-read and most influential of the German idealists.
The German idealists have acquired a reputation for obscurity, because of the length and complexity of many of their works. As a consequence, they are often considered to be obscurantists and irrationalists. The German idealists were, however, neither obscurantists nor irrationalists. Their contributions to logic are earnest attempts to formulate a modern logic that is consistent with the idealism of their metaphysics and epistemology.
Kant was the first of the German idealists to make important contributions to logic. In the Preface to the second (B) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant argues that logic has nothing to do with metaphysics, psychology, or anthropology, because logic is “the science that exhaustively presents and strictly proves nothing but the formal rules of all thinking” (Guyer and Wood 1998, 106-107/Bviii-Bix). Kant came to refer to this purely formal logic as “general” logic, which is to be contrasted with the “Transcendental Logic” that he develops in the second part of the “Transcendental Doctrine of Elements” in the Critique of Pure Reason. Transcendental logic differs from general logic because, like the principles of a priori sensibility that Kant presents in the “Transcendental Aesthetic” of the Critique of Pure Reason, transcendental logic is part of metaphysics. Transcendental logic also differs from general logic because it does not abstract from the content of cognition. Transcendental logic contains the laws of pure thinking as they pertain to the cognition of objects. This does not mean that transcendental logic is concerned with empirical objects as such, but rather with the a priori conditions of the possibility of the cognition of objects. Kant’s famous “Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding” is meant to demonstrate that the concepts the transcendental logic presents as the a priori conditions of the possibility of the cognition of objects do, in fact, make the cognition of objects possible and are necessary conditions for any and all cognition of objects.
In The Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge, Reinhold objects that Kant’s transcendental logic presupposed general logic, because transcendental logic is a “particular” logic from which general logic, or “logic proper, without surnames,” cannot be derived. Reinhold insisted that the laws of general logic had to be derived from the principle of consciousness if philosophy was to become systematic and scientific, but the possibility of this derivation was contested by Schulze in Aenesidemus. Schulze’s critique of Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie focuses on the priority Reinhold attributes to the principle of consciousness. Because the principle of consciousness has to be consistent with basic logical principles like the principle of non-contradiction and the principle of the excluded middle, Schulze concluded that it could not be regarded as a first principle. The laws of general logic were, it seemed, prior to the principle of consciousness, so that even the Elementarphilosophie presupposed general logic.
Fichte accepted many aspects of Schulze’s critique of Reinhold, but, like Reinhold, he thought it was crucial to demonstrate that the laws of logic could be derived from “real philosophy” or “metaphysics.” In his Personal Meditations on the Elementarphilosophie (1792-1793), his essay Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre (1794), and then again in the Wissenschaftslehre of 1794, Fichte argued that the act that posits the distinction between the I and not-I determines consciousness in a way that makes logical analysis possible. Logical analysis is always undertaken reflectively, according to Fichte, because it presupposes that consciousness has already been determined in some way. So, while Kant maintains that transcendental logic presupposes general logic, Reinhold attempts to derive the laws of general logic from the principle of consciousness, and Schulze shows Reinhold to presuppose the same principles, Fichte forcefully asserts that logic presupposes the determination of thought “as a fact of consciousness,” which itself depends upon the act through which consciousness is originally determined.
Hegel’s contributions to logic have been far more influential than those of Reinhold or Fichte. His Science of Logic (also known as the “Greater Logic”) and the Logic that constitutes the first part of the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (also known as the “Lesser Logic”) are not contributions to earlier debates about the priority of general logic. Nor do they accept that what Kant called “general” logic and Reinhold called “logic proper, without surnames” is purely formal logic. Because Hegel was convinced that truth is both formal and material, and not one or the other, he sought to establish the dialectical unity of the formal and the material in his works on logic. The meaning of the word “dialectical” is, of course, much debated, as is the specific mechanism through which the dialectic produces and resolves the contradictions that move thought from one form of consciousness to another. For Hegel, however, this process accounts for the genesis of the categories and concepts through which all cognition is determined. Logic reveals the unity of that process.
German idealism’s contributions to logic were largely dismissed following the rise of empiricism and positivism in the nineteenth century, as well as the revolutions in logic that took place at the beginning of the twentieth century. Today, however, there is a renewed interest in this part of the idealist tradition, as is evident in the attention which has been paid to Kant’s lectures on logic and the new editions and translations of Hegel’s writings and lectures on logic.
German idealism is a form of idealism. The idealism espoused by the German idealists is, however, different from other kinds of idealism with which contemporary philosophers may be more familiar. While earlier idealists maintained that reality is ultimately intellectual rather than material (Plato) or that the existence of objects is mind-dependent (Berkeley), the German idealists reject the distinctions these views presuppose. In addition to the distinction between the material and the formal and the distinction between the real and the ideal, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel also reject the distinction between being and thinking, further complicating the German idealists’ views on metaphysics and epistemology.
Kant’s idealism is, perhaps, the most moderate form of idealism associated with German idealism. Kant holds that the objects of human cognition are transcendentally ideal and empirically real. They are transcendentally ideal, because the conditions of the cognition human beings have of objects are to be found in the cognitive faculties of human beings. This does not mean the existence of those objects is mind-dependent, because Kant thinks we can only know objects to the extent that they are objects for us and, thus, as they appear to us. Idealism with respect to appearances does not entail the mind-dependence of objects, because it does not commit itself to any claims about the nature of things in themselves. Kant denies that we have any knowledge of things in themselves, because we do not have the capacity to make judgments about the nature of things in themselves based on our knowledge of things as they appear.
Despite our ignorance of things in themselves, Kant thought we could have objectively valid cognition of empirically real objects. Kant recognized that we are affected by things outside ourselves and that this affection produces sensations. These sensations are, for Kant, the “matter” of sensible intuition. Along with the pure “forms” of intuition, space and time, sensations constitute the “matter” of judgment. The pure concepts of the understanding are the “forms” of judgment, which Kant demonstrates to be the conditions of the possibility of objectively valid cognition in the “Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding” in the Critique of Pure Reason. The synthesis of matter and form in judgment therefore produces objectively valid cognition of empirically real objects
To say that the idealism of Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel is more radical than Kant’s idealism is to understate the difference between Kant and the philosophers he inspired. Kant proposed a “modest” idealism, which attempted to prove that our knowledge of appearances is objectively valid. Fichte, however, maintains the very idea of a thing in itself, a thing which is not an object for us and which exists independently of our consciousness, is a contradiction in terms. There can be no thing in itself, Fichte claims, because a thing is only a thing when it is something for us. Even the thing in itself is, in fact, a product of our own conscious thought, meaning the thing in itself is nothing other a postulation of our own consciousness. Thus, it is not a thing in itself, but just another object for us. From this line of reasoning, Fichte concludes that “everything which occurs in our mind can be completely explained and comprehended on the basis of the mind itself” (Breazeale 1988, 69). This is a much more radical form of idealism than Kant maintained. For Fichte holds that consciousness is a circle in which the I posits itself and determines what belongs to the I and what belongs to the not-I. This circularity is necessary and unavoidable, Fichte maintains, but philosophy is a reflective activity in which the spontaneous positing activity of the I and the determinations of the I and not-I are comprehended.
Schelling defended Fichte’s idealism in On the I as Principle of Philosophy, where he maintained that the I is the unconditioned condition of both being and thinking. Because the existence of the I precedes all thinking (I must exist in order to think) and because thinking determines all being (A thing is nothing other than an object of thought), Schelling argued, the absolute I, not Reinhold’s principle of consciousness, must be the fundamental principle of all philosophy. In subsequent works like the System of Transcendental Idealism, however, Schelling pursued a different course, arguing that the essential and primordial unity of being and thinking can be understood from two different directions, beginning either with nature or spirit. It could be deduced from the absolute I as Fichte had done, but it could also arise from the unconscious but dynamic powers of nature. By showing how these two different approaches complemented one another, Schelling thought he had shown how the distinction between being and thinking, nature and spirit, could be overcome.
Fichte was not pleased with the innovations of Schelling’s idealism, because he initially thought of Schelling as a disciple and a defender of his own position. Fichte did not initially respond to Schelling’s works, but, in an exchange that began in 1800, he began to argue that Schelling had confused the real and the ideal, making the I, the ideal, dependent upon nature, the real. Fichte thought this violated the principles of transcendental idealism and his own Wissenschaftslehre, leading him to suspect that Schelling was no longer the disciple he took him to be. Intervening on Schelling’s behalf as the dispute became more heated, Hegel argued that Fichte’s idealism was “subjective” idealism, while Schelling’s idealism was “objective” idealism. This means that Fichte considers the I to be the absolute and denies the identity of the I and the not-I. He privileges the subject at the expense of the identity of subject and object. Schelling, however, attempts to establish the identity of the subject and object by establishing the objectivity of the subject, the I, as well as the subjectivity of the object, nature. The idealism Schelling and Hegel defend recognizes the identity of subject and object as the “absolute,” unconditioned first principle of philosophy. For that reason, it is often called the philosophy of identity.
It is clear that by the time he published the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel was no longer interested in defending Schelling’s system. In the Phenomenology, Hegel famously calls Schelling’s understanding of the identity of subject and object “the night in which all cows are black,” meaning that Schelling’s conception of the identity of subject and object erases the many and varied distinctions which determine the different forms of consciousness. These distinctions are crucial for Hegel, who came to believe that the absolute can only be realized by passing through the different forms of consciousness which are comprehended in the self-consciousness of absolute knowledge or spirit (Geist).
Contemporary scholars like Robert Pippin and Robert Stern have debated whether Hegel’s position is to be regarded as a metaphysical or merely epistemological form of idealism, because it is not entirely clear whether Hegel regarded the distinctions that constitute the different forms of consciousness as merely the conditions necessary for understanding objects (Pippin) or whether they express fundamental commitments about the way things are (Stern). However, it is almost certainly true that Hegel’s idealism is both epistemological and metaphysical. Like Fichte and Schelling, Hegel sought to overcome the limits Kant’s transcendental idealism had placed on philosophy, in order to complete the idealist revolution he had begun. The German idealists agreed that this could only be done by tracing all the different parts of philosophy back to a single principle, whether that principle is the I (in Fichte and the early Schelling) or the absolute (in Hegel).
The moral and political philosophy of the German idealists is perhaps the most influential part of their legacy, but it is also one of the most controversial. Many appreciate the emphasis Kant placed on freedom and autonomy in both morality and politics; yet they reject Kant’s moral and political philosophy for its formalism. Fichte’s moral and political philosophy has only recently been studied in detail, but his popular and polemical writings have led some to see him as an extreme nationalist and, perhaps, a precursor to fascism. Hegel is, by some accounts, an apologist for the totalitarian “absolute state.” In what follows, a more even-handed assessment of their views and their merits is developed.
Kantian moral philosophy has been an important part of moral theory since the nineteenth century. Today, it is commonly associated with deontological moral theories, which emphasize duty and obligation, as well as constructivism, which is concerned with the procedures through which moral norms are constructed. Supporters of both approaches frequently refer to the categorical imperative and the different formulations of that imperative which are to be found in Kant’s Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) and the Critique of Practical Reason (1788). They often take the categorical imperative, or one of its formulations, as a general definition of the right or the good.
The categorical imperative served a slightly different purpose for Kant. In the Groundwork, Kant uses the categorical imperative to define the form of the good will. Kant thought moral philosophy was primarily concerned with the determination of the will. The categorical imperative shows that, in order to be good, the will must be determined according to a rule that is both universal and necessary. Any violation of this rule would result in a contradiction and, therefore, moral impossibility. The categorical imperative provides Kant with a valid procedure and a universal and necessary determination of what is morally obligatory.
Yet in order to determine the will, Kant thought human beings had to be free. Because freedom cannot be proven in theoretical philosophy, however, Kant says that reason forces us to recognize the concept of freedom as a “fact” of pure practical reason. Kant thinks freedom is necessary for any practical philosophy, because the moral worth and merit of human beings depends on the way they determine their own wills. Without freedom, they would not be able to determine their own wills to the good and we could not hold them responsible for their actions. Thus freedom and autonomy are absolutely crucial for Kant’s understanding of moral philosophy. The political significance of autonomy becomes apparent in some of Kant’s late essays, where he supports a republican politics of freedom, equality, and the rule of law.
Kant’s moral philosophy affected Fichte profoundly, especially the Critique of Practical Reason. “I have been living in a new world ever since reading the Critique of Practical Reason,” Fichte reports, “propositions which I thought could never be overturned have been overturned for me. Things have been proven to me which I thought could never be proven, e.g., the concept of absolute freedom, the concept of duty, etc., and I feel all the happier for it” (Breazeale 1988, 357). His passion for Kant’s moral philosophy can be seen in the Aenesidemus review, where Fichte defends the “primacy” of practical reason over theoretical reason, which he takes to be the foundation of Kant’s “moral theology.”
Despite his admiration for Kant’s moral philosophy, Fichte thought he could go beyond Kant’s formalism. In his essay Concerning the Concept of Wissenschaftslehre, Fichte describes the second, practical part of his plan for Wissenschaftslehre, in which “new and thoroughly elaborated theories of the pleasant, the beautiful, the sublime, the free obedience of nature to its own laws, God, so-called common sense or the natural sense of truth” are laid out, but which also contains “new theories of natural law and morality, the principles of which are material as well as formal” (Breazeale 1988, 135). Unlike Kant, in other words, Fichte would not simply determine the form of the good will, but the ways in which moral and political principles are applied in action.
Fichte’s interest in the material principles of moral and political philosophy can be seen in his Foundations of Natural Right and System of Ethics. In both works, Fichte emphasizes the applicability of moral and political principles to action. But he also emphasizes the social context in which these principles are applied. While the I posits itself as well as the not-I, Fichte thinks the I must posit itself as an individual among other individuals, if it is to posit itself “as a rational being with self-consciousness.” The presence of others checks the freedom of the I, because the principles of morality and natural right both require that individual freedom cannot interfere with the freedom of other individuals. Thus the freedom of the I and the relations between individuals and members of the community are governed by the principles of morality and right, which may be applied to all their actions and interactions.
Hegel was also concerned about the formalism of Kant’s moral philosophy, but Hegel approached the problem in a slightly different way than Fichte. In the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel describes the breakdown of the “ethical life” (Sittlichkeit) of the community. Hegel understands ethical life as the original unity of social life. While he thinks the unity of ethical life precedes any understanding of the community as a free association of individuals, Hegel also thinks the unity of ethical life is destined to break down. As members of the community become conscious of themselves as individuals, through the conflicts that arise between family and city and between religious law and civil law, ethical life becomes more and more fragmented and the ties that bind the community become less and less immediate. This process is illustrated, in the Phenomenology, by Hegel’s famous – if elliptical – retelling of Sophocles’ Antigone.
Hegel provides a different account of ethical life in the Foundations of the Philosophy of Right. In this work, he contrasts ethical life with morality and abstract right. Abstract right is the name Hegel gives to the idea that individuals are the sole bearers of right. The problem with this view is that it abstracts right from the social and political context in which individuals exercise their rights and realize their freedom. Morality differs abstract right, because morality recognizes the good as something universal rather than particular. Morality recognizes the “common good” of the community as something that transcends the individual; yet it defines the good through a purely formal system of obligations, which is, in the end, no less abstract than abstract right. Ethical life is not presented as the original unity of the habits and customs of the community, but, rather, as a dynamic system in which individuals, families, civil society, and the state come together to promote the realization of human freedom.
Traditional accounts of Hegel’s social and political philosophy have seen Hegel’s account of ethical life as an apology for the Prussian state. This is understandable, given the role the state plays in the final section of the Philosophy of Right on “World History.” Here Hegel says “self-consciousness finds in an organic development the actuality of its substantive knowing and willing” in the Germanic state (Wood 1991, 379-380). To see the state as the culmination of world history and the ultimate realization of human freedom is, however, to overlook several important factors, including Hegel’s personal commitments to political reform and personal freedom. These commitments are reflected in Hegel’s defense of freedom in the Philosophy of Right, as well as the role he thought the family and especially civil society played in ethical life.
The German idealists’ interest in aesthetics distinguishes them from other modern systematic philosophers (Descartes, Leibniz, Wolff ) for whom aesthetics was a matter of secondary concern at best. And while there was, to be sure, considerable disagreement about the relationship between art, aesthetics, and philosophy among the German idealists, the terms of their disagreement continue to be debated in philosophy and the arts.
For most of his career, Kant regarded aesthetics as an empirical critique of taste. In lectures and notes from the 1770s, several of which were later incorporated into Kant’s Logic (1800), Kant denies that aesthetics can be a science. Kant changed his mind in 1787, when he told Reinhold he had discovered the a priori principles of the faculty of feeling pleasure and displeasure. Kant laid out these principles in the first part of the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), where he characterizes aesthetic judgment as a “reflective” judgment, based on “the consciousness of the merely formal purposiveness in the play of the cognitive powers of the subject with regard to the animation of its cognitive powers” (Guyer and Matthews 2000, 106-107). According to Kant, it is the free yet harmonious play of our cognitive faculties in aesthetic judgment that is the source of the feeling of pleasure that we associate with beauty.
Reinhold and Fichte had little to say about art and beauty, despite the Fichte’s promise to deal with the subject in the second, practical part of his Wissenschaftslehre. Aesthetics was, however, of critical importance for Schelling, Hegel, and Hölderlin. In the Oldest Program for a System of German Idealism, they write that beauty is “the idea that unites everything” and “the highest act of reason” (Bernstein 2003, 186). Thus they insist that the “philosophy of spirit” must also be an “aesthetic” philosophy, uniting the sensible and the intellectual as well as the real and the ideal.
It was Schelling, rather than Hegel or Hölderlin, who did the most to formulate this “aesthetic” philosophy in the years following his move to Jena. In the System of Transcendental Idealism and Philosophy of Art, Schelling argues that the absolute is both revealed by and embodied in works of art. Art is, for Schelling, “the only true and eternal organ and document of philosophy” (Heath 1978, 231). Art is of “paramount” importance to the philosopher, because it opens up “the holy of holies, where burns in eternal and original unity, as if in a single flame, that which is rent asunder in nature and history and that which, in life and action, no less than in thought, must forever fly apart” (Heath 1978, 231).
Hegel would later contest Schelling’s characterization of the artwork and its relation to philosophy in his Lectures on Fine Arts. According to Hegel, art is not the revelation and embodiment of philosophy, but an alienated form of self-consciousness. The greatest expression of spirit is not to be found in the work of art, as Schelling suggested, but in the “idea.” Beauty, which Hegel calls “the sensuous appearance of the idea,” is not an adequate expression of the absolute, precisely because it is a sensuous appearance. Nevertheless, Hegel acknowledges that the alienated and sensuous appearance of the idea can play an important role in the dialectical process through which we become conscious of the absolute in philosophy. He distinguishes three kinds of art, symbolic art, classical art, and romantic art, corresponding to three different stages in the development of our consciousness of the absolute, which express different aspects of the idea in different ways.
Hegel argues that the kind of art that corresponds to the first stage in the development of our understanding of spirit, symbolic art, fails to adequately represent the idea, but points to the idea as something beyond itself. This “beyond” cannot be captured by images, plastic forms, or words and therefore remains abstract for symbolic art. However, the art corresponding to the second stage in the development of our understanding of spirit, classical art, strives to reconcile the abstract and the concrete in an individual work. It aims to present a perfect, sensible expression of the idea and, for that reason, represents the “ideal” of beauty for Hegel. Yet the problem remains, inasmuch as the idea which is expressed by classical art is not, in itself, sensible. The sensible presentation of the idea remains external to the idea itself. Romantic art calls attention to this fact by emphasizing the sensuousness and individuality of the work. Unlike symbolic art, however, romantic art supposes that the idea can be discovered within and through the work of art. In effect, the work of art tries to reveal the truth of the idea in itself. Yet when the idea is grasped concretely, in itself, rather than through the work of art, we have achieved a philosophical understanding of the absolute, which does not require the supplement of sensible appearance. For this reason, Hegel speculated that the emergence of philosophical self-consciousness signaled the end of art. “The form of art,” he says, “has ceased to be the supreme need of spirit” (Knox 1964, 10).
Hegel’s thesis concerning the “end” of art has been widely debated and raises many important questions. What, for example, are we to make of developments in the arts that occurred “after” the end of art? What purpose might art continue to serve, if we have already achieved philosophical self-consciousness? And, perhaps most importantly, has philosophy really achieved absolute knowledge, which would render any “sensuous appearance” of the idea obsolete? These are important questions, but they are difficult to answer. Like Kant and Schelling, Hegel’s views on aesthetics were part of his philosophical system, and they served a specific purpose within that system. To question the end of art in Hegel is, for that reason, to question the entire system and the degree to which it presents a true account of the absolute. Yet that also is why aesthetics and the philosophy of art allow us important insight into Hegel’s thought and the thought of the German idealists more generally.
Fichte, Hegel, and Schelling ended their careers in the same chair in Berlin. Fichte spent his later years reformulating the Wissenschaftslehre in lectures and seminars, hoping to finally find an audience that understood him. Hegel, who was called to take Fichte’s chair upon his death, lectured on the history of philosophy, the philosophy of history, the philosophy of religion, and the philosophy of fine art (his lectures on these subjects have been no less influential than his published works). Hegel gained a considerable following among both conservatives and liberals in Berlin, who came to be known as “right” (or “old”) and “left” (or “young”) Hegelians. Schelling’s views seem to have changed the most between the turn of the century and his arrival in Berlin. The “positive” philosophy he articulated in his late works is no longer idealist, because Schelling no longer maintains that being and thinking are identical. Nor does the late Schelling think that thought can ground itself in its own activity. Instead, thought must find its ground in “the primordial kind of all being.”
Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860), Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855), and Karl Marx (1818-1883) all witnessed the decline of German idealism in Berlin. Schopenhauer had studied with Schulze in Göttingen and attended Fichte’s lectures in Berlin, but he is not considered a German idealist by many historians of philosophy. Some, like Günter Zöller, have argued against this exclusion, suggesting that the first edition of The World as Will and Representation is, in fact, “the first completely execute post-Kantian philosophical system” (Ameriks 2000, 101). Whether or not this system is really idealist is, however, a matter of some dispute. Claims that Schopenhauer is not an idealist usually take as their starting point the second part of The World as Will and Representation, where Schopenhauer claims that the representations of the “pure subject of cognition” are grounded in the will and, ultimately, in the body.
It is easier to distinguish Kierkegaard and Marx from the German idealists than Schopenhauer, though Kierkegaard and Marx are perhaps as different from one another as they could possibly be. Kierkegaard studied with the late Schelling, but, like Jacobi, rejected reason and philosophy in the name of faith. Many of his works are elaborate parodies of the kind of reasoning to be found in the works of the German idealists, especially Hegel. Marx, along with another one of Schelling’s students, Friedrich Engels (1820-1895), came to deride idealism as the “German ideology.” Marx and Engels charged that idealism had never really broken with religion, that it comprehended the world through abstract, logical categories, and, finally, mistook mere ideas for real things. Marx and Engels promoted their own historical materialism as an alternative to the ideology of idealism.
There is a tendency to overemphasize figures like Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, and Marx in the history of philosophy in the nineteenth century, but this distorts our understanding of the developments taking place at the time. It was the rise of empirical methods in the natural sciences and historical-critical methods in the human sciences, as well as the growth of Neo-Kantianism and positivism that led to the eclipse of German idealism, not the blistering critiques of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Marx, and Nietzsche. Neo-Kantianism, in particular, sought to leave behind the speculative excesses of German idealism and extract from Kant those ideas that were useful for the philosophy of the natural and human sciences. In the process, they established Neo-Kantianism as the dominant philosophical school in Germany at the end of the nineteenth century.
Despite its general decline, German idealism remained an important influence on the British idealism of F.H. Bradley (1846-1924) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923) at the beginning of the twentieth century. The rejection of British idealism was one of common features of early analytic philosophy, though it would be wrong to suppose that Bertrand Russell (1872-1970), G.E. Moore (1873-1958), and others rejected idealism for purely philosophical reasons. The belief that German idealism was at least partly responsible for German nationalism and aggression was common among philosophers of Russell’s generation and only became stronger after World War I and World War II. The famous depiction of Hegel as an “enemy of liberty” and a “totalitarian” in The Open Society and its Enemies (1946) by Karl Popper (1902-1994) builds upon this view. And while it would be difficult to prove that any particular philosophy was responsible for German nationalism or the rise of fascism, it is true that the works of Fichte and Hegel were, like those of Nietzsche, favorite references for German nationalists and, later, the Nazis.
The works of the German idealists, especially Hegel, became important in France during the 1930s. Lectures on Hegel by Alexander Kojeve’s (1902-1968) influenced a generation of French intellectuals, including Georges Bataille (1897-1962), Jacques Lacan (1901-1981) and Jean-Paul Satre (1905-1980). Kojeve’s understanding of Hegel is idiosyncratic, but, together with the works of Jean Wahl (1888-1974), Alexandre Koyré (1892-1964), and Jean Hyppolite (1907-1968), his approach remains influential in continental European philosophy. Objections to the anthropocentrism of German idealism can usually be traced back to this tradition and especially to Kojeve, who saw Hegel’s dialectic as a historical process through which the problems that define humanity are resolved. The end of this process is, for Kojeve, the end of history, which was popularized by Frances Fukayama (1952-) in The End of History and the Last Man (1992). Charges that German idealism is dogmatic, rationalist, foundationalist, and totalizing in its attempt to systematize, and ultimately an egocentric “philosophy of the subject,” which are also common in continental philosophy, merit more serious concern, given the emphasis Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel place on the “I” and the extent of their philosophical ambitions. Yet even these charges have been undermined in recent years by new historical scholarship and a greater understanding of the problems that actually motivated the German idealists.
There has been considerable interest in German idealism in the last twenty years, as hostility waned in analytic philosophy, traditional assumptions faded in continental philosophy, and bridges were built between the two approaches. Philosophers like Richard Bernstein and Richard Rorty, inspired by Wilfrid Sellars, may be credited with re-introducing Hegel to analytic philosophy as an alternative to classical empiricism. Robert Pippin later defended a non-metaphysical Hegel, which has been a subject of intense debate, but which has also made Hegel relevant to contemporary debates about realism and anti-realism. More recently, Robert Brandom has championed the “normative” conception of rationality that he finds in Kant and Hegel, and which suggests that concepts function as rules regulating judgment rather than mere representations. Some, like Catherine Malabou, have even attempted to apply the insights of the German idealists to contemporary neuroscience. Finally, it would be remiss not to mention the extraordinary historical-philosophical scholarship, in both German and English, that has been produced on German idealism in recent years. The literature listed in the bibliography has not only enriched our understanding of German idealism with new editions, translations, and commentaries, it has also expanded the horizons of philosophical scholarship by identifying new problems and new solutions to problems arising in different traditions and contexts.
University of Tennessee Knoxville
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Last updated: April 23, 2012 | Originally published: