Arnold Geulincx (1624—1669)
Arnold (or Arnout) Geulincx was an early-modern Flemish philosopher who initially taught at Leuven (Louvain) University, but fled the Catholic Low Countries when he was fired there in 1658. He settled at Leiden, in the Protestant North, where he worked under the patronage of the Cartesian Calvinist theologian Abraham Heidanus (1597-1678), and tried to obtain a post at Leiden University. Geulincx was never to procure a steady position in his new surroundings, and ultimately died in poverty as a victim of the 1669 Leiden plague. On the basis of Descartes’ philosophy, he developed a range of philosophical ideas that sometimes closely resemble Spinoza’s, but always have a particular flavour of their own. His contributions in the fields of logic, metaphysics and ethics have earned him a place not only in the history of Dutch Cartesianism, but in Western intellectual history at large.
As a result of accusations that he had been a Spinozist in disguise, Geulincx’ name was almost erased from history after 1720, but nineteenth-century historians rehabilitated Geulincx for having been a forerunner of Immanuel Kant. Nowadays, Arnold Geulincx is primarily known as a representative of seventeenth-century “occasionalism”, and as an original thinker in-between Descartes and Spinoza. Despite a certain impact he made on his immediate Leiden pupils, such as the Dutch Cartesians Cornelis Bontekoe (c. 1644-1685) and Johannes Swartenhengst (1644-1711), and on the English philosopher Richard Burthogge (1638-1705), as well as on a number of enlightened members of the Dutch Calvinist clergy during the last quarter of the seventeenth century, Geulincx’ most significant influence in intellectual history to date has been on the novels and plays of Samuel Beckett (1906-1989), as well as, through Beckett, on late twentieth-century French philosophy.
Table of Contents
- Logic and Method
- A Philosophy of Wonder
- References and Further Reading
Arnold Geulincx was born in the city of Antwerp, which despite having lost its former glory as a hub of world trade and a centre of the arts, had regained new vigour as the home of Counter-Reformation culture in the Southern Netherlands—a new spirit that was evidenced in the paintings of Peter-Paul Rubens, Jacob Jordaens and Anthonie van Dijck, as well as in the Baroque church of Saint Carolus Borromeus, a Jesuit monument consecrated in 1625. Geulincx’ father apparently did well as the city’s messenger to Brussels, since he bought a large house just around the corner of Saint Carolus Borromeus’ Church when Arnold was around thirteen years of age, and another, adjacent one, a year later. While Jan Geulincx, one of Arnold’s younger brothers, studied with Jacob Jordaens for some time, Arnold was destined for an academic career and left Antwerp to go to university in January 1640. In Leuven, he studied arts and philosophy at the College of the Lily, obtaining his licentiate on November 19, 1643 ranking second best in a class of 159 students. Reading theology for some time, Geulincx was appointed junior professor in philosophy at Lily College in December 1646.
Not much is known about Geulincx’ early career, but it is reasonable to assume that he made a strong impression with his rhetorical skills, founded on the remarkable proficiency in Latin he had already exhibited during his Antwerp school days. In the autumn of 1649, Geulincx’ career perspectives seemed secure enough for his parents to give up their life in Antwerp and join their son in Leuven, the area they originally came from. Another three years hence, Geulincx became senior professor and was asked to deliver a series of speeches during the end-of-the-year Saturnalia festivities. Protests against the nova philosophia at Leuven may have been prompted by Geulincx’ opening address on December 16, 1652, where he ventilated Baconian ideas and outlined recommendations for changes to be made to the university curriculum. This did not in any way hinder a successful continuation of his academic career.
Disgrace and downfall came in 1658, when Geulincx was dismissed, presumably on account of attempting to breach the rule of celibacy for university professors by planning to marry his cousin Susanna Strickers— a privilege that had been granted to his Lily tutor William Philippi (1600-1665) in 1630 only after mediation by the Brabant Council. Reportedly, the 1630 agreement had been made on the explicit condition that this would be the last time. A later eighteenth-century source mentions disputes with his colleagues and debts as reasons for Geulincx’ dismissal, but these have been impossible to trace. Since there is no evidence that the committee that sacked him had any problems with Geulincx personally, it may well have been the case that he simply had to choose either not to marry or to leave.
Religious considerations, however, may also have played a part. A letter of recommendation signed May 3, 1658 by the three Leiden theologians: Abraham Heidanus, Johannes Coccejus (1603-1669) and Johannes Hoornbeek (1617-1666), not only indicates that Geulincx had turned his back on the Catholic faith after he had taken in St. Augustine’s theory of grace, but also that he had initially visited Holland of his own accord in January 1658, “under the pretext of another trip to this province” (Eekhof, 1919: 19). Upon his return to Leuven, Geulincx had found that a successor had been appointed in his place. Although, as the text tells us, he had already decided to give up his position at Leuven, he had not expected the hostile reaction he was met with, since the letter specifies that “he barely escaped a life sentence.” If it is indeed the case that Geulincx confronted his colleagues in January 1658 with the embarrassing fact that he had left Leuven prompted by the intention to convert to Protestantism, it is likely they treated his case with utmost efficiency and discretion. Such intentions would have come at a very untimely moment. Amidst condemnations of Jansenism issued by the Vatican, and declarations of political freedom made by the Brabant Council, there was extremely little room for maneuver for Leuven’s university professors. They may well have been happy to explain Geulincx’ dismissal, if at all, in terms of marriage plans rather than dogmatic preferences. Rumors about Geulincx’ debts, moreover, may have had their origin in the fact that, under these circumstances, Geulincx had to leave everything behind in a hurry, and flee to Leiden penniless.
In his new home town, Geulincx was to graduate in medicine on September 17, 1658, no doubt in order to be able to earn a living. Geulincx married Susanna on December 8. Rather than to become a doctor, however, his ambition was to resume his career as a professor of philosophy. After a series of appointments and dismissals, Geulincx was finally appointed as junior lecturer in late 1662, with the help of Heidanus. He was appointed junior lecturer firstly in logic, and then in metaphysics. He was temporarily appointed as Professor extraordinarius in 1665, but was allowed to teach ethics only in February 1667. From June to November 1669, Geulincx was again newly appointed, now in order to teach rhetoric. He died in poverty in November 1669, having failed to pay any rent for the apartment he had shared with Susanna since October 1668. When Susanna died around the New Year, there was only some furniture left to compensate the couple’s creditors.
With two works on the subject of logic, Geulincx had nevertheless started off his Leiden career in a positive mood. In the first of these works, his Logica suis fundamentis restituta (Logic Restored to its Foundations, 1662), Geulincx interprets negation mainly as propositional negation, that is, as acting on the whole of a proposition, not on terms. The other book, Methodus inveniendi argumenta (A Method for Finding Arguments, 1663), used set theory relations to demonstrate logical principles. For this way of approaching logic, the Dutch philosopher Gabriël Nuchelmans (1922-1996) would later refer to Geulincx’ logic as a “containment theory of logic”, in which relations of containment illustrate how statements are implied by other statements. Containment may explain logical consequence, for instance, since the propositional content of a statement q may be implied by that of p, just as, according to Geulincx, every proposition p will entail any number of further statements implied by p. Interpreting the way in which subjects relate to predicates in terms of relations of containment as well, Geulincx considered subjects as the denumerable “parts” of conceptual “wholes”, and considered the connection between subjects and predicates to be made on the basis of the “relation in which they stand to one another within the hierarchical structure of a conceptual field” (Nuchelmans, 1988: 40).
Producing a modernised summary of Geulincx’ propositional logic in the 1939 issue of Erkenntniss, the Swiss logician Karl Dürr (1888-1970) portrayed Geulincx as an early representative of symbolic logic. Geulincx presented his logical principles in a purely conceptual form and evidently depended on earlier scholastic traditions, such as in his formulation of De Morgan’s laws, which reproduce the fifteenth-century account John Versor offered in his commentary on Peter of Spain. Yet, according to Dürr, Geulincx’ logic contained all the elements of a mathematical logic, complete with variables and logical constants, as well as other remarkable features, such as a Tarskian definition of truth.
To weigh the sophistication of a seventeenth-century system of logic against its medieval forerunners, or to assess its significance for the development of later formal logic is, however, a complicated matter. In a later study, Dürr compared Geulincx’ achievement with similar works in logic, such as the Port-Royal Logic (1662), and works by Johannes Clauberg (1622-1665), Leibniz and Girolamo Saccheri (1667-1733). Dürr came to the conclusion that, especially in the area of propositional logic, Geulincx’ system was richer than that of most of his contemporaries, whilst in the field of term logic, his basic rules for the formal validity of syllogisms surpassed even those of Leibniz in elegance and precision (Dürr, 1965).
As a senior professor in Leuven, Geulincx had previously shown an interest in Baconian philosophy and had proposed to revise the university’s curriculum in such a way that natural philosophy might be studied as a separate field that also included logic and mathematics, as well as forms of experimentation. It is unknown whether Geulincx developed Cartesian views in Leuven as well, as did his Leuven colleague William van Gutschoven (c. 1618- 1667) and his tutor William Philippi (c. 1600-1665) at some point. However this may be, it was only in Leiden that Geulincx began to develop a Cartesian line of argument in natural philosophy, metaphysics and ethics, and expounded views on God’s causal role in nature that would later be interpreted as “occasionalist”.
The appeal to God’s causal activity would become a central feature of both Geulincx’ metaphysics and his ethics, but the way in which he justified and explained the need for a divine administration of the activities normally attributed to “secondary causes”—that is to say, to individual persons and things—differs markedly from the arguments seen in the works of medieval Islamic “occasionalists” and Cartesian contemporaries such as Louis de la Forge, Géraud de Cordemoy and Nicholas Malebranche. Rather than developing the theological view that God exercises full power over man’s causal and epistemological functions; or questioning the metaphysically problematic notion of an exchange of accidents between substances; or, finally, dismissing the possibility that purely corporeal bodies might have a power to move either themselves or other bodies, Geulincx developed his so-called “occasionalist” position on the basis of an interpretation that grounds the idea of causality on the inner experience of active involvement (Renz & Van Ruler, 2010). What may pass for causality in the strictest sense is revealed by what human beings are familiar with, and what they experience within themselves as their own activities: the conscious awareness of “doing” things. Geulincx thus turns the Cartesian focus on human awareness, with its potential for deliberate and conscious activity, into the bedrock of a metaphysics of causal activity. With the notion of activity being linked to states of mental awareness, causality itself becomes the privilege of conscious minds, and a phenomenon for which the subject “doing” them is uniquely responsible.
At the same time, the scope of human activity is greatly reduced on the basis of such a criterion. Since the Cogito, or human consciousness, realises that there are many thoughts (cogitationes) that do not depend on the subject having them, Geulincx very early on in his Metaphysica Vera drew the conclusion that, “[t]here is a knowing and willing being distinct from me” (Geulincx, 1892: 150). It is this being, God, who arouses in us, through his manipulation of matter, the thoughts for which, not knowing how they came about, we cannot claim responsibility ourselves. On the basis of this consideration, Geulincx came to formulate the maxim that has become known as the first axiom of his philosophy: Quod nescis quomodo fiat, id non facis, in other words: “What you do not know how to do, is not your action” (Geulincx, 1892: 150).
In the Metaphysica Vera, or True Metaphysics, first published posthumously in 1691, the focus on the various causal roles of God and man gives rise to a tripartition of the discipline into an Autologia, a philosophy of the Self; a Somatologia, or a metaphysics of the World; and, finally, a Theologia, on God. To include a discussion of the physical universe in an exposition on metaphysics is something that would have been uncharacteristic for Descartes, but it is a move towards a deeper, metaphysical, understanding of nature that Geulincx shares with Spinoza. In fact, although the Metaphysica Vera is an unfinished text that was never authorized and leaves many questions unanswered, it testifies to the way in which various ontological conceptualisations in Spinozism have their antecedents in Geulincx. One of these is the distinction of causal levels into substantial and modal spheres. A significant aspect of Geulincx’ understanding of physical reality is his duplication of the world into a world of “becoming” and a world of “being”— a distinction Geulincx relates to Plato. According to this view, all individual bodies, with their states of “presence” and “absence”, belong to the world of becoming. Based on the idea that a world of mere effects cannot be all there is, Geulincx’ Platonic interpretation of the Cartesian universe introduces the notion of a Body-as-such, in which these effects find their ontological foundation. Carefully avoiding any reintroduction of the Aristotelian terminology of “substance” and “accident”, Geulincx thereby reintroduces the idea of an ontological distinction between the enduring entities of Mind and Body on the one hand, and their varying “modal”, that is, spatio-temporal manifestations on the other. Formulated in Platonic terms in Geulincx and in Aristotelian terms in Spinoza, this quasi-scholastic strategy to distinguish substantial from accidental levels of being results in a metaphysical interpretation of reality in terms of a diversity of ontological spheres – an interpretation that goes well beyond Descartes, but that we find in both Geulincx’ Metaphysica vera and Spinoza’s Principia Philosophiae Cartesianae, Short Treatise and Ethics (Van Ruler, 2009). In Geulincx, moreover, Descartes’ indistinct metaphysical categorizations, in which a single universal matter occurs next to a set of countless individual minds and a single God, is transformed into a strict metaphysical dualism according to which there are only two things: God, or Mind, on the one hand, and World, or Matter, on the other. Placing human minds in God, moreover, Geulincx also prefigured Spinoza in his way of arguing that human minds, like human bodies, are parcels of a larger field, or “modes”.
Parallels with Spinozistic ways of thinking equally occur in Geulincx’ treatment of the subject of ethics. In both authors, Descartes’ natural philosophy serves as a new basis for the neo-Stoic view that morality should primarily be seen as a way of mentally dealing with inevitable patterns of causality in nature and human social life. According to Geulincx, moreover, the application of reason to all areas of experience is the practical upshot of a mental attitude focused on a “love of God”. Contrary to Spinoza, Geulincx had no qualms with the idea that one is free whether or not to align oneself mentally to the necessary course of things. To put it in Geulincx’ own words: whereas one always obeys God, one has the option whether or not to obey reason – and this is what constitutes the criterion of morality.
With his focus on reason, Geulincx conforms to a general tendency within Renaissance moral philosophy. At the same time, he interprets what is reasonable in his own peculiar way, introducing a new set of four cardinal virtues, namely diligence, obedience, justice and humility, in place of the old quadriga of temperance, fortitude, justice and prudence. These virtues are all aimed at reason. Accordingly, rather than being directed towards other human beings, what Geulincx prescribes as obedience is an obedience to reason, just as humility is a mental humility in the face of reason, diligence involves a diligent attention to reason, and justice is the acceptance of a just and reasonable mean.
Reason should always be followed, but in the context of such encouragements to mental subservience, the example with which Geulincx illustrates obedience is easily misread. Even the wretched life of a slave, Geulincx argues, may be lived in freedom, as long as the slave is able to direct his will to the call of reason and to endure even “an appalling and cruel slavery” by obeying orders not because it is the will of his master, but because it is his own (Geulincx, 1986: 82; See also 1893: 23; 2006: 24). Despite its awkward way of seemingly sanctioning slavery, this argument only carries to the extreme another conception predominant in both classical and Renaissance traditions of Western moral philosophy, and most straightforwardly expressed in (neo-)Stoic sources: the notion that mental freedom does not depend on the relative force of outward circumstances, but is brought about exclusively by an inner consent to the demands of reason.
In combination with his metaphysical view on the limitations of human causal activity, such a radical endorsement of intellectualist and indifferentist arguments would seem inevitably to lead to a moral position emphasising a passive or even submissive attitude. Geulincx, however, did not preach quietism. The complete text of his Ethics was published only posthumously in 1675, presumably by Bontekoe, under the title of Gnōthi seauton, or Know Thyself, but Geulincx had already issued a Dutch version of the first of its six “Treatises” as Van de Hooft-deuchden (“On the Cardinal Virtues”) in 1664. Far from teaching resignation, the book contains an exceptionally practical list of ethical maxims and reads like a self-help manual in popular psychology rather than a moral treatise in the traditional sense of the word. What, according to Geulincx, is reasonable for a human being to do in the light of the “human condition”— a concept he may have taken over from the French moralist Pierre Charron, or from his Leuven professor in theology Libert Froidmont (1587-1653)— is to abide by seven moral guidelines, or “obligations”: to accept death, to avoid suicide, to take care of one’s health and of that of one’s species, to learn a trade, to earn a living, to relax now and again, and never to curse one’s ancestry or day of birth.
With respect to all of these guidelines, Pierre Charron’s De la Sagesse (1601; revised edition 1603) may have provided Geulincx with a model for the kind of things a moral treatise should instruct (De Vleeschauwer, 1974). Geulincx, however, explained his obligations on the basis of a quasi-Cartesian metaphysical groundwork that at first sight seems to undermine rather than to support them. Denying, like Spinoza, the possibility of any interaction between the body and the mind, Geulincx comes to the conclusion that the human being is only an onlooker, a “spectator” of the outside universe: “I am a mere spectator of a machine whose workings I can neither adjust nor readjust” (Geulincx, 1893: 33; 2006: 34). This would seem to make all human activity not only irrelevant, but downright impossible. Geulincx, however, argues that we should nevertheless be mindful to fulfil certain actions we know from experience God wishes us to perform. We have to search for food, for instance, in order to survive, and we should try to comply in as far as we are able with such evident commitments. Indeed, an attentiveness to the basic facts of life is what links the two aspects of what Geulincx presents as his ethics of ‘humility’. On the one hand, this is the “occasionalist” Inspection of Oneself that tells us we will find ourselves in a situation we neither control nor really understand; and, on the other hand, the list of “Obligations” that mark the obvious tasks we have to fulfil, and thus comprise a Disregard of Oneself. We should always choose what we know to be best. The only thing we should not do, according to Geulincx, is to bother about the outcome of our wishes, all of which are ultimately up to God. Thus, in the end, it is only our intentions that matter. In a famous example, Geulincx argued that it is for God to decide whether or not one is killed by the dagger with which one penetrates one’s heart. How one’s volitions are matched by activities produced in the material sphere “outside” is necessarily beyond us.
Geulincx does not speculate on the question to what extent we may rely on God’s resolve. Since the way in which God links physical to mental states is unknown to us, it is unclear whether Geulincx himself expected God either to have established a permanent world order or to produce an incessant number of miracles. As German commentators argued in late-nineteenth century debates on the possible impact of Geulincx on Leibniz, the analogy of two independent but synchronised clocks that Geulincx introduced in order to explain the relation between body and mind, seems to accentuate the Cartesian idea of a law-like regularity in nature. This is a position consistent with the emphasis laid on the notion of reason in Geulincx’ ethics. Yet where human volitions are in play, such as in Geulincx’ example of the dagger, or in his references to the phenomenon of paralysis, it would seem that God might have a more immediate role to play.
In the end, a solution to such metaphysical questions is not Geulincx’ primary concern in the context of ethics. As far as morality is concerned, it does not matter whether God makes a singular decision or whether he lets all physical conditions play their proper roles whenever one wishes to pierce one’s heart with a dagger. The moral point is, that this should not have been one’s intention in the first place. In this sense, the example is not so much meant to elucidate a metaphysical viewpoint, as it is indicative of Geulincx’ preoccupation with questions of life and death, and with the idea that the realm of the moral is defined by the mental attitude one takes with respect to preserving the condition that one finds oneself in as a conscious being. This is also the way in which to read the ethical axiom that Geulincx introduced as a counterpart to his earlier metaphysical maxim. The slogan Ubi nihil vales, ibi nihil velis, “Wherein you have no power, therein you should not will” (Geulincx 1893: 164; 2006: 178), applies not so much to any specific activities, but rather to human existence—“the human condition”— as such.
Although it is very likely that Spinoza (whose friend Lodewijk Meyer studied with Geulincx) must at least have known Geulincx by name, and although one may trace many coincidences in their works, there is no convincing evidence that the two men either knew each other, or knew each other’s work (Van Ruler, 2006). Likewise, it is unknown to what extent Geulincx’ moral philosophy may have inspired Spinoza. Spinoza may have been thinking of Geulincx for instance when, in his own Ethics, he explicitly denied that humility is a virtue, since this was the single most important of the four cardinal virtues for Geulincx. Spinoza may, on the other hand, also have wished simply to make an unequivocal statement against the traditional glorification of humility in Christian theological contexts.
Contrary to Spinoza, Geulincx presented his own moral philosophy as a philosophy compatible with Christian views. Interpreting certain Christian themes in purely naturalistic ways, such as by taking the “devil” solely to stand for a mental propensity to persist in inconsiderate behaviour, Geulincx’ Christian philosophy was unorthodox, but it was also paradoxical in various respects. He considered his moral philosophy to be an ethics exclusively founded on reason. Still, God’s word, or so Geulincx argued, had worked for him like a microscope: once Scripture had revealed the truth, he was now able to decide questions of right and wrong without its help – in other words, purely on the basis of reason. The obvious implication of this is that pagan philosophers could never have been able to find their way in matters of moral philosophy, and this is indeed what Geulincx concluded. True spiritual redemption was open only to philosophers acquainted with what Scripture had shown to be reasonable: the idea that one has no title to one’s life and that this insight should bear fruit in an attitude of humility. Geulincx might still include Platonic, Stoic and even Aristotelian concepts, and stick to classical forms of philosophical analysis in his ethics, but he dismissed all pagan philosophies for having been developed on the basis of inappropriate motivations. All pagans had urged “for the Land of Cockaigne”; they had craved for pleasure rather than having searched for God (Geulincx 1893: 52-54; 1966: 116-118). The pagans, in other words, had consciously aimed at achieving happiness, when all they should have been doing was to look for what is right. The difference between these two roads, Geulincx admits, is a very subtle one, for since reason and Christianity themselves lead to happiness, one has to be extremely careful to avoid the pitfall of self-centered motivations even as a Christian philosopher.
If, as Geulincx argues, one has to flee happiness in order to pursue it, it may seem tempting to try to flee happiness exactly for the reason of acquiring it. In that case, however, Geulincx argues, happiness “will not pursue you” (Geulincx, 1893: 58; 2006: 57). In other words, while one knows happiness will result from the fulfilment of a duty, one still needs to fulfil the duty without doing it with the aim of acquiring happiness, or it will not work. The notions of “Obligation” and “Law” may help to avert any psychological dilemmas here. Laws, according to Geulincx, never correspond to obvious forms of self-interest, or they would not be laws. If only we direct our mind “to refer nothing of what we do or do not do to our Happiness, but everything to our Obligation” and thus “pledge” ourselves “wholly to God” (Geulincx, 1893: 58 and 57, respectively; 2006: 57 and 56), there is no problem. Libertas will be the immediate, if paradoxical, effect of obedience; and happiness, Felicitas (or beatitude, Beatitudo, a word Geulinx uses for Felicitas only when explaining matters in the accepted scholastic terminology) will present itself automatically as the mental bonus for abiding by the way of virtue. Simply doing what God and reason demand, the wise man is able to disconnect his mind from sensory impressions, and to assent to what happens in God’s universe not according to what is most agreeable to him, but according to the way in which reason presents things as they are.
The complicated dialectics of receiving happiness in return for virtue caused Geulincx to touch upon theological questions as well. If Geulincx became a Jansenist in Leuven after having imbibed Augustine’s theory of grace, and a Calvinist later in Leiden, he must at some point have become aware that the whole idea of devising a Protestant moral philosophy was something inherently problematic. Theologically speaking, there could be no question of a Jansinist or Calvinist God distributing happiness in return for our effort. Geulincx was well aware of this, and therefore attempts to deny that he ever implied that God acts in reply to our achievement: “But mark: I did not say that the Humble first love God, and are then loved in return by God. Certainly not, I did not say this, and this should suffice” (Geulincx, 1893: 64; 2006: 63). Philosophically speaking, the rewards of virtue were nevertheless exactly this: God’s love in return for our love of God and reason. In line with a wider tendency in Dutch Cartesianism, Geulincx inevitably had to argue for a strict separation between philosophy and theology in order to save the practical relevance of his moral philosophy.
Besides classical, Christian and Cartesian themes, there may also have been biographical factors involved in shaping Geulincx’ ethics. The precarious living conditions of his Leiden years in particular seem to be reflected in his preoccupation with the insecurities of life and with the possibility of suicide, both of which topics are central to his ethics. Yet such interests may also have had their origin in a special talent for the experience of wonder in Geulincx, as well as an exceptionally subtle philosophical imagination.
It is in foreshadowing quasi-Kantian themes that Geulincx’ philosophical discernment appears most conspicuously. Essentially a criticism of Aristotelian ways of thinking, Geulincx’ Metaphysica ad mentem peripateticam, a book that was published only posthumously in 1691, argued that there was an illusory quality to thinking, aside from the illusiveness of sense perception. Not only was it true that our senses, as Descartes had argued, yield a subjective view of the world; according to Geulincx, our intellectual “ways of thinking” (modi cogitandi) distort our conception of reality just as much. Indeed, it is with intelligible species that we impose our ways of thinking on outside things similarly to the way in which we impose sensible species onto the world that do not apply to things as they are in themselves. Both ways, we “always attribute the phantasms (phasmata) of sense and intellect to things themselves”— even if “there is something divine in us that always tells us it is not so” (Geulincx, 1892: 301).
Once more giving a stricter format to Cartesian intuitions than Descartes himself would have done, and prefiguring Spinoza on both accounts, Geulincx distinguished four different kinds of knowledge and drew a sharp distinction between the realm of “imaginations” and the realm of “ideas”. Holding on to a classical notion of scientia that limits the notion of “idea” to the knowledge of the “essence” of a thing, Geulincx interpreted the gradual development of epistemological stages in Platonic rather than in Aristotelian terms and classified the respective levels of knowledge as (1) sense perception, (2) knowledge, or cognitio, (3) scientia, or knowledge with an account; and, finally, (4) the ultimate kind of scientia that is called sapientia or wisdom, which is available only to whomever is accountable for the thing known. Thus offering a seemingly Augustinian-inspired understanding of “ideas” as the kind of things in God’s mind that we must somehow have access to in order to intuit the essences of things, Geulincx in fact denied man any wisdom apart from the wisdom related to his own mental activities, such as our mental activities of love and hate, affirmation and negation and so forth, the reason for this being that to understand these and to will are, in the end, the only things one can actually “do”.
Wisdom accordingly presents itself in Geulincx mainly in a negative way; that is to say, in the form of a recognition that our intellectual capacities are extremely limited with respect to understanding things that occur outside the realm of consciousness. Although the mind knows that all things are either minds or bodies and that infinite mind and infinite extension (that is, God and Body) are ultimately all there is, our “modes of thinking”, in other words, our ways of apprehending reality, misrepresent things as they are in themselves by seeing them as separate “beings” that may function as the subject of predication. Yet we have to see them in this way, if we wish to say something about them.
Although there is an immediate Cartesian context as well as a Scotist terminological background to these arguments, and although, like Geulincx, authors such as Clauberg and Johannes de Raey (1622-1702) had also tried to come to terms with the indistinct manner in which Descartes had discussed general metaphysical concepts in the Principia Philosophiae (Aalderink: 2009), Geulincx’ position stands out for the way in which it emphasizes how the human intellect is liable to characterize the outside world in terms of forms of propositional content that portray whatever there is as being divided into objects possessing certain properties. As Geulincx himself remarks (Geulincx, 1892: 199), “few people seem to observe” that this logical mould introduces ontological classifications for which there is actually no basis in reality itself.
Geulincx thus came to criticise a philosophical viewpoint that had been almost universally shared since Aristotle, the idea, namely, that ontological concepts such as the concept of “substance” may function in parallel ways in metaphysics and logic. His criticism of this view (which is not merely a Peripatetic, but in fact a virtually universal human assumption) launched the epistemologically radical idea that the linguistic and logical ways in which our concepts function within our intellectual representations of the outside world, should actually be a warning against taking them seriously in metaphysical terms. According to Geulincx, logical and linguistic distinctions do not necessarily represent things as they are in themselves. Indeed, notions such as “being (ens), substance, accident, relation, subject, predicate, whole and part” only illustrate how we think about objects. As modes of thought we use these notions to express what we mean when we distinguish a thing from its activity or from our judgement of it. Our manner of understanding, however, should not be confused with the way things are structured and organised independently of our representations of them. Nor should we uncritically build philosophical systems on the categories and logical forms that help us to analyse what we experience.
Because of the way in which he gave prominence to, and ultimately dealt with, the question of the knowability of “things as they are in themselves”, Geulincx’ position has often been associated with the critical philosophy of Immanuel Kant. Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945), for instance, saw both Geulincx’ thesis of the unknowability of “things in themselves” (translated in German as Dinge an sich) and his view that all human understanding is dependent on “forms of thought” brought in by ourselves, as prefigurations of the Kantian position. Although he remained careful not to deny the differences between Geulincx and Kant, the Flemish Geulincx scholar (and former nazi-sympathiser in exile) Herman de Vleeschauwer (1899-1986) in 1957 agreed that if one defines “Criticism” as the theory according to which “we know things only by the medium of our forms of thought”, one could no longer “regard it as the personal discovery of Kant” (De Vleeschauwer, 1957: 63).
In general terms, Geulincx’ alertness to the possible incongruity between the logic of our thoughts and the structure of the outside world may indeed be compared to Kant’s. It may even be extended beyond Kant to serve as a comparison between the Flemish Cartesian’s criticisms of scholastic views and Wittgenstinian, as well as postmodern censures of the metaphysical suggestion that logical forms reflect an ontological structure of things. At the same time, Geulincx stood closer to other seventeenth-century denunciations of Aristotelianism inspired by Descartes, such as John Locke’s. Exposing scholastic metaphysics as a logical scheme functional only within the domain of our daily interaction with macroscopic objects, Geulincx’ evaluation of Peripatetic metaphysics, although it is cast in a rather scholastic terminology itself, anticipates Locke’s view in so far as it confirms the idea that there is a purely nominal aspect to the Aristotelian manner of metaphysical categorisation.
And yet Geulincx’ Metaphysica ad mentem peripateticam creates a sense of epistemological alienation that goes far beyond Locke’s criticism of the notion of substance. If, as a direct consequence of Cartesian natural philosophy, Geulincx argued that scholastic types of analysis in metaphysics might be exposed as logico-linguistic frameworks only, this not only meant that there is a certain contingency to the “essences” derived from mere experience; it also meant that the logic of substance itself was mistaken, and that, accordingly, the search for “substantiality” was ill-conceived. Geulincx did, of course, accept the existence of a universal “Body”, but for him, this idea was not dependent on the vague conceivability of a substantial substrate to which one might attach accidental properties. For Geulincx, the notion of Body-as-such may simply be deduced from the fact that one finds many “thoughts” (cogitationes) in one’s conscious experience that do not depend on oneself. Accordingly, there is something out there, something orchestrated by God. This is the World itself, no less— but there is no sense in continuing, like Locke, to see this World as a substance with properties, or to lament the indistinctness of this “something”. With respect to substantiality, we should rather be aware that we are misled by our own intellect into searching for it. In the Principia philosophiae, Descartes himself had already argued against trying to conceive of substantial beings behind the forms of “extension” and “thought” that we find in nature. Geulincx drew the ultimate conclusion by arguing that the search for a universal “something” of which the property of being extended is an “accident”, arises from the mistaken belief that the world is structured along the lines of our “modes of thought”.
As a consequence, Geulincx does indeed come close to Kant in the sense that his emphasis on the unknowability of things is modified by the idea that the world as it is “in itself”, remains hidden to our observation and eludes our limited epistemological capabilities to grasp what is actually there. Still, Geulincx’ arguments are very different from Kant’s. According to the Flemish philosopher, our intellect imposes a grid on our experience on account of which we necessarily envision the external world as a world of “things”. Doing so, our metaphysical imagination follows the linguistic and logical habit of distinguishing substantives from adjectives in language and subjects from predicates in logic. The problem with scholastic metaphysics is that it draws ontological conclusions from such cognitive ways of dealing with reality. Just as we attribute our sense impressions to the outside world even though, at least at a certain level of mental development, we become aware that such attributions are incorrect, so too should we, with respect to our intellectual understanding of things, come to doubt the way in which we attribute our cogitationes to things in themselves.
According to Geulincx, there is hardly a way to avoid this, and we cling to the idea of distinguishing beings from properties with even more tenacity than we adhere to the idea of attributing mentally experienced qualities to external things in sense experience. Posing the question how we come to conclude that there is a real basis for distinguishing between subjects and predicates, Geulincx rejects the common scholastic ways of arguing for an actual relation of “inherence” between them. He does, however, offer an alternative ground for our habit of seeing things this way. Whenever we refer to things either as “beings” or as “properties”, it may be that we do so because of the relative stability of our various sense impressions: “The real cause (…) may be, that people see some things as more firm, stable and lasting, others as more fluid, fleeting and frail. Thus (…) light and darkness, colours and sounds and all similar things are regarded as more fluid than body or extension” (Geulincx, 1892: 305). What, in other words, modern psychology and evolutionary biology might consider to be innate propensities, Geulincx was tempted to explain on empiricist grounds. Repeatedly confirming that fluid impressions find their support in firmer ones, rather than that firm marks rest on fleeting signals, our senses will encourage our intellect to follow suit and conceptualise the world in terms of independent beings and their dependent properties.
Rather than to Locke, Kant, or Wittgenstein, Geulincx compares best to Geulincx himself. A similar interpretation of the way in which the human intellect conceptually rearranges sense experience is found only in the works of his pupil Richard Burthogge. According to Burthogge, the senses give us “external qualia, which reason interprets as predicable of substances or subjects”; a position that, in the terminology of analytical philosophy, has been interpreted as a form of “idealism” (Ayers, 2005: 195). As with so many other statements of this underestimated English philosopher, however, this particular view derives straight from Geulincx’ Metaphysica ad mentem Peripateticam.
Again coming closer to Kant than to Locke, Geulincx developed his epistemological arguments vis-à-vis Aristotelianism not so much in order to make room for a new understanding of nature, but rather in order to heighten our philosophical awareness of the fact that we are fundamentally ignorant of what the world is like independently of our experience. As with Kant, moreover, there is a certain religious susceptibility at play in Geulincx’ philosophical concerns. Exhibiting a mental predisposition coloured by Augustinianism in all of his works, Geulincx would always keep wondering at the ineffable character of God’s universe and our position in it.
If Geulincx hardly compares to other philosophers in the Western tradition, others did take their inspiration from Geulincx. Having developed an interest in seventeenth-century philosophy during his assistantship at the École Normale Supérieure in Paris from 1928 to 1930, the Irish poet and novelist Samuel Beckett would take up a close study of Geulincx’ works (the Metaphysica Vera and Ethics in particular) at Trinity College Dublin, in the spring of 1936. As a direct result of this interest, Arnold Geulincx was to play a crucial role in Beckett’s Murphy (finished in June 1936 and published in 1938)— a book that presents its leading character preferably sitting naked in his London apartment, tied to a teakwood rocking chair. Implicit references to Spinoza and explicit references to Geulincx accompany the way in which Murphy’s inner experience is detailed, and is further explained in later chapters.
It has been well-established how Geulincxian imagery, such as that of the cradle (which Geulincx used to explain the relationship between our will and God’s, and which Beckett turned into a rocking chair), the two synchronised clocks, and the passenger walking on the deck of a ship against the vessel’s direction (an image Geulincx himself may have derived from Justus Lipsius), were continually reused by Beckett well beyond Murphy; how Geulincxian expressions, such as “coming hither, acting here, departing hence”, turn into metaphorically rich elements of literary structure in Beckett; and how Geulincx’ overall theme of power and impotency would continue to resonate in Beckett’s plays, prose and cinematographic works. If it is true that “[what] chiefly endured for Beckett from Geulincx was his acceptance of ignorance as the basic human condition, his ethic of humility and his advocacy for ascetic withdrawal and rigorous self-examination” (Herren, 2012: 195), it is also clear why Geulincx might come to function as a replacement for Descartes in Beckett, and as “a philosopher who spoke to [Beckett] as no other had” (Cordingley, 2012: 49). The contrast between Geulincx and Descartes may also serve to accentuate that there was a Geulincxian conceptual background to what twentieth-century philosophers may have derived from Beckett’s plays. On account of the element of ineffability that Geulincx added to Cartesianism, it has been argued that the notion of an “absence of self-presence”, particularly in thinking and in authorship (a theme taken up by French philosophers such as Blanchot, Foucault and Derrida), found a Geulincxian inspiration in Beckett (Uhlmann, 2006: 113).
The great difference, however, between Geulincx on the one hand and twentieth-century French philosophers inspired by Beckett’s absurdist plays on the other, is that Geulincx—like Beckett himself, for that matter—had no inclination to diminish the importance of subjective experience. Indeed, it is precisely in this respect that Geulincx’ “experiential” defence of occasionalist arguments was squarely at odds with Malebranche’s alternative notion of God’s pre-ordination of human minds. Later commentators have been surprised by such disparities within occasionalist philosophy (Nadler, 1999), or have even drawn the misguided conclusion that Geulincx was an inconsistent occasionalist (Terraillon, 1912; Rousset, 1999). In fact, rather than to explain away human mental activity on the grounds of theological or determinist dogma, Geulincx not only took the inner world of consciousness as his starting point in philosophy, but also saw it as a cause for wonder at the singularity of the human condition. If things prove themselves to be ineffable, it is to the human subject that they do so. Similarly, if outside things remain inscrutable, it is only of inner experience itself that our knowledge is genuine and absolute.
Samuel Beckett is believed to have broken away from making further dogmatic use of philosophy after his post-war realisation that “All I am is feeling” (Uhlmann, 2006: 72). His interest in Geulincx, however, did not suffer from this. If a mood of estrangement, coupled to a painstaking examination of the inner life, is what Beckett found familiar in Geulincx, it is significant that Beckett never studied the quasi-Kantian arguments from the Metaphysica ad mentem peripateticam, arguably Geulincx’ most radical philosophical text. Apart from some transcriptions taken from the Metaphysica vera, Beckett took his notes mainly from Geulincx’ Ethics. A familiarity of viewpoints must have been obvious to Beckett in these texts as well, which may add to our conviction that Beckett’s prolonged interest in Geulincx was based primarily on an affection that went beyond specific images or doctrines of philosophy.
There was obviously “something of a friendship across centuries” between Beckett and Geulincx (Tucker, 2012: 181), apparently motivated by the articulation of a shared experience that Beckett cherished in Geulincx, and that presumably involved a recognition of something very intimate and relatively rare, even if it had been expressed in such technical philosophical contexts as a religiously motivated metaphysics and a theory of ethics combining classical and Christian themes.
The ultimate secret to Geulincx’ appeal may be that his philosophical texts, despite their traditional setting, have a captivating strangeness to them, which is linked to the alienating topics they address. Whatever his philosophy may have done for Beckett’s artistic development, it is beyond doubt that, just as in Samuel Beckett’s case, Geulincx’ Baroque blend of Augustino-Cartesianism will continue to impress likeminded readers by its unique evocation of the timeless motif of human metaphysical ignorance, as well as by its humbling expression of amazement at the mystery of existence.
- Geulincx, Arnold, Opera philosophica, vol. 1, ed. J.P.N. Land, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1891.
- Geulincx’ Orationes and the Logica restituta
- Geulincx, Arnold, Opera philosophica, vol. 2, ed. J.P.N. Land, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1892.
- The Methodus, as well as the metaphysical and physical works
- Geulincx, Arnold, Opera philosophica, vol. 3, ed. J.P.N. Land, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1893.
- Ethics, ethical disputations and Notes on Descartes
- Geulincx, Arnold, Sämtliche Schriften in fünf Bänden, ed. H.J. de Vleeschauwer, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1965–1968.
- A handy reprint (in 3 vols.) of the Opera Philosophica
- Geulincx: Présentation, choix de textes et traduction, ed. Alain De Lattre, Philosophes de tous les temps vol. 69, Paris: Seghers, 1970.
- A selection of Geulincx’ texts in French
- Geulincx, Arnout, Van de hoofddeugden. De eerste tuchtverhandeling, ed. Cornelis Verhoeven, Baarn: Ambo, 1986.
- The first part of the Ethics in a modern version of the Dutch original
- Geulincx, Arnold, Metaphysics, ed. Martin Wilson, Wisbech: Christoffel Press, 1999.
- First English edition of the Metaphysica vera
- Geulincx, Arnold, Ethics, With Samuel Beckett’s Notes, ed. Han van Ruler, Anthony Uhlmann and Martin Wilson. Leiden and Boston: Brill, 2006.
- The complete Ethics in English with a transcription of Beckett’s notes
- Geulincx, Arnold, Éthique, ed. Hélène Bah-Ostrowiecki, Turnhout: Brepols, 2010.
- The Ethics in a modern French edition
- Aalderink, Mark, ‘Spinoza and Geulincx on the human condition, passions, and love’, Studia Spinozana vol. 15 / Wiep van Bunge (ed.), Spinoza and Dutch Cartesianism, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2006, pp. 67-87.
- On the Augustinian concept of love and its impact on Geulincx and Spinoza
- Aalderink, Mark, Philosophy, Scientific Knowledge, and Concept Formation in Geulincx and Descartes, Utrecht: Zeno, 2010.
- Published dissertation on the epistemological differences between Descartes and Geulincx
- Armogathe, Jean-Robert, and Vincent Carraud, ‘The First Condemnation of Descartes’ Œuvres: Some Unpublished Documents from the Vatican Archives’, in: Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, vol. 1, Oxford: Clarendon, 2003, pp. 67-109.
- Contains the only known reference to Geulincx’ marriage plans as a reason for his dismissal
- Ayers, M.R., ‘Richard Burthogge and the Origins of Modern Conceptualism’, in: Tom Sorell and G.A.J. Roger (eds.), Analytic Philosophy and History of Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon, 2005, pp. 179-200.
- On Geulincx’ most important pupil in epistemology
- Cassirer, Ernst, Das Erkenntnisproblem in der Philosophie und Wissenschaft der neueren Zeit (Berlin, 1906-1923), ed. Dagmar Vogel in 2 vols., Hamburg: Meiner, 1999.
- On Geulincx and Kant
- Cooney, Brian, ‘Arnold Geulincx: A Cartesian Idealist’, Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 16 (1978), pp. 167-180.
- English language introduction to Geulincx
- Cordingley, Anthony, ‘École Normale Supérieure’, in: Anthony Uhlmann (ed.), Samuel Beckett in Context, Cambridge: Cambridge U.P., 2013, pp. 42-52.
- On Samuel Beckett’s intellectual development during the late 1920s and early 1930s
- Dürr, Karl, ‘Die mathematische Logik des Arnold Geulincx’, The Journal of Unified Science (Erkenntnis), vol. 8 (1939-40), pp. 361-8.
- A translation of Geulincx’ logic in modern terms
- Dürr, Karl, ‘Arnold Geulincx und die klassische Logik des 17. Jahrhunderts’, Studium Generale 18 (1965-8), pp. 520-541.
- Geulincx’ logic in the context of other seventeenth-century sources in the field
- Eekhof, A., ‘De wijsgeer Arnoldus Geulincx te Leuven en te Leiden’, in Nederlandsch Archief voor Kerkgeschiedenis, new series, vol. 15 (1919), pp. 1-24.
- On the Letter of Recommendation of 3 May 1658
- Herren, Graley, ‘Working on Film and Television’, in: Anthony Uhlmann (ed.), Samuel Beckett in Context, Cambridge: Cambridge U.P., 2013, pp. 192-202.
- On Beckett’s psychology and Geulincx’ influence on his screenplays
- Kossmann, E.F., ‘De laatste woning van Arnold Geulincx’, in Bijdragen voor Vaderlandsche Geschiedenis en Oudheidkunde 7-3, pp. 136-138.
- On Geulincx’ last residence and debts
- Land, J.P.N., ‘Arnold Geulincx te Leiden (1658-1669)’, in Verslagen en Mededeelingen der Koninklijke Akademie van Wetenschappen, Afdeeling Letterkunde, 3rd series, vol. 3 (1887), pp. 277-327.
- On Geulincx’ Leuven dismissal and Leiden career
- Land, J.P.N., ‘Aanteekeningen betreffende het leven van Arnold Geulincx’, in Verslagen en Mededeelingen der Koninklijke Akademie van Wetenschappen, Afdeeling Letterkunde, 3rd series, vol. 10 (1894), pp. 99-119.
- On Geulincx’ life in Flanders
- Land, J.P.N., Arnold Geulincx und seine Philosophie. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1895.
- A Geulincx biography.
- Lattre, A. de, L’occasionalisme d’Arnold Geulincx, Paris: Les Editions de Minuit, 1967.
- Published dissertation on Geulincx’ philosophy
- McCracken, J.D, Thinking and Valuing: An Introduction, Partly Historical, to the Study of the Philosophy of Value. London: Macmillan, 1950.
- Interpretation of Descartes, Geulincx and Spinoza as a particular school of ethics
- Monchamp, Georges, Histoire du Cartésianisme en Belgique, Bruxelles et St. Trond: F. Hayez, 1886.
- An as yet unsurpassed history of Cartesianism in the Southern Netherlands
- Nadler, Steven, ‘Knowledge, Volitional Agency and Causation in Malebranche and Geulincx’, British Journal for the History of Philosophy 7 (1999-2), pp. 263-274.
- On similarities and differences between Malebranche and Geulincx
- Nuchelmans, Gabriël, Geulincx’ Containment Theory of Logic, Amsterdam: Koninklijke Nederlandse Akademie van Wetenschappen / Noord-Hollandsche Uitgevers Maatschappij, 1988.
- Detailed account of Geulincx’ use of set theory in logic
- Paquot, Jean Noël, Memoires pour servir a l’histoire litteraire des dix-sept provinces des Pays-Bas, de la principauté de Liege, et de quelque contrées voisines, vol. 13, Louvain: De l’imprimerie academique, 1768.
- Reference to Geulincx’ presumed Leuven quarrels and debts
- Pfleiderer, Edmund, Leibniz und Geulincx: Mit besonderer Beziehung auf ihr beiderseitiges Uhrengleichniss, Tübingen: Tübinger Universitäts-Schriften, 1884.
- Start of the controversy on the image of the synchronised clocks in Geulincx and Leibniz
- Renz, Ursula, and Han van Ruler, ‘Okkasionalismus’, in: Hans Jörg Sandkühler (ed.), Enzyklopädie Philosophie, Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 2010, vol. 2, pp. 1843-1846.
- On the diversity of occasionalisms
- Rousset, Bernard, Geulincx entre Descartes et Spinoza, Parijs : Vrin, 1999.
- Posthumously published monograph on Geulincx
- Ruler, Han van, ‘“Something, I know not what.” The Concept of Substance in Early Modern Thought’, in Lodi Nauta and Arjo Vanderjagt (eds.), Between Imagination and Demonstration. Essays in the History of Science and Philosophy Presented to John D. North, Leiden: Brill, 1999, pp. 365-93.
- On Geulincx, Locke and the notion of individuality in scholastic and Cartesian thought
- Ruler, Han van, ‘Geulincx, Arnold (1624-1669)’, in Wiep van Bunge, Henri Krop, Bart Leeuwenburgh, Han van Ruler, Paul Schuurman and Michiel Wielema (eds.), The Dictionary of Seventeenth and Eighteenth-Century Dutch Philosophers, in 2 vols, Bristol: Thoemmes, 2003, vol. 1, pp. 322-331.
- Extended dictionary entry on Geulincx and his works
- Ruler, Han van, ‘Geulincx and Spinoza: Books, Backgrounds and Biographies’, in Studia Spinozana 15 / Wiep van Bunge (ed.), Spinoza and Dutch Cartesianism. Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2006, pp. 89-106.
- On whether Geulincx and Spinoza knew each other or each other’s work
- Ruler, Han van, ‘Spinozas doppelter Dualismus’, transl. Andreas Fliedner, in: Deutsche Zeitschrift für Philosophie 57 (2009-3), pp. 399-417.
- On parallel forms of dualism in Geulincx and Spinoza
- Terraillon, Eugène, La morale de Geulincx dans ses rapports avec la philosophie de Descartes, Paris: Alcan, 1912.
- Short work on Geulincx’ occasionalism
- Thijssen-Schoute, C. Louise, Nederlands Cartesianisme, Amsterdam: Noord-Hollandsche Uitgevers Maatschappij, 1954; new ed. by Theo Verbeek, Utrecht: HES, 1989.
- Source book on Dutch Cartesianism
- Tucker, David, Samuel Beckett and Arnold Geulincx: Tracing ‘a literary fantasia’, London: Continuum, 2012.
- Detailed study and interpretation of all of Beckett’s references to Geulincx
- Uhlmann, Anthony, Samuel Beckett and the Philosophical Image, Cambridge: Cambridge U.P., 2006.
- On Beckett’s use of philosophical themes and their literary and philosophical impact
- Uhlmann, Anthony, Chris Conti and Andrea Curr (eds.), Arnold Geulincx Resource Site, funded by the Australia Research Council: www.geulincx.org
- A website dedicated to Geulincx research by The Beckett and Geulincx Research Project
- Uhlmann, Anthony (ed.), Samuel Beckett in Context, Cambridge: Cambridge U.P., 2013.
- A volume of articles on Beckett’s intellectual biography
- Vander Haeghen, Victor, Geulincx. Étude sur sa vie, sa philosophie et ses ouvrages, Diss. Liège, Gent: Vanderhaeghen, 1886.
- Complete intellectual biography
- Vanpaemel, Geert, Echo’s van een wetenschappelijke revolutie. De mechanistische natuurwetenschap aan de Leuvense Artesfaculteit, Brussel: KAWLSK, 1986.
- On Leuven University’s curriculum and Geulincx’ proposals for change
- Verbeek, Theo, ‘Geulincx, Arnold (1624-69)’, in Edward Craig (ed.), Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 4, Londen: Routledge, 1998, pp. 59-61.
- Concise account of Geulincx’ philosophy and its relation to Descartes
- Vleeschauwer, Herman J. de, Three Centuries of Geulincx Research, Mededelings van die Universiteit van Suid-Afrika / Communications of the University of South Africa, Pretoria 1957.
- Bibliographical outline of Geulincx-interpretations
- Vleeschauwer, Herman J. de, ‘Ha Arnold Geulincx letto il « De la Sagesse » de Pierre Charron?’, Filosofia 25 (1974-2 and 1974-4), pp. 117-134 and 373-388.
- On Charron’s De la Sagesse as a model for Geulincx’ Ethics.
J.A. van Ruler