Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Gnosticism

Gnosticism (after gnôsis, the Greek word for “knowledge” or “insight”) is the name given to a loosely organized religious and philosophical movement that flourished in the first and second centuries CE. The exact origin(s) of this school of thought cannot be traced, although it is possible to locate influences or sources as far back as the second and first centuries BCE, such as the early treatises of the Corpus Hermeticum, the Jewish Apocalyptic writings, and especially Platonic philosophy and the Hebrew Scriptures themselves.

In spite of the diverse nature of the various Gnostic sects and teachers, certain fundamental elements serve to bind these groups together under the loose heading of “Gnosticism” or “Gnosis.” Chief among these elements is a certain manner of “anti-cosmic world rejection” that has often been mistaken for mere dualism. According to the Gnostics, this world, the material cosmos, is the result of a primordial error on the part of a supra-cosmic, supremely divine being, usually called Sophia (Wisdom) or simply the Logos. This being is described as the final emanation of a divine hierarchy, called the Plêrôma or “Fullness,” at the head of which resides the supreme God, the One beyond Being. The error of Sophia, which is usually identified as a reckless desire to know the transcendent God, leads to the hypostatization of her desire in the form of a semi-divine and essentially ignorant creature known as the Demiurge (Greek: dêmiourgos, “craftsman”), or Ialdabaoth, who is responsible for the formation of the material cosmos. This act of craftsmanship is actually an imitation of the realm of the Pleroma, but the Demiurge is ignorant of this, and hubristically declares himself the only existing God. At this point, the Gnostic revisionary critique of the Hebrew Scriptures begins, as well as the general rejection of this world as a product of error and ignorance, and the positing of a higher world, to which the human soul will eventually return. However, when all is said and done, one finds that the error of Sophia and the begetting of the inferior cosmos are occurrences that follow a certain law of necessity, and that the so-called “dualism” of the divine and the earthly is really a reflection and expression of the defining tension that constitutes the being of humanity—the human being.

Table of Contents

  1. The Philosophical Character of Gnosticism
    1. Psychology
    2. Existentialism
    3. Hermeneutics
      1. Reception and Revelation
  2. The Gnostic Mytho-Logos
    1. The Myth of Sophia
    2. Christian Gnosticism
      1. Basilides
      2. Marcion
      3. Valentinus and the Valentinian School
        1. The System of Ptolemy
    3. Mani and Manichaeism
  3. Platonism and Gnosticism
    1. Numenius of Apamea and Neo-Platonism
  4. Concluding Summary
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Sources
    2. Suggestions for Further Reading

1. The Philosophical Character of Gnosticism

Gnosticism, as an intellectual product, is grounded firmly in the general human act of reflecting upon existence. The Gnostics were concerned with the basic questions of existence or “being-in-the-world” (Dasein)—that is: who we are (as human beings), where we have come from, and where we are heading, historically and spiritually (cf. Hans Jonas, The Gnostic Religion 1958, p. 334). These questions lie at the very root of philosophical thinking; but the answers provided by the Gnostics go beyond philosophical speculation toward the realm of religious doctrine and mysticism. However, it is impossible to understand fully the meaning of Gnosticism without beginning at the philosophical level, and orienting oneself accordingly. Since any orientation toward an ancient phenomenon must always proceed by way of contemporary ideas and habits of mind, an interpretative discussion of Gnostic thinking as it applies to Psychology, Existentialism, and Hermeneutics, is not amiss here. Once we have understood, to the extent of our ability, the philosophical import of Gnostic ideas, and how they relate to contemporary philosophical issues, then we may enter into the historical milieu of the Gnostics with some degree of confidence—a confidence devoid, to the extent that this is possible, of tainting exegetical presuppositions.

a. Psychology

Who are we? The answer to this question involves an account (logos) of the nature of the soul (psukhê or psyche); and the attempt to provide an answer has accordingly been dubbed the science or practice of “psychology”—an account of the soul or mind (psukhê, in ancient Greek, denoted both soul, as the principle of life, and mind, as the principle of intellect). Carl Jung, drawing upon Gnostic mythical schemas, identified the objectively oriented consciousness with the material or “fleshly” part of humankind—that is, with the part of the human being that is, according to the Gnostics, bound up in the cosmic cycle of generation and decay, and subject to the bonds of fate and time (cf. Apocryphon of John [Codex II] 28:30). The human being who identifies him/herself with the objectively existing world comes to construct a personality, a sense of self, that is, at base, fully dependent upon the ever-changing structures of temporal existence. The resulting lack of any sense of of permanence, of autonomy, leads such an individual to experience anxieties of all kinds, and eventually to shun the mysterious and collectively meaningful patterns of human existence in favor of a private and stifling subjective context, in the confines of which life plays itself out in the absence of any reference to a greater plan or scheme. Hopelessness, atheism, despair, are the results of such an existence. This is not the natural end of the human being, though; for, according to Jung (and the Gnostics) the temporally constructed self is not the true self. The true self is the supreme consciousness existing and persisting beyond all space and time. Jung calls this the pure consciousness or Self, in contradistinction to the “ego consciousness” which is the temporally constructed and maintained form of a discrete existent (cf. C.G. Jung, “Gnostic Symbols of the Self,” in The Gnostic Jung 1992, pp. 55-92). This latter form of “worldly” consciousness the Gnostics identified with soul (psukhê), while the pure or true Self they identified with spirit (pneuma)—that is, mind relieved of its temporal contacts and context. This distinction had an important career in Gnostic thought, and was adopted by St. Paul, most notably in his doctrine of the spiritual resurrection (1 Corinthians 15:44). The psychological or empirical basis of this view, which soon turns into a metaphysical or onto-theological attitude, is the recognized inability of the human mind to achieve its grandest designs while remaining subject to the rigid law and order of a disinterested and aloof cosmos. The spirit-soul distinction (which of course translates into, or perhaps presupposes, the more fundamental mind-body distinction) marks the beginning of a transcendentalist and soteriological attitude toward the cosmos and temporal existence in general.

b. Existentialism

The basic experience of existence, described by the philosophy that has become known as “Existentialism,” involves a general feeling of loneliness or abandonment (Geworfenheit, “having been thrown”) in/to a world that is not amenable to the primordial desires of the human being (cf. Jonas, p. 336). The recognition that the first or primal desire of the human being is for the actualization or positing of a concrete self or “I” (an autonomous and discrete individual existing and persisting amidst the flux and flow of temporal and external “reality”) leads to the disturbing realization that this world is not akin to the human being; for this world (so it seems) follows it own course, a course already mapped out and set in motion long before the advent of human consciousness. Furthermore, that the essential activity of the human being—that is, to actualize an autonomous self within the world—is carried out in opposition to a power or “will” (the force of nature) that always seems to thwart or subvert this supremely human endeavor, leads to the acknowledgment of an anti-human and therefore anti-intellectual power; and this power, since it seems to act, must also exist. However, the fact that its act does not manifest itself as a communication between humanity and nature (or pure objectivity), but rather as a mechanical process of blind necessity occurring apart from the human endeavor, places the human being in a superior position. For even though the force of nature may arbitrarily wipe out an individual human existent, just as easily as it brings one into existence, this natural force is not conscious of its activity. The human mind, on the other hand, is. And so a gap or fissure—a product of reflection—is set up, by which the human being may come to orient him/herself with and toward the world in which s/he exists and persists, for a brief moment. Martin Heidegger has described this brief moment of orientation with/in (toward) the world as “care” (Sorge), which is always a care or concern for the “moment” (Augenblick) within which all existence occurs; this “care” is understood as the product of humankind’s recognition of their unavoidable being-toward-death. But this orientation is never completed, since the human soul finds that it cannot achieve its purpose or complete actualization within the confines set by nature.

While the thwarting necessity of nature is, for the Existentialist, a simple, unquestioned fact; for the Gnostics it is the result of the malignant designs of an inferior god, the Demiurge, carried out through and by this ignorant deity’s own law. In other words, nature is, for modern Existentialism, merely indifferent, while for the Gnostics it was actively hostile toward the human endeavor. “[C]osmic law, once worshipped as the expression of a reason with which man’s reason can communicate in the act of cognition, is now seen only in its aspect of compulsion which thwarts man’s freedom” (Jonas, p. 328). Time and history come to be understood as the provenance of the human mind, over-against futile idealistic constructions like law and order, nomos and cosmos. Knowledge, at this point, becomes a concrete endeavor—a self-salvific task for the human race.

Becoming aware of itself, the self also discovers that it is not really its own, but is rather the involuntary executor of cosmic designs. Knowledge, gnosis, may liberate man from this servitude; but since the cosmos is contrary to life and to spirit, the saving knowledge cannot aim at integration into the cosmic whole and at compliance with its laws. For the Gnostics … man’s alienation from the world is to be deepened and brought to a head, for the extrication of the inner self which only thus can gain itself (Jonas, p. 329).

The obvious question, then—Where did we come from? – only becomes intelligible alongside and within the more dynamic question of Where are we heading?

c. Hermeneutics

In the context of ancient Greek thinking, hermêneia was usually associated with tekhnê, giving us the tekhnê hermêneutikê or “art of interpretation” discussed by Aristotle in his treatise De Interpretatione [Peri Hermêneias]. Interpretation or hermeneutics, according to Aristotle, does not bring us to a direct knowledge of the meaning of things, but only to an understanding of how things come to appear before us, and thereby to provide us with an avenue toward empirical knowledge, as it were.

Moreover, discourse is hermêneia because a discursive statement is a grasp of the real by meaningful expression, not a selection of so-called impressions coming from the things themselves (Paul Ricoeur, The Conflict of Interpretations 1974, p. 4).

In this sense, we may say that the “art of interpretation” is a distinctly historical method of understanding or coming to terms with reality. In other words, since our “expression” is always an ex-position, a going-out from the given forms or patterns of reality toward a living use of these forms with/in Life, then we, as human beings persisting in a realm of becoming, are responsible, in the last analysis, not for any eternal truths or “things in themselves,” but only for the forms these things take on within the context of a living and thinking existence. Knowledge or understanding, then, is not of immutable and eternal things in themselves, but rather of the process by which things—that is, ideas, objects, events, persons, etc.—become revealed within the existential or ontological process of coming-to-know. The attention to process and the emergence of meaning occurs on the most immediate experiential level of human existence, and therefore contains about it nothing of the metaphysical. However, the birth of metaphysics may be located within this primordial or phenomenal structure of basic “brute” experience; for it is the natural tendency of the human mind to order and arrange its data according to rational principles.

The question will inevitably arise, though, as to whence these rational principles derive: are they a derivative product of the phenomenal realm of experience? or are they somehow endemic to the human mind as such, and hence eternal? If we take the first question as an answer, we are led to phenomenology, which “discovers, in place of an idealist subject locked within [a] system of meanings, a living being which from all time has, as the horizon of all its intentions, a world, the world” (Ricoeur, p. 9). According to the general contemporary or “post-modern” formulation, such a “living being” is directed, intentionally, always and only toward a multiplicitous world or realm in which human activity itself becomes the sole object of knowledge, apart from any “transcendent” metaphysical ideals or schemas. For the Gnostics, on the other hand, who worked within and upon the latter question, giving it a positive, if somewhat mytho-poetical answer, rational principles, which seem to be culled from a mere contact with sensible reality, are held to be reminders of a unified existence that is an eternal possibility, open to anyone capable of transcending and, indeed, transgressing this realm of experience and process —that is, of history. This “transgression” consists in the act of balancing oneself with/in, and orienting oneself toward, history as an interplay of past and present, in which the individual is poised for a decision—either to succumb to the flux and flow of an essentially decentered cosmic existence, or to strive for a re-integration into a godhead that is only barely recollected, and more obscure than the immediate perceptions of reality.

i. Reception and Revelation

Where are we heading? This question is at the very heart of Gnostic exegesis, and indeed colors and directs all attempts at coming to terms, not only with the Hebrew Scriptures, which served as the main text of Gnostic interpretation, but with existence in general.

The standard hermeneutical approach, both in our own era, and in Late Hellenistic times, is the receptive approach—that is, an engagement with texts of the past governed by the belief, on the part of the interpreter, that these texts have something to teach us. Whether we struggle to overcome our own “prejudices” or presuppositions, which are the inevitable result of our belonging to a particular tradition by way of the hermeneutical act (Gadamer), or allow our prejudices to shape our reading of a text, in an act of “creative misprision” (Bloom) we are still acknowledging, in some way, our debt to or dependence upon the text with which we are engaged. The Gnostics, in their reading of Scripture, acknowledged no such debt; for they believed that the Hebrew Bible was the written revelation of an inferior creator god (dêmiourgos), filled with lies intended to cloud the minds and judgment of the spiritual human beings (pneumatikoi) whom this Demiurge was intent on enslaving in his material cosmos.

Indeed, while the receptive hermeneutical method implies that we have something to learn from a text, the method employed by the Gnostics, which we may call the “revelatory” method, was founded upon the idea that they (the Gnostics) had received a supra-cosmic revelation, either in the form of a “call,” or a vision, or even, perhaps, through the exercise of philosophical dialectic. This “revelation” was the knowledge (gnôsis) that humankind is alien to this realm, and possesses a “home on high” within the plêrôma, the “Fullness,” where all the rational desires of the human mind come to full and perfect fruition. On this belief, all knowledge belonged to these Gnostics, and any interpretation of the biblical text would be for the purpose of explaining the true nature of things by elucidating the errors and distortions of the Demiurge. This approach treated the past as something already overcome yet still “present,” insofar as certain members of the human race were still laboring under the old law—that is, were still reading the Scriptures in the receptive manner. The Gnostic, insofar as he still remained within the world, as an existing being, was, on the other hand, both present and future. That is to say, the Gnostic embodied within himself the salvific dynamism of a history that had broken from the constraint of a tyrannical past, and found the freedom to invent itself anew. The Gnostic understood himself to be at once at the center and at the end or culmination of this history, and this idea or ideal was reflected most powerfully in ancient Gnostic exegesis. We must now turn to a discussion of the concrete results of this hermeneutical method.

2. The Gnostic Mytho-Logos

The Gnostic Idea or Notion was not informed by a philosophical world-view or procedure. Rather, the Gnostic vision of the world was based upon the intuition of a radical and seemingly irreparable rupture between the realm of experience (pathos) and the realm of true Being—that is, existence in its positive, creative, or authentic aspect.

The problem faced by the Gnostics was how to explain such a radical, pre-philosophical intuition. This intuition is “pre-philosophical” because the brute experience of existing in a world that is alien to humankind’s aspirations may submit itself to a variety of interpretations. And the attempt at an interpretation may take on the form of either muthos or logos—either a merely descriptive rendering of the experience, or a rationally ordered account of such an experience, including an explanation of its origins. The ancient Greek explanation of this experience was to call it a primal “awe” or “wonder” felt by the human being as he faces the world that stands so radically apart from him, and to posit this experience as the beginning of philosophy (cf. Aristotle, Metaphysics 982b 10-25 and Plato, Theaetetus 155d). But the Gnostics recognized this “awe” as the product of a radical disruption of the harmony of a realm persisting beyond becoming—that is, beyond “becoming” in the sense of pathos, or “that which is undergone.” The muthos always corresponds to the “first-hand” account rendered by one who has undergone, immediately, the effect of a certain event. The myth is always an explanation of something already known, and therefore carries its truth-claim along with it, just as the immediacy of an event forbids any doubt or questioning on the part of the one undergoing it. The logos, on the other hand, is the product of a careful reflection (dianoia), and refers, for its truth-value, not to the immediate moment of “grasping” a phenomenon (prolêpsis), but to the moment of reflection during which one attains a conceptual knowledge of the phenomenon, and first comes to “know” it as such—this is gnôsis: insight. The direct result of this gnôsis is the emergence from the sense of existence as pathos, to the actuality of being as aisthêsis—that is, reception and judgment of experience by way of purely rational or divine criteria. Such criteria proceeds directly from the logos, or divine “ordering principle,” to which the Gnostics believed themselves to be related, by way of a divine genealogy. Although Gnostic onto-theology proceeds by way of an elaborate myth, it is a myth informed always by the logos, and is, in this sense, a true mythology—that is, a rendering, in the immediacy of language, of that which is ever-present (to the Gnostic) as a product of privileged reflection.

a. The Myth of Sophia

According to Gnostic mythology (in general) We, humanity, are existing in this realm because a member of the transcendent godhead, Sophia (Wisdom), desired to actualize her innate potential for creativity without the approval of her partner or divine consort. Her hubris, in this regard, stood forth as raw materiality, and her desire, which was for the mysterious ineffable Father, manifested itself as Ialdabaoth, the Demiurge, that renegade principle of generation and corruption which, by its unalterable necessity, brings all beings to life, for a brief moment, and then to death for eternity. However, since even the Pleroma itself is not, according to the Gnostics, exempt from desire or passion, there must come into play a salvific event or savior—that is, Christ, the Logos, the “messenger,” etc.—who descends to the material realm for the purpose of negating all passion, and raising the innocent human “sparks” (which fell from Sophia) back up to the Pleroma (cf. Apocryphon of John [Codex II] 9:25-25:14 ff.).

This process of re-integration with/in the godhead is one of the basic features of the Gnostic myth. The purpose of this re-integration (implicitly) is to establish a series of existents that are ontologically posterior to Sophia, and are the concrete embodiment of her “disruptive” desire—within the unified arena of the Pleroma. Indeed, if the Pleroma is really the Fullness, containing all things, it must contain the manifold principles of Wisdom’s longing. In this sense, we must not view Gnostic salvation as a simply one-sided affair. The divine “sparks” that fell from Sophia, during her “passion,” are un-integrated aspects of the godhead. We may say, then, that in the Hegelian sense the Gnostic Supreme God is seeking, eternally, His own actualization by way of full self-consciousness (cf. G.W.F. Hegel, History of Philosophy vol. 2, pp. 396-399).

But it is not really this simple. The Supreme God of the Gnostics effortlessly generates the Pleroma, and yet (or for this very reason!) this Pleroma comes to act independently of the Father. This is because all members of the Pleroma (known as Aeons) are themselves “roots and springs and fathers” (Tripartite Tractate 68:10) carrying Time within themselves, as a condition of their Being. When the disruption, brought about by the desire of Sophia, disturbed the Pleroma, this was not understood as a disturbance of an already established unity, but rather as the disturbance of an insupportable stasis that had come to be observed as divine. Indeed, when the Greeks first looked to the sky and admired the regularity of the rotations of the stars and planets, what they were admiring, according to the Gnostics, was not the image of divinity, but the image or representation of a “divine” stagnancy, a law and order that stifled freedom, which is the root of desire (cf. Jonas, pp. 260-261). The passion of Sophia—her production of the Demiurge, his enslavement of the human “sparks” in the material cosmos, and the subsequent redemption and restoration—are but one episode in the infinite, unfolding drama of spiritual existence. We, as human beings, just happen to be the unwitting victims of this particular drama. But if, as the Gnostics hold, our salvation consists in our becoming gods (Poimandres 26) or “lord[s] over creation and all corruption” (Valentinus, Fragment F, Layton) then how are we to be confident that, in ages to come, one of us will not give birth to another damned cosmos, just as Sophia had done?

b. Christian Gnosticism

The Christian idea that God has sent his only “Son” (the Logos) to suffer and die for the sins of all humankind, and so make possible the salvation of all, had a deep impact on Gnostic thought. In the extensive and important collection of Gnostic writings discovered at Nag Hammadi, Egypt in 1945, only a handful present the possibility of having originated in a pre-Christian, mostly Hellenistic Jewish milieu. The majority of these texts are Christian Gnostic writings from the early second to late third centuries CE, and perhaps a bit later. When we consider the notion of salvation and its meaning for the early Gnostics, who stressed the creative aspect of our post-salvific existence, we are struck by the bold assertion that our need for salvation arose, in the first place, from an error committed by a divine being, Sophia (Wisdom), during the course of her own creative act (cf. Apocryphon of John [Codex II] 9:25-10:6). Since this is the case, how, we are led to ask, will our post-salvation existence be any less prone to error or ignorance, even evil? The radical message of early Christianity provided the answer to this problematical question; and so the Gnostics took up the Christian idea and transformed it, by the power of their singular mytho-logical technique, into a philosophically and theologically complex speculative schema.

i. Basilides

The Christian philosopher Basilides of Alexandria (fl. 132-135 CE) developed a cosmology and cosmogony quite distinct from the Sophia myth of classical Gnosticism, and also reinterpreted key Christian concepts by way of the popular Stoic philosophy of the era. Basilides began his system with a “primal octet” consisting of the “unengendered parent” or Father; Intellect (nous); the “ordering principle” or “Word” (logos); “prudence” (phronêsis); Wisdom (sophia); Power (dunamis) (Irenaeus, Against Heresies 1.24.3, in Layton, The Gnostic Scriptures 1987) and “justice” and “peace” (Basilides, Fragment A, Layton). Through the union of Wisdom and Power, a group of angelic rulers came into existence, and from these rulers a total of 365 heavens or aeons were generated (Irenaeus 1.24.3). Each heaven had its own chief ruler (arkhôn), and numerous lesser angels. The final heaven, which Basilides claimed is the realm of matter in which we all dwell, was said by him to be ruled by “the god of the Jews,” who favored the Jewish nation over all others, and so caused all manner of strife for the nations that came into contact with them—as well as for the Jewish people themselves. This behavior caused the rulers of the other 364 heavens to oppose the god of the Jews, and to send a savior, Jesus Christ, from the highest realm of the Father, to rescue the human beings who are struggling under the yoke of this jealous god (Irenaeus 1.24.4). Since the realm of matter is the sole provenance of this spiteful god, Basilides finds nothing of value in it, and states that “[s]alvation belongs only to the soul; the body is by nature corruptible” (Irenaeus 1.24.5). He even goes so far as to declare, contra Christian orthodoxy, that Christ’s death on the cross was only apparent, and did not actually occur “in the flesh” (Irenaeus 1.24.4)—this doctrine came to be called docetism.

The notion that material existence is the product of a jealous and corrupt creator god, who favors one race over all others, is really the “mythical” expression of a deeply rooted ethical belief that the source of all evil is material or bodily existence. Indeed, Basilides goes so far as to assert that sin is the direct outcome of bodily existence, and that human suffering is the punishment either for actual sins committed, or even just for the general inclination to sin, which arises from the bodily impulses (cf. Fragments F and G). In an adaptation of Stoic ethical categories, Basilides declares that faith (pistis) “is not the rational assent of a soul possessing free will” (Fragment C); rather, faith is the natural mode of existence, and consequently, anyone living in accordance with the “law of nature” (pronoia), which Basilides calls the “kingdom,” will remain free from the bodily impulses, and exist in a state of “salvation” (Fragment C). However, Basilides goes beyond simple Stoic doctrine in his belief that the “elect,” that is, those who exist by faith, “are alien to the world, as if they were transcendent by nature” (Fragment E); for unlike the Stoics, who believed in a single, material cosmos, Basilides held the view, as we have seen, that the cosmos is composed of numerous heavens, with the material realm as the final heaven, and consequently corrupt. Since this final heaven represents the “last gasp” of divine emanation, as it were, and is by no means a perfect image of true divinity, adherence to its laws can lead to no good. Further, since the body is the means by which the ruler of this material cosmos enforces his law, freedom can only be attained by abandoning or “becoming indifferent to” all bodily impulses and desires. This indifference (adiaphoria) to bodily impulses, however, does not lead to a simple stagnant asceticism. Basilides does not call upon his hearers to abandon the material realm only to dissolve into negativity; instead, he offers them a new life, by appealing to the grand hierarchy of rulers persisting above the material realm (cf. Fragment D). When one turns to the greater hierarchy of Being, there results a “creation of good things” (Fragment C, translation modified). Love and personal creation—the begetting of the Good—are the final result of Basilides’ vaguely dialectical system, and for this reason it is one of the most important early expressions of a truly Christian, if not “orthodox,” philosophy.

ii. Marcion

Marcion of Sinope, in Pontus, was a contemporary of Basilides. According to Tertullian, he started his career as an orthodox Christian—whatever that meant at such an early stage of development of Christian doctrine—but soon formulated the remarkable and radical doctrine that was to lead to his excommunication from the Roman Church in July 144 CE, the traditional date of the founding of the Marcionite Church (Tertullian, Against Marcion 1.1; cf. Kurt Rudolph, Gnosis 1984, p. 314). The teaching of Marcion is elegantly simple: “the God proclaimed by the law and the prophets is not the Father of Our Lord Jesus Christ. The God (of the Old Testament) is known, but the latter (the Father of Jesus Christ) is unknown. The one is just, but the other is good” (Irenaeus 1.27.1). Marcion believed that this cosmos in which we live bears witness to the existence of an inflexible, legalistic, and sometimes spiteful and vengeful God. This view arose from a quite literal reading of the Old Testament, which does contain several passages describing God in terms not quite conducive to divinity—or at least to the idea of the divine that was current in the Hellenistic era. Marcion then, following Paul (in Romans 1:20) declared that God is knowable through His creation; however, unlike Paul, Marcion did not take this “natural revelation” as evidence of God’s singularity and goodness. Quite the contrary, Marcion believed that he knew the God of this realm all too well, and that He was not worthy of the devotion and obedience that He demanded. Therefore, Marcion rejected the teaching of the orthodox Christian Church of his era, that Yahweh (or Jehovah) is the Father of Christ, and, through a creative excision of what he termed “Judaistic interpolations” in Luke and ten Pauline Epistles, Marcion simultaneously put forth his notion of the “alien God” and His act of salvation, and established the first Canon of Scripture used in a “Christian” Church (Jonas, pp. 145-146).

Marcion was not a philosopher in the sense that term has come to imply. He never developed, as far as we can tell from the surviving evidence, a systematic metaphysical, cosmological, or anthropological theory in the manner of a Basilides or a Valentinus (whom we shall discuss below), nor did he appeal to history as a witness for his doctrines. This latter point is the most important. Unlike the majority of Gnostics, who elaborated some sort of divine genealogy (e.g., the Sophia myth) to account for the presence of corruption and strife in the world, Marcion simply posited two opposed and irreducible Gods: the biblical god, and the unknown or “alien” God, who is the Father of Christ. According to Marcion, the god who controls this realm is a being who is intent on preserving his autonomy and power even at the expense of the (human) beings whom he created. The “alien” God, who is the Supremely Good, is a “god of injection,” for he enters this realm from outside, in order to gratuitously adopt the pitiful human beings who remain under the sway of the inferior god as His own children. This act is the origin of and reason for the Incarnation of Christ, according to Marcion.

In spite of the absence of any solid philosophical or theological foundation for this rather simple formulation, Marcion’s idea nevertheless expresses, in a somewhat crude and immediate form, a basic truth of human existence: that the desires of the Mind are incommensurable with the nature of material existence (cf. Irenaeus 1.27.2-3). Yet, if we follow Marcion’s argument to its logical (or perhaps “anti-logical”) conclusion, we discover an existential expression (not a philosophy) of the primal feeling of “abandonment” (Geworfenheit). This expression plays upon the subtle yet poignant opposition of “love of wisdom” (philosophia) and “complete wisdom” (plêrosophia). We are alone in a world that does not lend itself to our quest for unalterable truth, and so we befriend wisdom, which is the way of or manner in which we attain this intuited truth. According to Marcion, this truth is not to be found in this world—all that is to be found is the desire for this truth, which arises amongst human beings. However, since this desire, on the part of human beings, only produces various philosophies, none of which can hold claim to the absolute truth, Marcion concludes that the noetic beings (humans) of this realm are capable of nothing more than a shadow of wisdom. It is only by way of the guidance and grace of an alien and purely good God that humankind will rise to the level of plêrosophia or complete wisdom (cf. Colossians 2:2 ff.). Moreover, instead of attempting to discover the historical connection between the revelation of Christ and the teachings of the Old Testament, Marcion simply rejected the latter in favor of the former, on the belief that only the Gospel (thoughtfully edited by Marcion himself) points us toward complete wisdom (Irenaeus 1.27.2-3; Tertullian, Against Marcion 4.3).

While other Christian thinkers of the era were busy allegorizing the Old Testament in order to bring it into line with New Testament teaching, Marcion allowed the New Testament (albeit in his own special version) to speak to him as a singular voice of authority—and he formulated his doctrine accordingly. This doctrine emphasized not only humankind’s radical alienation from the realm of their birth, but also their lack of any genealogical relation to the God who sacrificed His own Son to save them—in other words, Marcion painted a picture of humanity as a race displaced, with no true home at all (cf. Giovanni Filoramo, A History of Gnosticism 1992, p. 164). The hope of searching for a lost home, or of returning to a home from which one has been turned out, was absent in the doctrine of Marcion. Like Pico della Mirandola, Marcion declared the nature of humankind to be that of an eternally intermediate entity, poised precariously between heaven and earth (cp. Pico della Mirandola, Oration on the Dignity of Man, 3). However, unlike Pico, Marcion called for a radical displacement of humankind—a “rupture”—in which humanity would awaken to its full (if not innate) possibilities.

iii. Valentinus and the Valentinian School

The great Christian teacher and philosopher Valentinus (ca. 100-175 CE) spent his formative years in Alexandria, where he probably came into contact with Basilides. Valentinus later went to Rome, where he began his public teaching career, which was so successful that he actually had a serious chance of being elected Bishop of Rome. He lost the election, however, and with it Gnosticism lost the chance of becoming synonymous with Christianity, and hence a world religion. This is not to say that Valentinus failed to influence the development of Christian theology—he most certainly did, as we shall see below. It was through Valentinus, perhaps more than any other Christian thinker of his time, that Platonic philosophy, rhetorical elegance, and a deep, interpretive knowledge of scripture became introduced together into the realm of Christian theology. The achievement of Valentinus remained unmatched for nearly a century, until the incomparable Origen came on the scene. Yet even then, it may not be amiss to suggest that Origen never would have “happened” had it not been for the example of Valentinus.

The cosmology of Valentinus began, not with a unity, but with a primal duality, a dyad, composed of two entities called “the Ineffable” and “Silence.” From these initial beings a second dyad of “Parent” and “Truth” was generated. These beings finally engendered a quaternity of “Word” (logos), “Life” (zôê), “Human Being” (anthropos), and “Church” (ekklêsia). Valentinus refers to this divine collectivity as the “first octet” (Irenaeus 1.11.1). This octet produced several other beings, one of which revolted or “turned away,” as Irenaeus tells us, and set in motion the divine drama that would eventually produce the cosmos. According to Irenaeus, who was writing only about five years after the death of Valentinus, and in whose treatise Against Heresies the outline of Valentinus’ cosmology is preserved, the entity responsible for initiating the drama is referred to simply as “the mother,” by which is probably meant Sophia (Wisdom). From this “mother” both matter (hulê) and the savior, Christ, were generated. The realm of matter is described as a “shadow,” produced from the “mother,” and from which Christ distanced himself and “hastened up into the fullness” (Irenaeus 1.11.1; cp. Poimandres 5). At this point the “mother” produced another “child,” the “craftsman” (dêmiourgos) responsible for the creation of the cosmos. In the account preserved by Irenaeus, we are told nothing of any cosmic drama in which “divine sparks” are trapped in fleshly bodies through the designs of the Demiurge. However, it is to be assumed that Valentinus did expound an anthropology similar to that of the classical Sophia myth (as represented, for example, in the Apocryphon of John; cf. also The Hypostasis of the Archons, and the Apocalypse of Adam), especially since his school, as represented most significantly by his star pupil Ptolemy (see below), came to develop a highly complex anthropological myth that must have grown out of a simpler model provided by Valentinus himself. The account preserved in Irenaeus ends with a description of a somewhat confused doctrine of a heavenly and an earthly Christ, and a brief passage on the role of the Holy Spirit (Irenaeus 1.11.1). From this one gets the idea that Valentinus was flirting with a primitive doctrine of the Trinity. Indeed, according to the fourth century theologian Marcellus of Ancyra, Valentinus was “the first to devise the notion of three subsistent entities (hypostases), in a work that he entitled On the Three Natures” (Valentinus, Fragment B, Layton).

Valentinus was certainly the most overtly Christian of the Gnostic philosophers of his era. We have seen how the thought of Basilides was pervaded by a Stoicizing tendency, and how Marcion felt the need to go beyond scripture to posit an “alien” redeemer God. Valentinus, on the other hand, seems to have been informed, in his speculations, primarily by Jewish and Christian scripture and exegesis, and only secondarily by “pagan” philosophy, particularly Platonism. This is most pronounced in his particular version of the familiar theological notion of “election” or “pre-destination,” in which it is declared (following Paul in Romans 8:29) that God chose certain individuals, before the beginning of time, for salvation. Valentinus writes, in what is probably a remnant of a sermon:

From the beginning you [the "elect" or Gnostic Christians] have been immortal, and you are children of eternal life. And you wanted death to be allocated to yourselves so that you might spend it and use it up, and that death might die in you and through you. For when you nullify the world and are not yourselves annihilated, you are lord over creation and all corruption (Valentinus, Fragment F).

This seems to be Valentinus’ response to the dilemma of the permanence of salvation: since Sophia or the divine “mother,” a member of the Pleroma, had fallen into error, how can we be sure that we will not make the same or a similar mistake after we have reached the fullness? By declaring that it is the role and task of the “elect” or Gnostic Christian to use up death and nullify the world, Valentinus is making clear his position that these elite souls are fellow saviors of the world, along with Jesus, who was the first to take on the sin and corruption inherent in the material realm (cf. Irenaeus 1.11.1; and Layton p. 240). Therefore, since “the wages of sin is death” (Romans 6:23), any being who is capable of destroying death must be incapable of sin. For Valentinus, then, the individual who is predestined for salvation is also predestined for a sort of divine stewardship that involves an active hand in history, and not a mere repose with God, or even a blissful existence of loving creation, as Basilides held. Like Paul, Valentinus demanded that his hearers recognize their createdness. However, unlike Paul, they recognized their creator as the “Ineffable Parent,” and not as the God of the Hebrew Scriptures. The task of Christian hermeneutics after Valentinus was to prove the continuity of the Old and New Testament. In this regard, as well as in the general spirituality of his teaching—not to mention his primitive trinitarian doctrine—Valentinus had an incalculable impact on the development of Christianity.

1) The System of Ptolemy

Ptolemy (or Ptolemaeus, fl. 140 CE) was described by St. Irenaeus as “the blossom of Valentinus’ school” (Layton, p. 276). We know next to nothing about his life, except the two writings that have come down to us: the elaborate Valentinian philosophical myth preserved in Irenaeus, and Ptolemy’s Epistle to Flora, preserved verbatim by St. Epiphanius. In the former we are met with a grand elaboration, by Ptolemy, of Valentinus’ own system, which contains a complex anthropological myth centering around the passion of Sophia. We also find, in both the myth and the Epistle, Ptolemy making an attempt to bring Hebrew Scripture into line with Gnostic teaching and New Testament allegorization in a manner heretofore unprecedented among the Gnostics.

In the system of Ptolemy we are explicitly told that the cause of Sophia’s fall was her desire to know the ineffable Father. Since the purpose of the Father’s generating of the Aeons (of which Sophia was the last) was to “elevate all of them into thought” (Irenaeus 1.2.1) it was not permitted for any Aeon to attain a full knowledge of the Father. The purpose of the Pleroma was to exist as a living, collective expression of the intellectual magnitude of the Father, and if any single being within the Pleroma were to attain to the Father, all life would cease. This idea is based on an essentially positive attitude toward existence—that is, existence understood in the sense of striving, not for a reposeful end, but for an ever-increasing degree of creative or “constitutive” insight. The goal, on this view, is to produce through wisdom, and not simply to attain wisdom as an object or end in itself. Such an existence is not characterized by desire for an object, but rather by desire for the ability to persist in creative, constitutive engagement with/in one’s own “circumstance” (circumscribed stance or individual arena). When Sophia desired to know the Father, then, what she was desiring was her own dissolution in favor of an envelopment in that which made her existence possible in the first place. This amounted to a rejection of the gift of the Father—that is, of the gift of individual existence and life. It is for this reason that Sophia was not permitted to know the Father, but was turned back by the “boundary” (horos) that separates the Pleroma from the “ineffable magnitude” of the Father (Irenaeus 1.2.2).

The remainder of Ptolemy’s account is concerned with the production of the material cosmos out of the hypostatized “passions” of Sophia, and the activity of the Savior (Jesus Christ) in arranging these initially chaotic passions into a structured hierarchy of existents (Irenaeus 1.4.5 ff., and cp. Colossians 1:16). Three classes of human beings come into existence through this arrangement: the “material” (hulikos), the “animate” (psukhikos), and the “spiritual” (pneumatikos). The “material” humans are those who have not attained to intellectual life, and so place their hopes only upon that which is perishable—for these there is no hope of salvation. The “animate” are those who have only a half-formed conception of the true God, and so must live a life devoted to holy works, and persistence in faith; according to Ptolemy, these are the “ordinary” Christians. Finally, there are the “spiritual” humans, the Gnostics, who need no faith, since they have actual knowledge (gnôsis) of intellectual reality, and are thus saved by nature (Irenaeus 1.6.2, 1.6.4). The Valentinian-Ptolemaic notion of salvation rests on the idea that the cosmos is the concrete manifestation or hypostatization of the desire of Sophia for knowledge of the Father, and the “passions” her failure produced. The history of salvation, then, for human beings, has the character of an external manifestation of the threefold process of Sophia’s own redemption: recognition of her passion; her consequent “turning back” (epistrophê); and finally, her act of spiritual production, whence arose Gnostic humanity (cf. Irenaeus 1.5.1). Salvation, then, in its final form, must imply a sort of spiritual creation on the part of the Gnostics who attain the Pleroma. The “animate” humans, however, who are composed partly of corruptible matter and partly of the spiritual essence, must remain content with a simple restful existence with the craftsman of the cosmos, since no material element can enter the Pleroma (Irenaeus 1.7.1).

In his Epistle to Flora (in Epiphanius 33.3.1-33.7.10), which is an attempt to convert an “ordinary” Christian woman to his brand of Valentinian Christianity, Ptolemy clearly formulates his doctrine of the relation between the God of the Hebrew Scriptures, who is merely “just,” and the Ineffable Father, who is the Supreme Good. Rather than simply declaring these two gods to be unrelated, as did Marcion, Ptolemy develops a complex, allegorical reading of the Hebrew Scriptures in relation to the New Testament in order to establish a genealogy connecting the Pleroma, Sophia and her “passion,” the Demiurge, and the salvific activity of Jesus Christ. The scope and rigor of Ptolemy’s work, and the influence it came to exercise on emerging Christian orthodoxy, qualifies him as one of the most important of the early Christian theologians, both proto-orthodox and “heretical.”

c. Mani and Manichaeism

The world religion founded by Mani (216-276 CE) and known to history as Manichaeism has its roots in the East, borrowing elements from Persian dualistic religion (Zoroastrianism), Jewish Christianity, Buddhism, and even Mithraism. The system developed by Mani was self-consciously syncretistic, which was a natural outgrowth of his desire to see his religion reach the ends of the earth. This desire was fulfilled, and until the late Middle Ages, Manichaeism remained a world religion, stretching from China to Western Europe. It is now completely extinct. The religion began when its founder experienced a series of visions, in which the Holy Spirit supposedly appeared to him, ordering him to preach the revelation of Light to the ends of the earth. Mani came to view himself as the last in a series of great prophets including Buddha, Zoroaster, Jesus, and Paul (Rudolph, p. 339). His highly complex myth of the origin of the cosmos and of humankind drew on various elements culled from these several traditions and teachings. The doctrine of Mani is not “philosophical,” in the manner of Basilides, Valentinus or Ptolemy; for Mani’s teaching was not the product of a more or less rational or systematic speculation about the godhead, resulting in Gnosis, but the wholly creative product of what he felt to be a revelation from the divinity itself. It is for this reason that Mani’s followers revered him as the redeemer and holy teacher of humankind (Rudolph, p. 339). Since Manichaeism belongs more to the history of religion than to philosophy proper (or even the fringes of philosophy, as does Western Gnosticism), it will suffice to say only a few words about the system, if for no other reason than that the great Christian philosopher Augustine of Hippo had followed the Manichaen religion for several years, before converting to Christianity (cf. Augustine, Confessions III.10).

The main point of distinction between the doctrine of Mani and the Western branch of Gnosticism (Basilides, Valentinus, etc.), is that in Manichaeism the “cosmology is subservient to the soteriology” (Rudolph, p. 336). This means, essentially, that Mani began with a fundamental belief about the nature of humanity and its place in the cosmos, and concocted a myth to explain the situation of humankind, and the dynamics of humanity’s eventual salvation. The details of the cosmology were apparently not important, their sole purpose being to illustrate, poetically, the dangers facing the souls dwelling in this “realm of darkness” as well as the manner of their redemption from this place. The Manichaean cosmology began with two opposed first principles, as in Zoroastrianism: the God of Light, and the Ruler of Darkness. This Darkness, being of a chaotic nature, assails the “Kingdom of Light” in an attempt to overthrow or perhaps assimilate it. The “King of the Paradise of Light,” then, goes on the defensive, as it were, and brings forth Wisdom, who in her turn gives birth to the Primal Man, also called Ohrmazd (or Ahura-Mazda). This Primal Man possesses a pentadic soul, consisting of fire, water, wind, light, and ether. Armored with this soul, the Primal Man descends into the Realm of Darkness to battle with its Ruler. Surprisingly, the Primal Man is defeated, and his soul scattered throughout the Realm of Darkness. However, the Manichaeans understood this as a plan on the part of the Ruler of Light to sow the seeds of resistance within the Darkness, making possible the eventual overthrow of the chaotic realm. To this end, a second “Living Spirit” is brought forth, who was also called Mithra. This being, and his partner, “Light-Adamas,” set in motion the history of salvation by putting forth the “call” within the realm of darkness, which recalls the scattered particles of light (from the vanquished soul of Ohrmazd). These scattered particles “answer” Mithra, and the result is the formation of the heavens and earth, the stars and planets, and finally, the establishment of the twelve signs of the zodiac and the ordered revolution of the cosmic sphere, through which, by a gradual process, the scattered particles of light will eventually be returned to the Realm of Light. The Manichaeans believed that these particles ascend to the moon, and that when the moon is full, it empties these particles into the sun, from whence they ascend to the “new Aeon,” also identified with Mithra, the “Living Spirit” (Rudolph, pp. 336-337). This process will continue throughout the ages of the world, until all the particles eventually reach their proper home and the salvation of the godhead is complete.

It should be clear from this brief exposition that humanity as such does not hold the prime place in the salvific drama of Manichaeism, but rather a part of the godhead itself—that is, the scattered soul of Ohrmazd. The purpose of humanity in this scheme is to aid the particles of light in their ascent to the godhead. Of course, these particles dwell within every living thing, and so the salvation of these particles is the salvation of humanity, but only by default, as it were; humanity does not hold a privileged position in Manichaeism, as it does in the Western or strictly Christian Gnostic schools. This belief led the Manichaeans to establish strict dietary and purity laws, and even to require selected members of their church to provide meals for the “Elect,” so that the latter would not become defiled by harming anything containing light particles. All of this, however, is a long way from philosophy. Hans Jonas was right to describe Manichaeism as representing “a more archaic level of gnostic thought” (Jonas, p. 206). Now that we have examined one of the non-philosophical directions taken by Gnostic thought, let us proceed to discuss its role in the philosophical development of the era.

3. Platonism and Gnosticism

Long before the advent of Gnosticism, Plato had posited two contrary World Souls: one “which does good” and one “which has the opposite capacity” (Plato, Laws X. 896e, tr. Saunders). For Plato, this did not imply that the cosmos is under the control of a corrupt or ignorant god, as it did for the Gnostics, but simply that this cosmos, like the human soul, possesses a rational and an irrational part, and that it is the task of the rational part to govern the irrational. The question arose, however, among Platonists, regarding Plato’s true position on this matter. Was he declaring that a part of the cosmos is evil? or that the divine Demiurge (who, in the highly influential Timaeus account, is said to have crafted the cosmos) actually produced an evil soul? Both of these conjectures flew in the face of everything that the ancient thinkers believed about the cosmos—that is, that it was divine, orderly, and perfect. A common solution, among both Platonists and Pythagoreans, was to interpret the second or “evil” Soul as Matter, that is, the material or generative principle, which is the opposite of the truly divine and unchanging Forms. The purpose of the Intellectual principle, or the “good” Soul, is to bring this disorderly principle under the control of reason, and thereby maintain an everlasting but not eternal cosmos (cf. Timaeus 37d). Since the cosmos, according to Plato in the Timaeus, cannot be as perfect as the eternal image upon which it is founded, a generative principle is necessary to maintain the “living creature” (which is precisely how the cosmos is described), and therefore not really “evil,” even though it possesses the “opposite capacity” (generation, and hence, corruption) from that of the Good or Rational Soul.

a. Numenius of Apamea and Neo-Platonism

Several centuries after Plato, around the time when the great Gnostic thinkers like Valentinus and Ptolemy were developing their systems, we encounter the Platonic philosopher Numenius of Apamea (fl. 150 CE). The main ideas of Numenius’ philosophy, preserved in the fragments of his writings that survive, bear clear traces of Gnostic influence. His cosmology describes, in language strikingly similar to that of the Gnostics, the degradation of the divine dêmiourgos upon his contact with pre-existent Matter (hulê, or the “indefinite” principle):

[I]n the process of coming into contact with Matter, which is the Dyad, [the Demiurge] gives unity to it, but is Himself divided by it, since Matter has a character prone to desire [epithumêtikon êthos] and is in flux. So in virtue of not being in contact with the Intelligible (which would mean being turned in upon Himself), by reason of looking towards Matter and taking thought for it, He becomes unregarding (aperioptos) of Himself. And he seizes upon the sense realm and ministers to it and yet draws it up to His own character, as a result of this yearning towards Matter [eporexamenos tês hulês] (Numenius, Fragment 11, in Dillon 1977, The Middle Platonists, pp. 367-368).

In this fragment, Numenius is transferring a basic Gnostic anthropological idea into the realm of cosmology. It is a common feature of Gnostic systems to describe the individual human soul’s contact with the material realm as resulting in a forgetting of the soul’s true origin. Platonism, also, warned against the soul’s becoming too attached to the realm of the senses, since this realm is changing and illusory, and does not accurately reflect the divinity. However, neither Platonism nor Gnosticism described such a danger as affecting, in any way, the Demiurge; for the Gnostics declared the Demiurge to be just as much a part of the cosmos as he was its ruler, and the orthodox Platonists located the Demiurge outside the cosmos, declaring the cosmos to be self-sufficient (following Timaeus 34b). Numenius, however, went further and bridged the gap between the sensible cosmos and the Intelligible Realm by linking the Demiurge to the latter by way of contemplation, and to the former by way of his “desire” (orexis) for matter. In Fragment 18, Numenius tells us that the Demiurge derives his “critical faculty” (kritikon) from his contemplation of the Good, and his “impulsive faculty” (hormêtikon) from his attachment to Matter (Dillon, p. 370). This idea seems to foreshadow Plotinus’ doctrine that the individual soul will always take on certain characteristics of Matter, and that these characteristics manifest themselves in the form of sense perceptions that must be brought under the controlling influence of rational judgment (cf. Enneads I.8.9 and I.1.7). Unlike Plotinus, however, who leaves the World-Soul or active part of the Demiurge safely beyond the affective cosmic realm, Numenius posits a Demiurge that is both transcendent and immanent, and arrives at a doctrine of a cosmos that, even on the highest level—the level of the celestial bodies—is not devoid of evil influence, since even the Demiurge, the highest cosmic deity, is infected by the tainting influence of Matter. “This importation of evil into the celestial realm is surely more Gnostic than Platonist, and did not comment itself to such successors as Plotinus or Porphyry, though it does seem to be accepted by Iamblichus” (Dillon, p. 374).

Plotinus, during the height of his teaching career at Rome (ca. 255 CE), composed a treatise “Against Those Who Declare the Creator of This World, and the World Itself, to be Evil,” also known, simply, as “Against the Gnostics” (Ennead II.9) in which he argues for the divinity and goodness of the cosmos, and upholds the ancient Greek belief in the divinity of the stars and planets, declaring them to be our “noble brethren,” and responsible only for the good things that befall humankind. Porphyry, in his Life of Plotinus, tells us that Plotinus commissioned him, along with his fellow student Amelius, to write more treatises attacking the Gnostics on points that Plotinus skipped over (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 16). Porphyry also mentions by name two Gnostic treatises that were discovered in Egypt in 1945, and are now readily available to scholars: Zostrianos, and Allogenes, in the Nag Hammadi Collection of Codices. These texts, as well as the Tripartite Tractate (also in the Nag Hammadi Collection) show how tightly Platonism and Gnosticism were intertwined in the early centuries of our era.

4. Concluding Summary

Gnosticism began with the same basic, pre-philosophical intuition that guided the development of Greek philosophy—that there is a dichotomy between the realm of true, unchanging Being, and ever-changing Becoming. However, unlike the Greeks, who strived to find the connection between and overall unity of these two “realms,” the Gnostics amplified the differences, and developed a mytho-logical doctrine of humankind’s origin in the realm of Being, and eventual fall into the realm of darkness or matter, that is, Becoming. This general Gnostic myth came to exercise an influence on emerging Christianity, as well as upon Platonic philosophy, and even, in the East, developed into a world religion (Manichaeism) that spread across the known world, surviving until the late Middle Ages. In the twentieth century, there began a renewed interest in Gnostic ideas, particularly in the pioneering work of Hans Jonas, the Existentialist philosopher and student of Martin Heidegger. The psychologist Carl Jung, as well, drew upon Gnostic motifs in his theoretical work, and the increasing emphasis on Hermeneutics in late twentieth century thought owes something to the analyses of Gnostic myth and exegesis done by Harold Bloom, Paul Ricoeur, and others.

More than any of these accomplishments, however, it was the discovery in 1945, in Egypt, of a large collection of Coptic Gnostic codices, now known as the Nag Hammadi Collection, or the Nag Hammadi Library. This collection contains works of the Valentinian School, as well as of many earlier and contemporaneous sects, and sheds much needed light on the nature and structure of what to this day is still called, with some reservations, the Gnostic Religion. The study of this library has led certain scholars to question the existence of any unified movement called “Gnosticism” or the “Gnostic Religion.” Michael Allen Williams, in 1996, published a book entitled Rethinking “Gnosticism”: An Argument For Dismantling A Dubious Category (Princeton University Press 1996). Through a detailed study of numerous texts of the Nag Hammadi Collection, Williams attempts to show that the extreme diversity underlying the texts that many scholars have lumped together under the catch-all phrase of “Gnosticism,” casts doubt on the existence of anything like a Gnostic religion. Moreover, he argues, such a wholesale consignment of these texts to what is, in fact, a modern designation, blinds us to the deeper meaning of these diverse intellectual monuments. It should be noted, however, that the early Church Fathers, like Clement of Alexandria, Irenaeus, Origen, Hippolytus, Epiphanius, and even “pagan” philosophers like Plotinus and Porphyry, who have preserved for us accounts and occasionally some original documents of philosophers and theologians whom they term “Gnostic,” were also contemporaries or near contemporaries of many of the figures and schools that they criticize and interpret. The insights of these writers, then, who were living and working side by side, and almost always in conflict with, members of the Gnostic sects, should be given priority over any modern attempts to revise our understanding of what Gnosticism is.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Sources

  • Dillon, John (1977). “Numenius of Apamea” in The Middle Platonists (Cornell University Press).
  • Filoramo, Giovanni. A History of Gnosticism, tr. Anthony Alcock (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers 1990, 1992).
  • Hegel, G.W.F. “The Gnostics” in Lectures on the History of Philosophy, vol 2. “Plato and the Platonists,” tr. E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson (University of Nebraska Press; Bison Books Edition 1995).
  • Jonas, Hans (1958, 2001). The Gnostic Religion: The Message of the Alien God and the Beginnings of Christianity (Boston: Beacon Press).
  • Layton, Bentley (1987). The Gnostic Scriptures (Doubleday: The Anchor Bible Reference Library).
  • Plato. Laws, tr. Trevor J. Saunders, in Plato: Complete Works, ed. John M. Cooper (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing 1997).
  • Plato. Timaeus, tr. Donald J. Zeyl, in Plato: Complete Works.
  • Plotinus. The Enneads, tr. A.H. Armstrong, in 7 volumes (Harvard: Loeb Classical Library 1966).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. The Conflict of Interpretations (Northwestern University Press 1974).
  • Rudolph, Kurt. Gnosis: The Nature and History of Gnosticism, tr. Robert McLachlan Wilson (Edinburgh: T. and T. Clark Ltd. 1984).
  • Segal, Robert A. (ed.) The Gnostic Jung (Princeton University Press 1992).

b. Suggestions for Further Reading

  • Barnstone, Willis (1984 ed.) The Other Bible (Harper San Francisco).
  • Bultmann, Rudolph (1956). Primitive Christianity in its Contemporary Setting (New York: Meridian Books).
  • Fideler, David (1993). Jesus Christ, Sun of God: Ancient Cosmology and Early Christian Symbolism (Wheaton, Illinois: Quest Books).
  • Pagels, Elaine (1975). The Gnostic Paul: Gnostic Exegesis of the Pauline Letters (Philadelphia: Trinity Press).
  • Williams, Michael Allen. Rethinking “Gnosticism”: An Argument For Dismantling A Dubious Category (Princeton University Press 1996).

Author Information

Edward Moore
Email: emoore@theandros.com
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. s. A.

Last updated: July 10, 2005 | Originally published: