Western Concepts of God

Western concepts of God have ranged from the detached transcendent demiurge of Aristotle to the pantheism of Spinoza. Nevertheless, much of western thought about God has fallen within some broad form of theism. Theism is the view that there is a God which is is the creator and sustainer of the universe and is unlimited with regard to knowledge (omniscience), power (omnipotence), extension (omnipresence), and moral perfection. Though regarded as sexless, God has traditionally been referred to by the masculine pronoun.

Concepts of God in philosophy are entwined with concepts of God in religion. This is most obvious in figures like Augustine and Aquinas, who sought to bring more rigor and consistency to concepts found in religion. Others, like Leibniz and Hegel, interacted constructively and deeply with religious concepts. Even those like Hume and Nietzsche, who criticized the concept of God, dealt with religious concepts. While Western philosophy has interfaced most obviously with Christianity, Judaism and Islam have had some influence. The orthodox forms of all three religions have embraced theism, though each religion has also yielded a wide array of other views. Philosophy has shown a similar variety. For example, with regard to the initiating cause of the world, Plato and Aristotle held God to be the crafter of uncreated matter. Plotinus regarded matter as emanating from God. Spinoza, departing from his judaistic roots, held God to be identical with the universe, while Hegel came to a similar view by reinterpreting Christianity.

Issues related to Western concepts of God include the nature of divine attributes and how they can be known, if or how that knowledge can be communicated, the relation between such knowledge and logic, the nature of divine causality, and the relation between the divine and the human will.

Table of Contents

  1. Sources of Western Concepts of God
  2. Historical Overview
    1. Greeks
    2. Early Christian Thought
    3. Medieval Thought
    4. Renaissance Thought
    5. Enlightenment
    6. Modern Period
  3. Divine Attributes
    1. Incorporeality
    2. Simplicity
    3. Unity
    4. Eternity
    5. Immutability
    6. Omnipotence
    7. Omniscience
    8. Impassibility
    9. Goodness
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Sources of Western Concepts of God

Sources of western concepts of the divine have been threefold: experience, revelation, and reason. Reported experiences of God are remarkably varied and have produced equally varied concepts of the divine being. Experiences can be occasioned by something external and universally available, such as the starry sky, or by something external and private, such as a burning bush. Experiences can be internal and effable, such as a vision, or internal and ineffable, as is claimed by some mystics. Revelation can be linked to religious experience or a type of it, both for the person originally receiving it and the one merely accepting it as authoritative. Those who accept its authority typically regard it as a source of concepts of the divine that are more detailed and more accurate than could be obtained by other means. Increasingly, the modern focus has been on the complexities of the process of interpretation (philosophical hermeneutics) and the extent to which it is necessarily subjective. Revelation can be intentionally unconnected to reason such that it is accepted on bare faith (fideism; compare Kierkegaard), or at the other extreme, can be grounded in reason in that it is accepted because and only insofar as it is reasonable (compare Locke). Reason has been taken as ancillary to religious experience and revelation, or on other accounts, as independent and the sole reliable source of concepts of God.

Each of the three sources of concepts of God has had those who regard it as the sole reliable basis of our idea of the divine. By contrast, others have regarded two or three of the sources as interdependent and mutually reinforcing. Regardless of these differing approaches, theism broadly construed has been a dominant theme for much of the history of Western thought.

2. Historical Overview

a. Greeks

At the dawn of philosophy, the Ionian Greeks sought to understand the true nature of the cosmos and its manifestations of both change and permanence. To Heraclitus, all was change and nothing endured, whereas to Parmenides, all change was apparent. The Pythagoreans found order and permanence in mathematics, giving it religious significance as ultimate being. The Stoics identified order with divine reason.

To Plato, God is transcendent-the highest and most perfect being-and one who uses eternal forms, or archetypes, to fashion a universe that is eternal and uncreated. The order and purpose he gives the universe is limited by the imperfections inherent in material. Flaws are therefore real and exist in the universe; they are not merely higher divine purposes misunderstood by humans. God is not the author of everything because some things are evil. We can infer that God is the author of the punishments of the wicked because those punishments benefit the wicked. God, being good, is also unchangeable since any change would be for the worse. For Plato, this does not mean (as some later Christian thought held) that God is the ground of moral goodness; rather, whatever is good is good in an of itself. God must be a first cause and a self-moved mover otherwise there will be an infinite regress to causes of causes. Plato is not committed to monotheism, but suggests for example that since planetary motion is uniform and circular, and since such motion is the motion of reason, then a planet must be driven by a rational soul. These souls that drive the planets could be called gods.

Aristotle made God passively responsible for change in the world in the sense that all things seek divine perfection. God imbues all things with order and purpose, both of which can be discovered and point to his (or its) divine existence. From those contingent things we come to know universals, whereas God knows universals prior to their existence in things. God, the highest being (though not a loving being), engages in perfect contemplation of the most worthy object, which is himself. He is thus unaware of the world and cares nothing for it, being an unmoved mover. God as pure form is wholly immaterial, and as perfect he is unchanging since he cannot become more perfect. This perfect and immutable God is therefore the apex of being and knowledge. God must be eternal. That is because time is eternal, and since there can be no time without change, change must be eternal. And for change to be eternal the cause of change-the unmoved mover-must also be eternal. To be eternal God must also be immaterial since only immaterial things are immune from change. Additionally, as an immaterial being, God is not extended in space.

The Neo-Platonic God of Plotinus (204/5-270 A.D.) is the source of the universe, which is the inevitable overflow of divinity. In that overflow, the universe comes out of God (ex deo) in a timeless process. It does not come by creation because that would entail consciousness and will, which Plotinus claimed would limit God. The first emanation out of God (nous) is the highest, successive emanations being less and less real. Finally, evil is matter with no form at all, and as such has no positive existence. God is an impersonal It who can be described only in terms of what he is not. This negative way of describing God (the via negativa) survived well into the middle ages. Though God is beyond description, Plotinus (perhaps paradoxically) asserted a number of things, such as that virtue and truth inhere in God. Because for Plotinus God cannot be reached intellectually, union with the divine is ecstatic and mystical. His thought influenced a number of Christian mystics, such as Meister Eckhart (1260-1327).

b. Early Christian Thought

Early Christians regarded Greek religion as holding views unworthy of God, but they were divided as to Greek philosophy. Christian philosopher Justin Martyr (c. 100-c. 165) saw Christianity as compatible with the highest and best Greek thought, whereas Tertullian (c. 160-c. 225) dismissed philosophy, saying that Jerusalem (faith) could have nothing to do with Athens (philosophy).

Having been born out of Judaism, Christianity was unambiguously monotheistic and affirmed that God created the material of the universe out of nothing (ex nihilo). But it also affirmed the Trinity as multiplicity within unity, a view it regarded as implicit in Judaism.

Consistent with theism, Augustine (354-430) regarded God as omniscient, omnipotent, omnipresent, morally good, the creator (ex nihilo) and sustainer of the universe. Despite these multiple descriptors, God is uniquely simple. Being entirely free, he did not have to create, but did so as an act of love. As his creation, it reflects his mind. Time and space began at creation, and everything in creation is good. Evil is uncreated, being a lack of good and without positive existence. Though God is not responsible for evil even it has a purpose: to show forth what is good, especially what is good within God. Augustine developed a theme found as early as Plato, Aristotle, and Zeno of Citium, that God is a perfect being. After enumerating a hierarchy of excellencies (things to be “preferred”) Augustine affirms that God “lives in the highest sense” and is “the most powerful, most righteous, most beautiful, most good, most blessed” (On the Trinity, XV, 4). When we think of God, we “attempt to conceive something than which nothing more excellent or sublime exists” (Christian Doctrine, I, 7, 7). But where Aristotle concluded that the greatest being must be aware only of himself, Augustine emphasized an opposite and distinctly Christian theme: God loves creatures supremely to the point of becoming incarnate in Christ in order to be revealed to them and to reconcile them to himself. Moreover, God is providentially active in history, from an individual level (Confessions) on up to dealings with entire nations (City of God). So as to the important subject of God’s relationship to the world, Christian thought could not be more opposite Aristotle’s view of a Being who contemplates only himself.

John Scotus Erigena (c. 810-c.877) had stronger affinities for Neo-Platonic thought. God created the universe according to eternal patterns in his mind and it is an expression of his thought, however incomplete an expression the cosmos may be. Erigena’s pantheistic tendencies can be seen in his notion that God creates out of himself and “God is in all things.” Creation is not in time but is eternal. In the process God used universals and made them particulars (e.g., humanity became individual persons). Immortality is the reverse process of particulars going back to universals. In Erigena’s terms, division is the process of differentiating universals into particulars; analysis is the reverse, a return to unity and thus to God. These are not mere mental activities but mirror reality and God’s relationship to the world. God is ultimately unknowable, being beyond all language and categories. Aristotle’s predicates and categories cannot apply to God because they assume some type of substance. Nevertheless God can be described, albeit inadequately, using both positive and negative statements. Positive statements are only approximate but can be made more exact by adding negative statements. For example, it can be said that God is good (positive), but also that he is not good (negative) in that he is above goodness. These can be combined in the statement that he is “supergood.” In spite of these approximations, God must be reached by mystical experience.

c. Medieval Thought

Islamic Neoplatonist al-Farabi (875-950) held that universals are in things and have no existence apart from particulars. Objects are contingent in that they may or may not exist; they do not have to exist. Therefore there must be something that has to exist-that exists necessarily-to ground the existence of all other (contingent) things. This being is God. The world evolves by emanation, and matter is a phase of that process. The potential in matter is made actual, and over time God brings out its form. Thought is one emanation from God, and through it knowledge arises in humans. The actualized human intellect becomes an immortal substance.

Avicenna (Ibn Sina; 980-1037), a Muslim, also distinguished between God as the one necessary being and all other things, which are contingent. The world is an emanation from God as the outworking of his self-knowledge. As such it is eternal and necessary. God must be eternal and simple, existing without multiplicity. In their essence, things do not contain anything that accounts for their existence. They are hierarchically arranged such that the existence of each thing is accounted for by something ontologically higher. At the top is the one being whose existence is necessary. From contingent things we come to know universals, whereas God knows universals prior to their existence in things.

Al-Ghazali (1058-1111) challenged any joining of theology and philosophy, holding that because the mind and senses are subject to error, truth must come by divine grace. Rather than the world existing necessarily in a Neoplatonic sense, it exists by the will of God alone. It is in no way autonomous, and even causal relationships are non-necessary. He rejected as un-Islamic Avicenna’s view that things like souls or intellects could be eternal.

Anselm (1033-1109), archbishop of Canterbury, raised the perfect being concept to a new level by making it the foundation of his celebrated ontological argument. He accepted that God is the highest level of being under which there are, by degrees, lesser and lesser beings. Similar to Plato, Anselm assumes the realist view that entities which share an attribution, such as “good,” also share in being. And somewhere there must be a perfection of that being (e.g., perfect goodness). That perfection is God.

Though a Muslim and an Aristotelian, Averroes (Ibn Rushd; 1126-1198) added to the growing concept of emanation by claiming that the universal mind is an emanation from God. Humans participate in this universal mind and only it, not the soul, is immortal. The mind of the common person understands religious symbols in a literal way, whereas the philosopher interprets them allegorically. Consequently, something understood as true philosophically may be untrue theologically, and vice versa.

Working from Judaism, Maimonides (1135-1204) accepted creation rather than an eternal universe. He drew from philosophic traditions to formulate three proofs based on the nature of God, and these were developed further by Aquinas. Following Aristotle Maimonides demonstrated the existence of a Prime Mover, and with some inspiration from Avicenna, the existence of a necessary being. He also showed God to be a primary cause. Though he considered God’s existence demonstrable, he held that nothing positive could be said about God.

Bonaventura (John of Fidanza, c. 1221-1274) argued that the Aristotlean denial of Platonic ideas would entail that God knows himself but not the world. As such God could not be its creator. Furthermore, because some change in the universe is cyclic and therefore unexplainable by chance, change would have to be deterministic. But this would deny God’s providence as well as human moral responsibility. So a proper concept of God must include Platonic ideas. Reason can prove God as creator since an eternal universe entails both that the amount of time of its existence is infinite and that it is increasing. Yet there cannot be both an infinite and a larger infinite (a view not held in modern times).

Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) accepted both Aristotle and Christian revelation. He accepted both reason and revelation as sources of knowledge of God. Over the neo-Platonic notion of a hierarchy of reality in which lower existences are less real and a mere shadow of the divine, Aquinas accepted gradations of form and matter. Atop the hierarchy is God as pure form and no matter. As pure actuality and no potentiality, he is perfect and therefore changeless. He is also pure intelligence and pure activity. To these Aristotelian concepts Aquinas added Christian convictions that God is loving, providential, and ruler of the universe. Reason and revelation are in harmony because they have the same divine source, and revelation is not unreasonable. Perception is also in harmony because the world’s origins are divine. This being the case, God as cause can be known through the world as effect. For this reason empirical facts ground Aquinas’s theistic proofs.

The God that can be known in part from the universe is fundamentally different from it. Only God is identical to his essence, being neither more nor less than it. By contrast, a being such as Socrates is transcended by humanity because there are other people. On the other hand, Socrates has qualities (“accidents”) that are not part of his essence; for example, he may be sitting. So unlike God, Socrates is both greater than and less than his essence. There is nothing that transcends God so nothing is greater than his essence. And there are no accidents in God because accidents are caused by something else (just as part of the cause of Socrates sitting is a chair).

God is not (completely) knowable because he is not material, whereas our knowledge is normally dependent on our senses. Furthermore, we normally know things by knowing their genus and species, yet God is unique and so cannot be known in that way. We can know something of God the negative way (via negativa) by removing limits, concluding for example, that God is unmoved, and unlimited by space. What we can know of God positively is neither exactly like our knowledge of temporal things (univocal) nor entirely different (equivocal). Rather, it is analogical, being in some ways the same and in other ways different. God knows x in a way that is both like and unlike the way in which Socrates knows x. God knows, but in a way that is, among other things, complete, immediate, and timeless.

That God created is evident (though not provable) because a material universe cannot emanate from an immaterial being. The universe exists to manifest God, who created the fullest possible range of beings because in them he can be revealed to the fullest extent. Beings range from angels, who are immaterial; to humans, who are material and immaterial; to animals, who are purely material (and both eat and move); to plants, to inanimate objects.

God as primary cause works through such created things as secondary causes. Nevertheless, creatures with a will remain free and responsible. God can also work apart from secondary causes in what we call miracles. Being good, God created the best possible world in the sense that it has the best kinds of things. Evil is a privation or lack of good and as such God did not cause it the way he causes other things. So we cannot ask why God brought about evil, but we can ask why he did not bring about more good. He did not bring about more good in order that he could be revealed through the greatest range of things, and as well, to allow for certain types of good (such as compassion, which can exist only where there is some suffering).

Aquinas and others grounded the scholastic synthesis of knowledge in the view that truth, morality, and God himself could be known by reason because the divine will itself is guided by reason. What is reasonable is therefore what is true and right. But John Duns Scotus (1265-1308) claimed that in humans and in God it is the will–not the intellect–that is primary. Evidence of this is that a being must will what to think about, thus something must act on the intellect; whereas nothing need act on the will. The view entails that there is no reason why God acts or wills as he does. This makes truth and morality essentially arbitrary and thereby unknowable through reason. God could have willed different moral standards. Scotus’s view makes our knowledge of God a matter of revelation and faith, not of reason.

Another concept about God’s will further destabilized the medieval world view. William of Ockham (1285-1347) held that omnipotence means God can do literally anything. Accordingly, a person could perceive something by sheer act of divine will, without the object being there at all. On his view, faith and reason can be contradictory. Ockham’s “razor” sought to cut from explanations those entities that are unverifiable thereby making simpler explanations preferred. This was later used to cut out of world views such things as divine purposes, which had been central to explanations since the Greeks. Eventually, even concepts of a divine being would be optional–or even unnecessary–to explanations and world views.

The connection between reason and God was further undermined by Meister Eckhart’s (1260-1327/28) view that God is “above being” and that human unity with the divine must be suprarational. Knowledge is a matter of proceeding from particulars to unity, beyond which is a unity with the divine surpassing all differences, “a silent desert.” The divine being is therefore inexpressible. God knows all things in their unity, timelessly; but on our temporal level it makes sense to differentiate time as well as events.

d. Renaissance Thought

God moved out of the intellectual center of knowledge as faith was no longer grounded in reason and reason was no longer supervised by faith. The power of the church waned and society found inspiration in the classical world. Interest in this life and the world drove interest in science, which soon uncovered mathematically describable physical regularities. This development shaped the concept of God in a way that further undermined the Aristotelian world view, with its emphasis on such things as divine purpose. Regularities such as those discovered in Kepler’s laws of planetary motion and Newton’s laws implied a supreme engineer. Early in these developments, Giordano Bruno (1548-1600) emphasized God as immanent in the universe as an active principle, a trend in the conception of God that would increase along with the ever more detailed understanding of natural processes to be achieved in the scientific revolution.

The Reformation period saw an emphasis on divine sovereignty over human affairs as a corollary to its emphasis on fallen humanity’s inability to achieve a right standing with God. If humans cannot come to God unaided, then it is God who must choose some to be right with him. Since the Reformers affirmed that divine choice cannot be based on merit, love must be the central divine attribute operating in salvation. This view of divine predestination brought new questions, both theological and philosophical, about the relationship between the human and divine wills. The question of how people could be free and responsible if predestination ultimately determines fate was resolved in John Calvin’s (1509-64) tradition partly by distinguishing between God’s irresistible and resistible will. The latter consists of human choices which God allows (for a higher divine purpose) to run counter to his perfect will. Thus God is entirely sovereign and humans are responsible for their deeds. James Arminius (1560-1609) objected that Calvinism made God responsible for sin, and he proposed instead that God predestined those whom he foresaw would repent.

The Reformers’ emphasis on the fallenness of the will led to their distrust in reason as a source of information about the spiritual realm, including God. An unfallen mind would see God everywhere through His creation, but our fallen minds cannot find God. Being therefore hidden, as Martin Luther emphasized (1483-1546), God must reveal Himself in revelation and deed. Humanity must resist the temptation to go beyond what is revealed, especially since God reveals only what we need to know, not all that we wish to know. The Reformers’ reluctance to use reason to narrow the gap between the spiritual and physical realms continued the Augustinian tradition (which faintly echoed Plato’s two realms), challenging the Scholastics’ high view of reason and of Aristotle. That reason has a limited role in the spiritual realm was later emphasized by Soren Kierkegaard (1813-55) and Karl Barth (1886-1968).

e. Enlightenment

Philosophy began splitting from religion as the two moved in opposite directions with regard to reason. Religion was retreating from reason both by emphasizing the divine will over the divine intellect, and in the human realm, by emphasizing faith over reason. Meanwhile, broad elements in the culture turned away from the authority of the church and Aristotle to regard reason as the main source of knowledge. The wisdom of this seemed confirmed in the discoveries of scientists like Newton and Kepler, who had great success using observations to find mathematical regularities in nature. Discoveries were revealing a highly ordered universe, implying a highly reasonable God.

Deism rose as a philosophical form of theism that used reason as its source of knowledge of God. Without revelation to give detail to natural theology, knowledge of God was minimal. Lord Herbert of Cherbury (1583-1648) claimed simply that there is one supreme God, who should be worshiped; virtuous living constitutes worship, people should repent, and God rewards good and punishes evil. The emerging Newtonian universe was one of mechanical precision and predictability, with no room for outside causes. Accordingly, there seemed to be little or no room for divine intervention. Deism, then, held that God caused the universe but did not intervene thereafter. Prayer and miracles were deemed unnecessary because of God’s superior engineering.

The emphasis on God as a perfect designer entailed that waste and suffering were only apparently pointless. The plan and wisdom of God were seen in the grand scheme of the universe, hence God is known best in generality and abstraction.

In a time of upheaval, Rene Descartes (1596-1650) famously sought to ground all knowledge on a foundation he could not doubt: that he was a thinking being. The success of his approach depended crucially on God’s benevolence: because we can be sure that the divine being would not mislead us, we can trust that our clear and distinct ideas are true. God’s character thus forms the basis for our certainty that there is indeed a reality corresponding to our ideas. God’s omnipotence entails the ability to do even what is logically impossible. Descartes also regarded God as not merely uncaused, but somehow the cause of himself.

John Locke (1632-1704) held a view reminiscent of scholasticism, that revelation reveals about God what cannot be known by reason alone–yet neither does revelation violate reason. He went beyond the scholastics to affirm that what violates reason cannot be accepted as revelation. His motive was to rule out what he called “enthusiasm,” which would include supposed private revelations about God held on the sole authority of an individual’s intuition that a revelation is true. Reason must judge whether a supposed revelation is true. His view further welded the concept of God to reason.

Baruch Spinoza (1632-1677) agreed with Descartes that clear and distinct ideas indeed reflect reality, but he thought that philosophy must start with God, not the self. This is because God is first in the order of things. God’s primacy is also the reason Spinoza rejected Bacon’s method of beginning with observation. He abandoned his judaistic roots by affirming that God is the whole of reality, and neither transcendent nor personal.

Aquinas had concluded that God exists on grounds that the universe needs something outside itself as a cause. But Spinoza believed that there can be only one thing–God–because wholes alone are independent and there can be only one whole (or “substance”). There is nothing outside the whole on which the whole can depend. That whole is a network of truths connected by implication. That being the case, everything is either necessary or impossible. Since to be free is to be undetermined by anything outside oneself, God is free because nothing can be outside him; and God alone is free because everything within the whole is the way it is by necessity. There is no need to prove the existence of God beyond the need to prove the existence of the one substance. For Spinoza, God is not an external initiating cause of the world and so is not demonstrable as such. He is nonetheless an immanent and continuing cause of the world. Nor could God be the world’s designer or one who imbues it with purpose. That is because wanting to bring something about implies lack, and God can lack nothing. Lacking purposes, God can have no moral goals for humanity. God is the network of all truths, not a personal being who gives revelation. Still, to know God-which is necessarily a matter of reason-is an essential good. As Spinoza said, “the highest virtue of the mind is to understand or to know God” (Ethics, Part 4, prop. 28; trans. Elwes).

Where Spinoza explained reality in terms of a singular substance that is divine, Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) proposed innumerable instances of the same types of substance. These monads as he called them, are centers of psychic energy. They do not act causally on each other but are coordinated in a grand harmony preestablished by God. That so many diverse elements act in harmony is proof for God’s existence. Because God operates on a principle of sufficient reason, there must be a reason why he chose to create just this world: it must be the best one possible. While many things are possible individually, even God is limited in what can be brought about together (just as a man can be a father or childless, but not both). Since God alone is perfect, created things have limitations, which is a source of evil. Nevertheless, we find that evil is often a prerequisite for some types of good. God’s choice to create this particular world is a matter of his internal moral necessity. He made this world because it has the greatest variety and can, as an act of love, reveal his nature in the greatest possible way.

Leibniz made God the source of causality, George Berkeley (1685-1753) made God the source of perception. He denied the existence of physical substances (because he regarded belief in the physical world as a root of atheism) and claimed that God directly gives us our ideas of the world. The orderliness of our ideas is testimony to the power of God.

David Hume (1711-1776) accepted Berkeley’s empiricism, which claimed that our ideas are of particular things and not universal things; but Hume’s empiricism led him to skeptical conclusions. He held that our observations about the world do not warrant belief in the God of theism. Design, for example, is manifestly imperfect; furthermore, a good God would not allow evil. If our observations point beyond the world at all it might be to a finite god, or even a number of gods. So the concept of God must be rooted not in reason but in emotion and the will.

f. Modern Period

Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) also rejected empirical knowledge as a way of knowing God. In fact, he maintained that God cannot be demonstrated at all, yet neither can his existence be disproved. As humans we typically go beyond what we can rightly infer, and our idea that God can be objectively known is an example. Nevertheless, as an idea, God has regulative value for our thinking in that it acts heuristically and gives a sense of unity to our experience. Practically, too, the idea of God grounds important moral beliefs. Specifically, it is fitting that those who do what is right are happy; and since that is not reliably attained in this life, we can rightly posit that there is life in a sphere beyond this one. We can make the practical assumption too that God exists to ensure the connection between virtue and happiness.

God was considered to be an objective issue before Kant. After him there was a greater tendency to consider it a subjective issue, one that is irreducibly a matter of interpretation. It was associated with discussions of ethics and values rather than of science and facts. This accompanied a change from the Enlightenment’s emphasis on objective knowledge of God as a transcendent engineer, to Romanticism’s emphasis on personal experience of God as a Spirit immanent in everything. Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768-1834) accordingly emphasized a feeling of dependence on God, while Albrect Ritschl (1822-1889) emphasized God as a source of moral freedom and values.

Whereas Kant and those he affected regard God as elusive to our rationality, for G. W. F. Hegel (1770-1831) God is the essence of rationality. Furthermore, Spirit reveals itself and its development through the world, being visible for all to see in the very events of history. Thus the categories which Kant regarded as being limited to the human mind Hegel regarded as part of the Absolute Mind. As such, the very structure of that Mind (or Spirit) can be known. Hegel challenged views that had been dominant since Aristotle, that God and truth are unchanging, and that logic deals with dichotomies that are properly kept apart by the principle of non-contradiction (according to which A cannot also be non-A). For Hegel, dichotomies are united in a higher reality. For example, Being and Nothing are transcended in Becoming. That is because Being is a general term and has no qualities, so it passes over into the concept of Nothing. That passing over is Becoming. The original opposition is thereby transcended.

Hegel believed that reality divides into dichotomies and contradictions that are resolved in a dynamic synthesis. Spirit thus moves from homogeneity to differentiation to unity in diversity. He therefore rejected Schelling’s idea that the Absolute is undifferentiated. Because for Hegel Spirit is more than matter, he rejected Spinoza’s view that the Absolute is substance only. For Hegel it is more than that; it is developing consciousness. In this process God comes to self-awareness through mankind’s awareness of him–God thinking of himself through human consciousness.

Kant had claimed that ultimate reality (the thing-in-itself) is unknowable, but Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860) said it is knowable because it is will. We can know it directly because we can know our own will. Will manifests itself with increasing sophistication in the physical world (through gravity, for example), in plants and animals, and in human nature. But because the will is completely free it is irrational and blind. He rejected Hegel’s optimistic belief in the ultimate victory of rationality, and in contrast to Leibniz, he held that this is the worst of all possible worlds.

Hegel’s view that Spirit is in process and not a static state was continued in Alfred N. Whitehead (1861-1947). Whitehead held that God is necessary to each act of becoming, and in turn God develops through each act of becoming. God strives to enrich the world as well as himself by nurturing harmony and order while preserving values that enhance truth, beauty, and goodness. He strives to eliminate evil from the world using persuasive (rather than coercive) power. In this sense, “He does not create the world, he saves it.” He leads it by means of his vision, rather like a poet.

The so called right wing Hegelians rejected pantheism and interpreted Hegel in a way consistent with theism. Left wing Hegelians associated the Absolute with material reality. Ludwig Feuerbach (1804-1872) said that people create the concept of God and project it onto reality. Karl Marx (1818-1883) made religion both a product and a tool of oppression, the “opium of the people.” People formulate religion in response to the sufferings caused by society’s inequities. Like a narcotic, it insulates them from the pain but it also makes people incapable of dealing with the cause of that pain. Furthermore, religion legitimates the status quo.

Friedrich Nietzsche (1884-1900) rejected belief in God as weak and untenable. He believed his times witnessed the death of God as a cultural force, yet at the same time he feared the outcome. He did not think that God died in the sense that He once existed and at some point ceased to exist, but that modern society regarded God as irrelevant.

Sigmund Freud (1856-1939) regarded God as a projection of the mind, a product of wishful thinking. The pre-scientific mind, for example, finds it easier to cope with an anthropomorphized universe. It is easier to suppose that a personal being is in control than to face seemingly capricious forces of nature. But when humanity grows into a more scientific understanding of the universe, such beliefs will be discarded.

Feuerbach, Marx, Nietzsche, Freud and others thus did not try to rationally defeat belief in God. Rather, they sought to explain its origins and the personal motives of believers.

In the early twentieth century, logical positivism narrowed the scope of meaning in a way that made belief in God subjective by definition. Besides tautologies only empirically verifiable statements were said to be true or false.

Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889-1951) was initially sympathetic to linking meaning to verifiability. He held that language is static and pictures reality. This limits what can be meaningfully expressed in language and excludes propositions about such things as ethics, aesthetics, and the meaning of life. On such topics, “one must be silent.” Wittgenstein later came to the view that meaning comes not from a link to the world but from usage. In this way language is more like doing than picturing. Because this necessarily gives language and meaning a social dimension, concepts of God are bound to their use within, for example, a believing community. On this view it is possible to claim that to know “God” is not to know the existence and attributes of a metaphysical being, but the use of a term and its connections to a life style.

3. Divine Attributes

Classical theism is found in the Greeks since Plato; in the Judaism of Philo, Maimonides, and others; in Christian orthodoxy generally, and in Islam as early as al-Kindi. Discussions of God in classical theism have centered on a number of specific attributes. The working assumption from the Greeks onward has been that God is the most perfect possible being. There is an implicit question as to whether perfections are coherent such that they can exist in one person. If they are not, God would have all perfections possible for a single being. In more theologically oriented thinkers, the assumption that God is a perfect being serves not to formulate the concept of God but only to fill in what is given in revelation. The Reformers, for example, depended heavily on revelation because of their conviction that the human mind is darkened by corruption and therefore is inadequate to shape concepts of God.

a. Incorporeality

Incorporeality. God has no body (from Latin, incorporale), or is non-physical. This is a central tenet of monotheistic religions, which insist that any references to God’s eyes, ears, mind, and the like are anthropomorphic. Christian belief in the incarnation is a unique case in which God takes on human form in Christ.

While some regard God’s incorporeality as true analytically (that is, true by the very definition of the word “God”), others derive it from one or more other attributes. Accordingly, God cannot be corporeal because that would preclude his being eternal, immutable, and simple, for example. Furthermore, if God were corporeal and omnipresent, it would seem that all physical things would be part of God. Others derive divine incorporeality from an apparent incorporeal element of human nature, termed the soul or spirit.

b. Simplicity

Simplicity. God has no parts or real distinctions. The neo-Platonist Plotinus regarded God as therefore characterless, but Christianity generally recognizes the legitimacy of talk of attributes. For Aquinas, to be simple God must be (among other things) incorporeal as well as identical to his nature, not a member of a class that shares a common nature. Aquinas said that God has the perfections we ascribe to him, but that they exist in him in an incomprehensible unity such that we cannot understand the reality behind our statements. When we ascribe goodness to God, goodness does not mean exactly what it does when we ascribe it to a creature (univocal meaning), nor does it mean something entirely different (eqivocal meaning). Its meaning is analogical: in some sense the same and in some sense different. Maimonides insisted on equivocal meaning only, with the result that negative attributes alone can be ascribed to God. Yet he recognized that even negative attribution gives some understanding of the divine being. In Islam, most philosophers (such as al-Farabi) accepted divine simplicity, whereas most theologians rejected it. Some used it to reject the Trinity. Augustine had recognized a potential conflict between simplicity and the Trinity, but believed the resolution lay in proper understanding of the Trinity.

c. Unity

Unity. Monotheism maintains that there is one God. To this Christianity adds that there is a threefold distinction within one God. Stated roughly, God is one substance in three persons. Aquinas argued that there cannot be two gods because neither would be absolutely perfect since one would have a quality that the other lacked (Summa Theologica Ia, 11, 3). Richard Swinburne says that theism is a simpler hypothesis than polytheism, the latter positing more beings with various capabilities and relations. Theism is therefore more likely since simpler hypotheses turn out to be true more often. Moreover, the universe exhibits a unity, in its universal natural laws for example. This unity argues for one deity as its originator (The Existence of God, 1991, pp. 141-2).

d. Eternity

Eternity. Biblical authors spoke of God remembering the past, knowing the future, and acting in the present. According to early Christian thought, God exists forever, without beginning or end. For him events are past, present, and future. Later Christian thought, under the influence of Platonism it is said, held that God exists not inside time, but outside it. God is atemporal in that for him everything is simultaneous, there being no past, present, or future. This later view was held by Augustine, Anselm, and Aquinas; and classically expressed by Boethius, “Eternity is the complete and total possession of unending life all at once” (Consolation of Philosophy, V, vi). Boethius regarded a timeless being as superior because it does not lack a past and future; its entire existence is in a timeless present.

In modern times the timeless view has been defended by E. L. Mascall, Norman Kretzmann, Eleanor Stump, Paul Helm, and Brian Leftow. Arguments in favor include: it makes God more transcendent, it simplifies foreknowledge, it proposes the same divine relationship to time as to space–God is outside it; furthermore it allows for the creation of time along with matter. Arguments for the earlier view, that God is eternal but exists within time, include: personhood requires existence in time because only in time can there be intending, acting, knowing, remembering, and the like; it is difficult to explain how a timeless God can know or respond to events; and the notion of timeless eternity is incoherent.

e. Immutability

Immutability. Those who accept the view that God is outside time are able to argue that God cannot change because any change would have to take place inside time. The view that God is an absolutely perfect being can also lead to the conclusion that he cannot change: if he is perfect he could change neither for the better nor for the worse. Simplicity can be grounds for accepting divine immutability since the only things subject to change are things with parts. Immutability has been taken in a strong sense to mean that if a predicate p applies to God at any time then it must apply at every time. But this is so broad that it brings into the discussion of immutability things that, while changing, are in no way changing within God. For example, “Smith believes in God” could be false yesterday and true today, yet nothing within God has changed. God is immutable in a weaker and less problematic sense if it is required only that he does not change in his character and purpose. The weaker sense fits well with the view that God exists in time, since he could be considered immutable yet begin an action, forgive a person, and so on. Thus, predicates like, “God is protecting r from harm” could be the case at one time but not another and God would still be immutable. The stronger sense of immutability fits well with a God outside of time.

f. Omnipotence

Omnipotence. The claim that God can do anything has been the subject of a number of qualifications. First, many affirm the biblical view that God cannot do what is morally contrary to his nature. Similar to Anselm (Proslogion 7), Aquinas says that God cannot sin because he is omnipotent, since sin is a falling short of perfection (Summa Theologica, Ia.25.3). Nelson Pike says that it is logically possible for God to sin but he would not do what is against his nature. Aquinas also says that God cannot do other things that corporeal beings can do. And, he cannot do what is logically impossible, such as make a square circle. Descartes is one of the few to hold the contrary view, that the laws of mathematics and logic are subject to the will of God (Descartes’ Conversation with Burman, 22, 90). Perhaps the most significant challenge to omnipotence involves the existence of evil. It seems evil would not exist if God is both good and omnipotent. Process theology denies omnipotence, Christian Science denies the ultimate reality of evil, and some post-Holocaust thinking seems to question the goodness of God. Augustine defends the orthodox Christian concept of God on grounds that he did what was good in creating free beings yet they used their freedom to do evil. Some suffering is the just consequence of sin. Furthermore, where evil is a lack of good we cannot ask why God created it since it is merely the absence of something. Aquinas, Leibniz and others recognize that some good things exist only in the presence of certain types of evil. For example, forgiveness exists only where there is sin. In the light of these secondary goods, Leibniz argues that out of all the possible worlds God created the one with the best possible balance of good and evil. Some thinkers appeal to a future life to settle apparent discrepancies in the balance of good over evil. God’s future blessing, it is said, can more than make up for suffering in this world. William Alston develops the idea that as limited beings we are incapable of discerning-and therefore questioning-whether God has sufficient reasons for allowing the evil that exists.

g. Omniscience

Omniscience. While a few like Avicenna and Averroes seem to have held that a God who lacks certain types of knowledge would be more perfect, most have claimed that God knows everything. This is sometimes refined, for example, to the claim that God knows everything that is logically possible to know. An area of concern going back to Aristotle (On Interpretation 9) is the claim that propositions about future contingent events (that is, those whose causes are not determined by past events) have no truth value. If so they are unknowable, even by an omniscient being (a view held in modern times by so called Open Theism). Some have claimed that even if future events have a truth value, they are logically unknowable. Of special concern is the relationship between omniscience and human free will: if yesterday God knew infallibly that I would do x today, it seems I have no alternative but to do x today–a conclusion that seems to violate free will. To solve this, Boethius and Aquinas appealed to the concept of God’s timelessness, which entails that none of God’s knowledge is past or future. Aquinas also said that God determines all events and determines that they will be done freely. De Molina objected that this amounts to removing free will. He constructed his own view, which said that God’s knowledge is logically prior to his decree of what will be. God knows what an individual will do in all possible circumstances (a capacity called middle knowledge), and he decrees those circumstances in which a person freely cooperates with the divine plan. Thus foreknowledge is compatible with free will. Others have conceded that foreknowledge is incompatible with free will but claim that God voluntarily limits his knowledge of future events so that there can still be freedom. This makes omniscience a matter of having an ability to know rather than having specific knowledge. Another solution to the problem of omniscience and freedom challenges the idea that God’s knowledge limits future free actions in any way. While God knows necessarily that I will do x tomorrow that does not entail that it is necessary I do x. What God knows is what I will freely choose to do. So God knows today that I will do x tomorrow because tomorrow I will freely choose to do x. But if tomorrow I choose to do y, then today God knows that tomorrow I will do y. This view is consistent with what we know about less than infallible knowledge of future events. I may know that a person will choose steak over bologna though I in no way influenced their choice.

h. Impassibility

Impassibility. Various views have been held as to whether God can be affected by outside influences. Because Aristotle regarded change as inconsistent with perfection, he concluded that God could not be affected by anything outside himself. Furthermore, God engages not in feeling, but thinking, and he himself is the object of his contemplation. God is thus unaffected by the world in any way. The Stoics ruled out divine passibility because they regarded imperturbability as a virtue, and God must be the supreme example of it. John of Damascus agreed that God is imperturbable, but stressed it is because he is sovereign, not because he is uncaring. Aquinas accepted Aristotle’s view that God cannot change and is impassible. He can act, but nothing can act upon him. So emotions that proceed from God, such as love and joy, are in God; but other emotions such as anger and sadness can be ascribed to him only metaphorically. Early, medieval, and Reformation Christianity generally affirmed that because God could not suffer, Christ suffered in his humanity but not in his divine nature. However, the idea that God is unaffected by the world is being rethought in modern times. Moltmann, who was for a time a German prisoner of war, and Kitamori, a Japanese thinker, both witnessed World War II and its aftermath. They concluded that God must be moved by suffering. Richard Creel defends impassibility as being uncontrolled by outside influences. He says, among other things, that: God has emotions but they are not controlled by anything outside himself, he takes into account the ultimate good that will come from suffering, suffering does not make love more admirable, a God who suffers would be more appropriately an object of pity than of worship, justice does not require passibility because it need not be based on emotion; and omniscience does not require passibility because God need know only that a person has an emotion, he does not need to experience it. A mediating position would allow emotion in God but not control of him in any way by creatures. God would be affected by the world but only in the way and to the extent he allows.

i. Goodness

Goodness. Whereas classical Greek religion ascribed to the gods very human foibles, theism from Plato onward has affirmed that God is purely good and could not be the author of anything evil (Republic). In Judaism divine goodness is thought to be manifested especially in the giving of the law (Torah). In Islam it is thought to be manifested in divine revelation of truth through the prophets, especially as revealed in the Qur’an. And in Christianity it is manifested in the gracious granting of Christ as the way of salvation.

While goodness encompasses all moral perfection (e.g., truth telling, justice), benevolence is that particular aspect of goodness that wills the benefit of another. The Reformers, and Protestantism generally, stressed that God’s desire for the benefit of creatures is dependent not on their merits but purely on divine love. Divine love is not only irrespective of merit but it is shown most clearly where it is entirely unmerited, as in grace shown to fallen humanity. Therefore divine forgiveness and redemption are taken as the highest expressions of benevolence. Benevolence intersects with omnipotence in providence, wherein God orders events for good ends. It also raises the possibility of a clash between the divine and human wills, as when a person spurns God’s action in the world.

Divine goodness raises the question of whether God wills x because it is good, or x is good because God wills it. The former seems to weaken divine sovereignty, but the latter seems to make goodness arbitrary. The arbitrariness may be somewhat relieved if God’s will is understood as bounded by his unchanging character. God would not, for example, decide to make torturing for enjoyment right since his nature forever condemns it. The issue has implications for divine command ethics, according to which acts are right or wrong because God commands or forbids them (as opposed to, for example, a competing view that acts are right or wrong according to whether they promote the greatest happiness).

As to our knowledge of divine goodness, Aquinas separates the order of being from the order of knowing: all goodness derives from God but we understand divine goodness by extrapolating from the goodness of creatures. For Aquinas, this requires an analogical (as opposed to an equivocal) relationship between divine and human goodness. For Kant, divine goodness is known as a postulate of pure practical reason: God must be there to reward virtue and punish evil.

The greatest challenge to belief in divine goodness has been the fact that evil exists, or more recently, the amount and type of evil rather than the mere fact of it. The problem is lessened if it is acknowledged that divine goodness does not require that each creature always be made to experience as much happiness as it is capable of experiencing. Reasons may include, for example, that: it is impossible that all creatures collectively experience maximal happiness (e.g., because the maximal happiness of one precludes the maximal happiness of another), or that there is some higher good than the happiness of all creatures (e.g., John Hick’s view that maturity is that higher good, and acquiring it may entail some displeasure), or that some forms of good are manifested only when certain types of evil exist (for example, forgiveness requires wrongdoing; mentioned in “6,” above); or because God’s favor is undeserved and not given in response to merit, it cannot be owed and God cannot be faulted for not giving it.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Davis, Stephen T., Logic and the Nature of God (Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 1983).
    • Deals with challenges to the logical consistency of theism.
  • Fiddes, Paul S., The Creative Suffering of God (Oxford, 1988).
    • In-depth treatment of impassibility.
  • Hasker, W., God, Time and Knowledge (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989).
  • Hick, John, Evil and the God of Love, rev. ed (San Francisco, CA: Harper &Row, 1978).
    • Overview of major historical views on evil; concludes that the world is a place of soul-making.
  • Kelly, Joseph F., The Problem of Evil in the Western Tradition: From the Book of Job to Modern Genetics (Collegeville, MN: The Liturgical Press, 2002).
    • Comprehensive and accessible survey of western thought on the subject.
  • Kenny, A. The God of the Philosophers (Oxford, 1979).
  • Morris, Thomas V., Our Idea of God: An Introduction to Philosophical Theology (Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity, 1991).
    • Basic introduction to issues such as perfect being theology; God’s goodness, power, and knowledge.
  • Quinn, Philip and Charles Taliaferro eds. A Companion to Philosophy of Religion (Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1997).
    • Contains 620 pages of articles by authorities; many of them introduce various aspects of theism, including attributes of God, pluralism, theism and modern science, and the problem of evil.
  • Swinburne, Richard, The Coherence of Theism (Oxford, 1977; rev. 1993).
    • Discusses many aspects of theism to show its logical consistency.

Author Information

Brian Morley
Email: bmorley@masters.edu
The Master’s College
U. S. A.