Goethe defies most labels, and in the case of the label ‘philosopher’ he did so intentionally. “The scholastic philosophy,” in his opinion, “had, by the frequent darkness and apparent uselessness of its subject- matter, by its unseasonable application of a method in itself respectable, and by its too great extension over so many subjects, made itself foreign to the mass, unpalatable, and at last superfluous” (Goethe 1902, 1: 294). But it is nothing exceptional for a philosopher to disdain the character of what is passed along under the name philosophy by professional academics. If Diogenes, Montaigne, Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, Sartre, or Rorty, can be considered philosophers, then it may even be a rule that to reject the appellation is a condition of having earned it. That said, Goethe is certainly not a philosopher in the sense made popular in his day: a builder of self-grounding systems of thought. Neither is he a philosopher by today’s most common definitions: either a professional analyzer of arguments or a critic of contemporary cultural practices. The paradigm under which Goethe might be classified a philosopher is much older, recalling the ancient and then renaissance conception of the polymath, the man of great learning and wisdom, whose active life serves as the outward expression of his thinking.
In terms of influence, Goethe’s upon Germany is second only to Martin Luther’s. The periods of his dramatic and poetic writing –Sturm und Drang, romanticism, and classicism— simply are the history of the high-culture in Germany from the late eighteenth to the early nineteenth century. Philosophically, his influence is indelible, though not as wide-reaching. His formulation of an organic ontology left its mark on thinkers from Hegel to Wittgenstein; his theory of colors challenged the reigning paradigm of Newton’s optics; and his theory of morphology, that of Linnaeus’ biology.
Historical studies should generally avoid the error of thinking that the circumstances of a philosopher’s life necessitate their theoretical conclusions. With Goethe, however, his poetry, scientific investigations, and philosophical worldview are manifestly informed by his life, and are indeed intimately connected with his lived experiences. In the words of Georg Simmel, “…Goethe’s individual works gradually appear to take on less significance than his life as a whole. His life does not acquire the sense of a biography that strings together external phenomena, but is rather like the portrait of a singular vastness, depth and dynamism of existence, the pure expression of an internal vigor in its relation to the world, the spiritualization of an extraordinary sphere of reality,” (Simmel 2007, 85f).
Johann Wolfgang von Goethe was born August 28, 1749 in Frankfurt, Germany. His father was the Imperial Councillor Johann Kaspar Goethe (1710-1782) and his mother Katharina Elisabeth (Textor) Goethe (1731-1808). Goethe had four siblings, only one of whom, Cornelia, survived early childhood.
Goethe’s early education was inconsistently directed by his father and sporadic tutors. He did, however, learn Greek, Latin, French, and Italian relatively well by the age of eight. In part to satisfy his father’s hope for material success, Goethe enrolled in law at Leipzig in 1765. There he gained a reputation within theatrical circles while attending the courses of C.F. Gellert. And there he gained notoriety for his extracurricular activities at what would become Faust’s haunt, Auerbach’s Keller. In 1766 he fell in love with Anne Catharina Schoenkopf (1746-1810) and wrote his joyfully exuberant collection of nineteen anonymous poems, dedicated to her simply with the title Annette.
After a case of tuberculosis and two years convalescence, Goethe moved to Stassburg in 1770 to finish his legal degree. There he met Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803), unofficial leader of the Sturm und Drang movement. Herder encouraged Goethe to read Homer, Ossian, and Shakespeare, whom the poet credits above all with his first literary awakening. Inspired by a new flame, this time Friederike Brion, he published the Neue Lieder (1770) and his Sesenheimer Lieder (1770-1771). Though set firmly on the path to poetry, he was promoted Licentitatus Juris in 1771 and returned to Frankfurt where with mixed success he opened a small law practice. Seeking greener pastures, he soon after moved to the more liberal city of Darmstadt. Along the road, so the story goes, Goethe obtained a copy of the biography of a noble highwayman from the German Peasants’ War. Within the astounding span of six weeks, he had reworked it into the popular anti-establishment protest, Götz von Berlichingen (1773).
His next composition, Die Leiden des jungen Werther (1774), brought Goethe nearly instant worldwide acclaim. The plot of the book is mostly a synthesis of his friendships with Charlotte Buff (1753-1828) and her fiancé Johann Christian Kestner (1741-1800), and the suicide of Goethe’s friend Karl Wilhelm Jerusalem (1747-1772). It remains the archetype of the Sturm und Drang’s elevation of emotion over reason, disdain for social proprieties, and exhortation for action in place of reflection. Besides Werther, Goethe composed Die Hymnen (among them Ganymed, Prometheus and Mahomets Gesang), and several shorter dramas, among them Götter, Helden und Wieland (1774), and Clavigo (1774).
On the strength of his reputation, Goethe was invited in 1775 to the court of then eighteen-year-old Duke Carl August (1757-1828), who would later become Grand Duke of Saxe-Weimar-Eisenach. Although Weimar was then a village of only six thousand residents, it was in the process of a cultural revolution thanks to the foresight and aesthetic vision of Duchess Anna Amalia (1739-1807), mother of the Duke and matron of the “Court of the Muses.” Goethe became enveloped in court life, where he could turn his limitless curiosity to an astonishing range of civic activities. As court-advisor and special counsel to the Duke, he took directorship of the mining concern, the finance ministry, the war and roads commission, the local theater, not to mention construction of the beautiful Park-am-Ilm. He was eventually granted nobility by Emperor Joseph II, and became Geheimrat of Weimar in 1782.
From 1786 to 1788 Goethe took his Italienische Resie, in part out of his growing enthusiasm for the Winckelmannian rebirth of classicism. There he met the artists Kaufmann and Tischbein, and also Christiane Vulpius (1765–1816), with whom he held a rather scandalous love affair until their eventual marriage in 1806.
Although Goethe had first met Friedrich Schiller (1759-1805) in 1779, when the latter was a medical student in Karlsruhe, there was hardly an immediate friendship between them. When Schiller came to Weimar in 1787, Goethe dismissively considered Schiller an impetuous though undeniably talented upstart. As Goethe wrote to his friend Körner in 1788, “His entire being is just set up differently than mine; our intellectual capacities appear essentially at odds.” After some years of maturation on Schiller’s part and of mellowing on Goethe’s, the two found their creative spirits in harmony. In 1794, the pair became intimate friends and collaborators, and began nothing less than the most extraordinary period of literary production in German history. Working alongside Schiller, Goethe finally completed his Bildungsroman, the great Wilhelm Meisters Lehrjahre (1795-6), as well as his epic Hermann und Dorothea (1796-7) and several balladic pieces. Schiller, for his part, completed the Wallenstein trilogy (1799), Maria Stuart (1800), Die Jungfrau von Orleans (1801), Die Braut von Messina (1803) and Wilhelm Tell (1804). To Goethe’s great sorrow and regret, Schiller died at the height of his powers on April 29, 1805. Of their collaboration’s historical importance, Alfred Bates commemorates, “Schiller and Goethe have ever been inseparable in the minds of their countrymen, and have reigned as twin stars in the literary firmament. If Schiller does not hold the first place he is more beloved, though Goethe is more admired,” (Bates 1906, 11: 75).
Johann Wolfgang von Goethe died on March 22, 1832 in Weimar, having finally finished Faust the previous year. His famous last words were a request that his servant let in “more light.” The prince of poets, Goethe was laid to rest in the Fürstengruft of the Historischer Friedhof in Weimar, side by side with his friend Schiller.
The Kultfigur of Goethe as the unspoiled and uninfluenced genius is doubtless over-romanticized. Goethe himself gave rise to this myth, both in his conversations with others and in his own quasi-biographical work, Dichtung und Wahrheit (1811-1833). About his study of the history of philosophy, he writes, “one doctrine or opinion seemed to me as good as another, so far, at least, as I was capable of penetrating into it,” (Goethe 1902, 182). Albert Schweitzer, usually even-handed in his attributions, writes, “Goethe borrows nothing from any of the philosophies with which he is in contact. Thanks, however, to his conscientious study of the thought of others, he attains an ever clearer grasp of his own ideas,” (Schweitzer 1949, 70).
Goethe’s way of reading was neither that of the scholar seeking out arguments to analyze nor that of the historian curious about the ideas of the great minds. No disciple of any particular philosopher or system, he instead borrows in a syncretic way from a number of different and even opposing thought systems in the construction of his Weltanschauung. And whenever particular subjects could not be put to practical use, Goethe’s attention quickly moved on. In a rather telling recollection, Goethe characterizes his philosophy lectures thusly, “At first I attended my lectures assiduously and faithfully, but the philosophy would not enlighten me at all. In logic it seemed strange to me that I had so to tear asunder, isolate, and, as it were, destroy, those operations of the mind which I had performed with the greatest ease from my youth upwards, and this in order to see into the right use of them. Of the thing itself, of the world, and of God, I thought I knew about as much as the professor himself; and, in more places than one, the affair seemed to me to come into a tremendous strait. Yet all went on in tolerable order till towards Shrovetide, when, in the neighborhood of Professor Winkler’s house on the Thomas Place, the most delicious fritters came hot out of the pan just at the hour of lecture,” (Goethe 1902, 205). Philosophy apparently held just slightly less interest than good pastry. Notwithstanding this estimation, indelible philosophical influences are nevertheless discernible.
For many intellectuals in Goethe’s generation, Rousseau (1712-78) represented the struggle against the Cartesian mechanistic world view. Rousseau’s elevation of the emotional and instinctual aspects of human subjectivity galvanized the traditional German Wanderlust into a far reaching cry to ‘return to nature’ in terms of a longing for pre-civilized society and pre-Enlightenment efforts to harmonize with rather than conquer nature. Goethe felt this unity with nature keenly in his Sturm und Drang period, something equally evident in Werther’s desire for aesthetic wholeness and in his emotional outbursts. From 1784 to 1804, there is a notable decline in enthusiasm for Rousseau’s privileging emotion over reason, though never an explicit rejection. Some scholars attribute this to Goethe’s participation in the sorts of civic bureaucracies that Rousseau so lamented in modern life. But it is clear that there are philosophical reasons besides these practical ones. Goethe’s classical turn in these years is marked by his view that the fullest life was one that balanced passion and duty, creativity and regulation. Only through the interplay of these oppositions, which Rousseau never came to recognize, could one attain classical perfection.
Although educated in a basically Leibnizian-Wolffian worldview, it was Spinoza (1632-77) from whom Goethe adopted the view that God is both immanent with the world and identical with it. While there is little to suggest direct influence on other aspects of his thought, there are certain curious similarities. Both think that ethics should consist in advice for influencing our characters and eventually to making us more perfect individuals. And both hold that happiness means an inner, almost stoically tranquil superiority over the ephemeral troubles of the world.
Kant (1724-1804) was doubtless the most famous living philosopher of Goethe’s youth. Yet Goethe only came to read him seriously in the late 1780s, and even then only with the help of Karl Reinhold (1757-1823). While he shared with Kant the rejection of externally imposed norms of ethical behavior, his reception was highly ambivalent. In a commemoration for Wieland (1773-1813) he asserts that the Kritik der reinen Vernunft (1781/7) is “a dungeon which restrains our free and joyous excursions into the field of experience.” Like Aristotle before him, Goethe felt the only proper starting point for philosophy was the direct experience of natural objects. Kant’s foray into the transcendental conditions of the possibility of such an experience seemed to him an unnecessary circumvention of precisely that which we are by nature equipped to undertake. The critique of reason was like a literary critique: both could only pale in value to the original creative activity. Concerning Kant’s Kritik der praktischen Vernunft (1788), Goethe was convinced that dicta of pure practical reason, no matter how convincing theoretically, had little power to transform character. Perhaps with Kant’s ethics in mind, he wrote, “Thinking is easy, acting is difficult, and to put one’s thoughts into action is the most difficult thing in the world.” And “Knowing is not enough; we must apply. Willing is not enough; we must do.” On the other hand, a letter to Eckermann of April 11, 1827, indicates that he considers Kant to be the most eminent of modern philosophers. And he certainly appreciated Kant’s Kritik der Urteilskraft (1790) for having shown that nature and art each have their ends within themselves purposively rather than as final causes imposed from without.
Influenced in part by Herder’s conception of Einfühlen, Goethe formulated his own morphological method (see below). More the Kantian than Goethe, Herder’s belief in Über den Ursprung der Sprache (1772) that language could be explained naturalistically as a creative impulse within human development rather than a divine gift influenced Goethe’s theoretical work on poetry. And the trace of Herder’s claims about the equal worth of historical epochs and cultures can still be seen in the eclectic art collection in Goethe’s house on Weimar’s Frauenplan.
Goethe considered his scientific contributions as important as his literary achievements. While few scholars since have shared that contention, there is no doubting the sheer range of Goethe’s scientific curiosity. In his youth, Goethe’s poetry and dramatic works featured the romantic belief in the ‘creative energy of nature’ and evidenced a certain fascination with alchemy. But court life in Weimar brought Goethe for the first time in contact with experts outside his literary comfort zone. His directorship of the silver-mine at nearby Ilmenau introduced him to a group of mineralogists from the Freiburg Mining Academy, led by Johann Carl Voigt (1752-1821). His 1784 discovery of the intermaxillary bone was a result of his study with Jena anatomist Justus Christian Loder (1753-1832). Increasingly fascinated by botany, he studied the pharmacological uses of plants under August Karl Batsch (1761-1802) at the University of Jena, and began an extensive collection of his own. He grew dissatisfied with the system of Linnaeus as an artificial taxonomy of plants, considering it “a shade of a great harmony, which one must study as a whole, otherwise each individual is a dead letter,” (Letter to Knebel, 17 November, 1784).
There is a passionate ambivalence about Goethe’s scientific reputation. He has alternately been received as a universal man of learning whose methods and intuitions have contributed positively to many aspects of scientific discourse, or else denounced as a dilettante incapable of understanding the figures— Linnaeus and Isaac Newton—against whom his work is a feeble attempt to revolt. Goethe’s scientific treatises were neglected by many in the nineteenth century as the amateurish efforts of an otherwise great poet, one who should have stayed within the arena that best suited him. Positivists of the early twentieth century virtually ignored him. Erich Heller claims Goethe “made no contribution to scientific progress or technique,” (Heller 1952, 7). On the other hand, some of the great scientific minds have expressed enthusiastic respect and even approval of Goethe’s contributions, among them Helmholtz, Einstein, and Planck (Cf. Stephenson 1995).
In Goethe’s day, the reigning systematic botanical theory in Europe was that of Carl Linnaeus (1707-1778). Plants were classified according to their relation to each other into species, genera, and kingdom. As an empirical method, Linnaeus’s taxonomy ordered external characteristics — size, number, and location of individual organs — as generic traits. The problem for Goethe was two-fold. Although effective as an organizational schema, it failed to distinguish organic from inorganic natural objects. And by concentrating only on the external characteristics of the plant, it ignored the inner development and transformation characteristic of living things generally. Goethe felt that the exposition of living objects required the same account of inner nature as it did for the account of the inner unity of a person.
Goethe believed that all living organisms bore an inner physiognomic ‘drive to formation’ or Bildungstrieb. In his “First Sketch of a General Introduction into Comparative Anatomy, Starting from Osteology” (1795), Goethe discussed a law binding the action of the Bildungstrieb, that “nothing can be added to one part without subtracting from another, and conversely,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 237). This notion of ‘compensation’ bears a likeness to the laws of vital force put forward by Johann Friedrich Blumenbach (1752-1840) and Carl Friedrich Kielmeyer (1765-1844) in the early 1790s. But whereas their versions dealt with the generation and corruption of living beings, Goethe sought the common limitations imposed on organic beings by external nature.
Whereas his earlier romanticism considered nature the raw material on which human emotions could be imparted, Goethe’s studies in botany, mineralogy, and anatomy revealed to him certain common patterns in the development and modifications of natural forms. The name he gave to this new manner of inquiry was ‘morphology’. No static concept, morphology underwent its own metamorphosis throughout Goethe’s career. Morphology is first named as such in Goethe’s notes of 1796. But he only fully lays out the position as an account of the form and transformation of organisms in the 1817 Zur Morphologie. He continued to publish articles in his journal “On Science in General, On Morphology in Particular” from 1817 to 1824. Goethe’s key contention here is that every living being undergoes change according to a compensatory dynamic between the successive stages of its development. In the plant, for example, this determination of each individual member by the whole arises insofar as every organ is built according to the same basic form. As he wrote to Herder on May 17, 1787:
It has become apparent to me that within the organ that we usually address as ‘leaf’ there lies hidden the true Proteus that can conceal and manifest itself in every shape. Any way you look at it, the plant is always only leaf, so inseparably joined with the future germ that one cannot think the one without the other. […]With this model and the key to it, one can then go on inventing plants forever that must follow lawfully; which, even if they don’t exist, still could exist…
Goethe’s morphology, in opposition to the static taxonomy of Linnaeus, studied these perceptible limitations not merely in order to classify plants in a tidy fashion, but as instances of natural generation for the sake of intuiting the inner working of nature itself, whole and entire. Since all organisms undergo a common succession of internal forms, we can intuitively uncover within these changes an imminent ideal of development, which Goethe names the ‘originary phenomenon’ or Urphänomen. These pure exemplars of the object in question are not some abstracted Platonic Idea of the timeless and unchanging essence of the thing, but “the final precipitate of all experiences and experiments, from which it can ever be isolated. Rather it reveals itself in a constant succession of manifestations,” (Goethe 1981, 13: 25). The Urphänomen thus offer a sort of “guiding thread through the labyrinth of diverse living forms,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 58), which thereby reveals the true unity of the forms of nature in contrast to the artificially static and lifeless images of Linneaus’ system. Through the careful study of natural objects in terms of their development, and in fact only in virtue of it, we are able to intuit morphologically the underlying pattern of what the organic object is and must become. “When, having something before me that has grown, I inquire after its genesis and measure the process as far back as I can, I become aware of a series of stages, which, though I cannot actually see them in succession, I can present to myself in memory as a kind of ideal whole,” (Goethe 1947ff, I/10: 131).
The morphological method is thus a combination of careful empirical observation and a deeper intuition into the idea that guides the pattern of changes over time as an organism interacts with its environment. Natural observation is the necessary first step of science; but because the senses can only attend to outer forms, a full account of the object also requires an intuition that apprehends an object with the ‘eyes of the mind’. Morphology reveals, “the laws of transformation according to which nature produces one part through another and achieves the most diversified forms through the modification of a single organ,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 22). While the visible transformations are apparent naturalistically, the inner laws by which they are necessary are not. They are, in Goethe’s word, dämonisch, apparent intuitively but unable to be explicated more concretely by means of the understanding.
Whereas Linneaus’ taxonomy only considered the sensible qualities of the object, Goethe believed a sufficient explanation must address that object in terms of organic wholeness and development. To do that, the scientist needs to describe the progressive modification of a single part of an object as its modification over time relates to the whole of which it is the part. Considering the leaf as an example of this Urphänomen, Goethe traced its metamorphosis from a seed into the stem, then leaves, then flowers, and finally its stamen or pistil. This continuous development was described by Goethe as an ‘intensification’ or Steigerung of the original form.
The oppositional tension between the creative force and the compensatory limitations within all living things exemplifies the notion of ‘polarity’ or Polarität. In his 1790 essay, “The Metamorphosis of Plants,” Goethe represented the intensification of a plant as the result of the interaction between the nutritive forces of the plant and the organic form of the primal leaf. Polarity between a freely creative impulse and an objectively structuring law is what allows the productive restraint of pure creativity and at the same time the playfulness and innovation of formal rules. Polarity also plays a marked role in Goethe’s Farbenlehre (see below), as the principle of interplay between light and darkness out of which the Urphänomen of color is exhibited. “With light poise and counterpoise, nature oscillates within her prescribed limits, yet thus arise all the varieties and conditions of the phenomena which are presented to us in space and time,” (Goethe 1970, xxxix).
Goethe’s theories of morphology, polarity, and compensation each have their roots in his dramatic and poetic writings. But rather than a fanciful application of an aesthetic doctrine to the nature, Goethe believed that the creativity great artists, insofar as they are great, was a reflection of the purposiveness of nature. After all, “masterpieces were produced by man in accordance with the same true and natural laws as the masterpieces of nature,” (Goethe 1961-3, 11: 435–6). Goethe’s classicism features a similarly polarized intertwining of the unbridled creativity of the artistic drives and the formal rules of technique. As with a plant, the creative forces of life must be guided, trained, and restricted, so that in place of something wild and ungainly can stand a balanced structure which achieves, in both organic nature and in the work of art, its full intensification in beauty. As the work of the botanist is to trace the morphology of an individual according to an ideal Urphänomen, so does it fall to the classical author to intensify his characters within the contextualized polarity of the plot in a way simultaneously unique and yet typical. The early drafts of Torquato Tasso (begun in the 1780s), for example, reveal its protagonist as a veritable force of nature, pouring out torrential feelings upon a conservative and repressed external world. By the time of the published version in 1790, the Sturm und Drang character of Tasso is polarized against the aristocratically reposed and reasonable character of Antonio. Only in conjunction with Antonio can Tasso come into classical fullness and perfection. As the interplay of polarities in nature is the principle of natural wholeness, so is it the principle of equipoise in the classical drama. Polarities are also visible in Wilhelm Meister’s Lehrjahr (1795-6). Again in marked contrast to an earlier version of the text, in the final version Wilhelm’s romantic love of art and theatre is now just one piece of his coming-into-himself, which requires its polar opposite: the restraint inculcated within a conservatively aristocratic society. Only from the polarized tension does his drive to self-formation achieve intensification and eventually classical perfection.
“As to what I have done as a poet… I take no pride in it… but that in my century I am the only person who knows the truth in the difficult science of colors – of that, I say, I am not a little proud, and here I have a consciousness of a superiority to many,” (Goethe 1930, 302). Coming from the preeminent literary figure of his age, Goethe’s remarkable statement reveals to what extent he considered the Farbenlehre (1810) his life’s true work. At the same time, it was the source of perhaps his greatest disappointment. Like his work on morphology, his theory of colors fell on mostly deaf ears.
As his morphology targeted the system of Linnaeus, Goethe’s Farbenlehre challenged what was then and among the general public still remains the leading view of optics, that of Isaac Newton (1642-1727). However, most of Goethe’s vitriol was not directed at Newton himself, but the dismissive attitudes of his adherents, who would not so much as entertain the possibility that their conceptual framework was inadequate. He compares Newton’s optics, “to an old castle, which was at first constructed by its architect with youthful precipitation […] The same system was pursued by his successors and heirs: their increased wants within, and harassing vigilance of their opponents without, and various accidents compelled them in some place to build nearby, in others in connection with the fabric, and thus to extend the original plan,” (Goethe 1970, xlii). Thus, while Goethe esteems Newton as a redoubtable genius, his issue is with those half-witted apologists who effectively corrupted that very same edifice they fought to defend. His aim is accordingly to, “dismantle it from gable and roof downwards; so that the sun may at last shine into the old nest of rats and owls…” (Goethe 1970, xliii).
As was the case with Linnaeus, Goethe’s guiding criticism of Newton concerned his ostensibly artificial method. Through Newton’s famous experiments with prismatic phenomenon, he discovered that pure light already contained within itself all the colors available to the human visual spectrum. The refraction of pure white light projected at a prism produces the seven individual colors. Pragmatically, this allowed Newton to quantify the angular bending of light beams and to predict which colors would be produced at a given frequency. That frequency could be calculated simply by accounting for the distance between the light source and the prism and again the distance from the prism to the surface upon which the color was projected.
But by reducing the thing itself to its perceptible qualities, the Newtonians had made a grave methodological mistake. The derivative colors produced by the prismatic experiments are identified with the spectrum that appears in the natural world. But since the light has been artificially manipulated to fit the constraints of the experiment, there is no prima facie reason to think that natural light would feature the same qualities. Sending a beam of light through a turbid prismatic medium ─ one among a nearly infinite variety of media ─ produced a reliably quantifiable set of results, but by no means either the only or even an obviously preferable set. In Goethe’s words, “[Newton] commits the error of taking as his premise a single phenomenon, artificial at that, building a hypothesis on it, and attempting to explain with it the most numerous and unlimited phenomena,” (Goethe 1981, 13: 50).
Goethe’s alternative relies upon his ideas of morphology and polarity. Just as the study of a plant had to proceed from the empirical observation of a great variety of particulars in order to intuit the Urphänomen that was common to all of them, so too should a Farbenlehre proceed from as great a variety of natural observations as possible. Whereas Newton universalizes from a controlled and artificial experiment, Goethe thinks “[i]t is useless to attempt to express the nature of a thing abstractedly. Effects we can perceive, and a complete history of those effects would, in fact, sufficiently define the nature of the thing itself. We should try in vain to describe a man’s character, but let his acts be collected and an idea of the character will be presented to us. The colors are acts of lights; its active and passive modifications: thus considered we may expect from them some explanation respecting life itself,” (Goethe 1970, xxxvii). These ‘acts’ of light reveal the same coordinate tension found in the rest of polarized nature. A light beam is no static thing with a substantial ontological status, but an oppositional tension that we perceive only relationally. Through careful observation of their interplay alone do we apprehend color. As defined by Goethe, “color is an elementary phenomenon in nature adapted to the sense of vision; a phenomenon which, like all others, exhibits itself by separation and contrast, by commixture and union, by augmentation and neutralization, by communication and dissolution: under these general terms its nature may be best comprehended,” (Goethe 1970, liv). Color arises from the polarity of light and darkness. Darkness is not the absence of light, as both Newton and most contemporary theorists believe, but its essential antipode, and thereby an integral part of color.
Through a series of experiments on his thesis that color is really the interplay of light and dark, Goethe discovered a peculiarity that seemed to confute the Newtonian system. If Newton is right that color is the result of dividing pure light, then there should be only one possible order to the spectrum, according to the frequency of the divided light. But there are clearly two ways to produce a color spectrum: with a light beam projected in a dark room, and with a shadow projected within a lighted room. Something bright, seen through something turbid, appears yellow. If the turbidity of the medium gradually increases, then what had appeared as yellow passes over into yellowish-red and eventually into bright-red as its frequency proportionally decreases. Something dark, seen through something turbid, appears blue; with a decreasing turbity, it appears violent. The color produced also depends upon the color of the material on which the light or shadow is cast. If a white light is projected above a dark boundary, the light extends a blue-violet edge into the dark area. A shadow projected above a light boundary, on the other hand, yields a red-yellow edge. When the distances between the projection and the surface are increased, the boundaries will eventually overlap. Done in a lighted room, the result of the overlap is green. The same procedure conducted in a dark room, however, produces magenta. If Newton was correct that only the bending of the light beam affects the given color, then neither the relative brightness of the room, the color of the background, nor the introduction of shadow should have altered the resultant color.
Reversing the artificial conditions of Newton’s original experiment, Goethe reformulated the problem of color to account for the role of both the observer and his or her context. Alongside the physical issues involved with optics, Goethe thus also realized the aesthetic conditions in the human experience of color. The perceptual capacities of the brain and eye, and their situatedness in a real world of real experience must be considered essential conditions of how colors could be seen. But while his observations of the double color-spectrum are intriguing, Goethe’s physiognomic speculations as to how the subject renders perceptual experience are, even by his contemporary standards, quite amateur. His reification of darkness, moreover, remains difficult to conceptualize coherently, much less to accept.
Although almost entirely ignored in his own time, and even undermined by his once and former collaborator, Schopenhauer, Goethe’s theory did win some later acclaim. His call to recognize the role of the subject in the perception of color does have positive echoes in the neo-Kantian theories of perception of Lange, Helmholtz, and Boscovich. Traces can also be found in twentieth century thinkers as divergent as Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty. Despite the fact that almost no serious thinker has ever counted themselves a strict adherent of Goethe’s Farbenlehre, the theory has had a remarkable persistence. Part of the explanation for this may be the obvious superiority of Goethe’s prose; his text is one of very few scientific treatises that can be read by amateurs with pleasure. Part is also due to decline of Newtonian physics generally.
Goethe’s general influence on European culture is gargantuan. In 19th century Germany alone, authors like Heine, Novalis, Jean Paul, Tieck, Hoffman, and Eichendorff all owe tremendous debts to Götz and Werther. Thomas Carlyle, Ralph Waldo Emerson, Mark Twain, Kurt Tucholsky, Thomas Mann, James Joyce and too many others to name have since paid tribute to the master from Weimar. Composers like Mozart, Liszt, and Mahler dedicated works to Goethe’s drama, while Beethoven himself mused that the greatest musical accomplishment possible would be a perfect musical expression Faust. Goethe’s ideas have truly launched a thousand ships upon their cultural and intellectual expeditions. Philosophically, the lineage is comparatively more defined.
In his mature years, Goethe was to witness the philosophical focus in Germany shift from Kant to the Idealists. But by the early 1800s, Goethe was too convinced of the worth of his own ideas to be much influenced by what he considered philosophical fashions. Despite his proximity to and considerable influence at the University of Jena, Goethe had little positive contact with Fichte (1762-1814), who arrived there in 1794. Neither Fichte’s Pecksniffian sermonizing nor nearly illegible compositional style would have endeared him personally to the poet. Goethe’s more ambivalent attitude toward Schelling (1775-1854) vacillated between an approval of his appreciation for the deep mysteriousness of nature and an aversion to his futile attempt to solve it by means of an abstracted and artificial system. Schelling’s Naturphilosophie, like Goethe’s morphology, views nature as a constant organic development. But where Goethe saw polarity as an essential part of growth, Schelling understood dualities generally as something to be overcome in the intuition of the ‘absolute’.
Goethe’s relationship with Hegel (1770-1831) was both more direct and more influential. Most overtly, Hegel’s logic draws upon Goethe’s conception of metamorphosis. A letter from Hegel to Goethe on February 20, 1821 reads:
The simple and abstract, what you quite aptly call the archetypal phenomenon, this you put first, and then show the concrete phenomena as arising through the participation of still other influences and circumstances, and you direct the whole process in such a way that the sequence proceeds from the simple determining factors to the composite ones, and, thus arranged, something complex appears in all its clarity through this decomposition. To seek out the archetypal phenomenon, to free it from other extraneous chance surroundings — to grasp it abstractly, as we call it — this I consider to be a task for a great spiritual sense for nature, just as I consider that procedure altogether to be what is truly scientific in gaining knowledge in this field.
For Hegel, famously, a natural object has achieved its greatest perfection when it brings forth its full implicit content in explicit conceptual representation. Because the intellectual world ranks higher than the material, a phenomenology of the whole must observe the gradual unfolding of all possible logical forms from mere sense certainty through the self-recognition of consciousness to absolute knowing. To no small degree, Hegel’s criticism of Kant’s lifeless schematism of the understanding was foreshadowed by Goethe, who wrote, “Reason has to do with becoming, understanding with what has become. The former does not bother with the question, ‘what use?’; the latter does not ask ‘whence?’. Reason takes pleasure in development; understanding wishes to hold everything fixed so that it can exploit it,” (Goethe 1907, 555). Hegel’s formulation of Begriff, which designates the inner plan of the development of an object, was not wholly unlike Goethe’s Urphänomen (see below). The Hegelian dialectic, as an unveiling the movement of the concept would then correspond to the morphology. The problem, for Goethe, was that Hegel’s attempt to articulate wholeness began by the analysis of the logical concept of Being in the Logik and by the sublimation of the sense-certain observation of natural objects in the Phänomenologie, which for Goethe unjustifiably overlooks precisely that which it was the task of science to understand: the development of the natural forms of life, of which the mind is certainly a central one, but indeed only one example. As Goethe writes in a letter to Soret on February 13, 1829, “Nature is always true, always serious, always severe; it is always right, and mistakes and errors are always the work of men.” Similar to his critique of Kant, then, Goethe accused Hegel of creating a grand and abstract system to explain a phenomenon which in both ordinary life and in scientific observation could simply be assumed. Nature presents itself to the epistemologically reflective and to the naïve equally and without preference.
Arthur Schopenhauer’s (1788-1860) mother Johanna became fast friends with Goethe and his lover Christiane Vulpius when she moved to Weimra in 1804. His sister Adele was the lifelong confident of Ottile Pogwisch, who married Goethe’s and Christiane’s son Auguste. But for the young Arthur, due in part to an unavoidable clash of personalities, the established Goethe had little patience. Goethe recognized his intelligence early on, but declined to provide him a letter of recommendation to the university at Göttingen and offered him only a tepid letter of introduction to the classicist Friedrich August Wolf in Berlin. Schopenhauer’s dissertation, however, interested Goethe very much. In the winter of 1813-4, Goethe and Schopenhauer were engaged in extensive philosophical conversation concerning the former’s anti-Newtonian Farbenlehre (see below), out of which grew the latter’s Über das Sehen und die Farben in 1815. When Schopenhauer sent him the manuscript in the hopes of a recommendation, he grew impatient with the elder’s reticence to take his efforts sufficiently seriously. In truth, Schopenhauer’s work largely revealed Goethe’s as a failed attempt to overcome Newtonian visual theory, a fact which wounded Goethe deeply. Goethe followed Schopenhauer’s career with interest, however, and generally praised Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung. It remains a question, though, whether Goethe ever read the book carefully since scant reference to its ideas can be found.
Like that of his Erzieher Schopenhauer, Nietzsche’s (1844-1900) relationship with Goethe’s thought was deeply ambivalent. Nietzsche often admired Goethe as emblematic of a healthy, fully-formed individual. Goethe is said to be “the last German for whom I feel reverence,” (Nietzsche, Twilight of the Idols, “Skirmishes of an Untimely Man,” section 51). Nietzsche’s early contention that the tragic age of culture began only with the fortuitous interaction of the Apollonian and Dionysian drives bears a similarity to Goethe’s classical understanding of art as a tensional polarity between the blindly creative will and the constraint of formal rules. Yet Nietzsche takes Goethe to task for having invested too much in Winckelmann’s attribution of ‘Heiterkeit’ to classical antiquity and thereby for having ignored its deeply irrational underside. Moreover, Nietzsche’s ontology, if indeed he had one, is like Goethe’s in its rejection of static atomic substances and in its attempt to conceive an intrinsically agonistic process of becoming as the true character of the world. Similar, too, to Goethe’s ‘intensification’ principle, Nietzsche’s notoriously ambiguous ‘Will to Power’ characterizes the dynamic process by which entities ‘become what they are’ by struggling against oppositional limitations that are at the same time the necessary condition for growth. Due to this shared ontological outlook, Goethe and Nietzsche both thought contemporary science was constricted by an outdated conception of substance and, as a result, mechanistic modes of explanation should be reformulated to account for the dynamic character of nature. Despite these commonalities, Nietzsche jettisoned Goethe’s Bildungstrieb for an overarching drive–not to expression or growth within formal constraint—but for overcoming, for power.
Finally, Wittgenstein’s (1889-1951) claim that things which cannot be put into propositional form might nevertheless be shown bears a family resemblance to Goethe’s formulation of the daimonisch. But where Wittgenstein removes the proverbial ladder on which he ascends to his intuitions about the relation between logic and the world, thereby reducing what cannot be bound by the rules of logic as nonsensical, Goethe believed he could communicate what were admittedly ineffable Urphänomene in a non-propositional way, through the feelings evoked by drama. There is, moreover, a distinct similarity in Goethe’s and Wittgenstein’s views on the proper task of philosophy. Its aim, for both, can never be accomplished, once and for all, by means of ‘the right argument’. Argumentation, explanation, and demonstration only go so far in their attempt to unravel the mysteries of the world. “Philosophy simply puts everything before us; it fails to deduce anything,” (Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, 126).
Philosophy’s role in our life should guide us to be reflective people, ever ready to critique inherited dogmas, and always ready to revise our hypotheses in light of new observations. Goethe, through his ceaseless energy, limitless fascination with the world as it was presented to him, and his perpetual willingness to test his convictions against new evidence, carries a timeless appeal to philosophers, not because he demonstrated or explained what it meant to live philosophically, but because, through the example of the course of his life, he showed it.
Anthony K. Jensen
City University of New York / Lehman College
U. S. A.
Last updated: August 7, 2011 | Originally published: