Gorgias (483—375 B.C.E.)

Gorgias was a Sicilian philosopher, orator, and rhetorician. He is considered by many scholars to be one of the founders of sophism, a movement traditionally associated with philosophy, that emphasizes the practical application of rhetoric toward civic and political life. The sophists were itinerant teachers who accepted fees in return for instruction in oratory and rhetoric, and many claimed they could teach anything and its opposite (thesis and antithesis). Another aspect of their method was the ability to make the weaker argument the stronger. The term sophist in classical Greek was a general appellation denoting a “wise man.” They were important figures in Greece in the 4th and 5th centuries, and their social success was great. Plato was the first to use the term rhêtorikê, while the sophists termed their “art” logos . Nevertheless, Gorgias is commonly associated with the development of rhetoric in classical Greece. The democratic process in Athens supplied the need for instruction in both rhetoric and philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophy
    1. Ontology & Epistemology
    2. Rhetorical Theory
  3. Critics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Gorgias (483-375 B.C.E.) came to Greece from Leontini in Sicily. Little is known of his life before he arrived in Athens in 427 B.C.E. as a political ambassador seeking military assistance against Syracuse, a city-state in Sicily. He delivered a series of speeches that dazzled the Athenian audiences and won him fame and admiration. Upon completion of his mission, he traveled throughout Greece as a teacher of rhetoric and as an orator, and according to Aristotle, spoke at the Panhellenic festivals (Art of Rhetoric 1414b29). He was a student of Empedocles, and according to Quintilian and others, was the teacher of Isocrates. Plato identifies Meno (Meno 76Aff) among the students of Gorgias, and he may have been one of Aspasia’s instructors as well. Many of the sophists set up schools and charged fees in return for instruction in rhetoric, and Gorgias was no exception. Philostratus (Lives of the Sophists I 9, I) tells us that Gorgias began the practice of extemporaneous oratory, and that he had the boldness to say “‘suggest a subject’ …he was the first to proclaim himself willing to take the chance, showing apparently that he knew everything and would trust the moment to speak on any subject.” He died at the age of 108 at Larissa in Thessaly.

Four works are attributed to Gorgias: On the Nonexistent or On Nature, the Apology of Palamedes, the Encomium on Helen, and the Epitaphios or Athenian Funeral Oration. The original text of On Nature has been lost, and survives only in two different paraphrases, one in Sextus Empiricus’ Against the Professors and another in an anonymous work entitled Melissus, Xenophanes, Gorgias. There are two different manuscripts of Palamedes and Helen (the Cripps and Palatine versions), one slightly different than the other. Legal historians consider the Defense of Palamedes to be an important contribution to dicanic [explanatory] argumentation, and some cultural historians believe the Epitaphios was used as a stylistic and genre source for Plato’s Menexenus (Cosigny 2). Gorgias’ rhyming style is highly poetic, and he viewed the orator as an individual leading a kind of group incantation. He employs metaphor and figurative expressions to illustrate his assertions, and even uses humor as one instrument of refutation. The term macrologia (using more words than necessary in an effort to appear eloquent) is sometimes used to describe his oratorical technique (Kennedy 63).

2. Philosophy

Any student of Gorgias must immediately mark the distinction between his philosophy as expressed by Plato in the dialogue Gorgias (see below) and his philosophy found within the three works: On the Nonexistent, the Apology of Palamedes, and the Encomium on Helen.

a. Ontology & Epistemology

Nowhere is Gorgias’ sophistical love of paradox more evident than in the short treatise On the Nonexistent or On Nature. The subject of this work is ontological (concerning nature of being), but it also deals with language and epistemology (the study of the nature and limitations of knowledge). In addition to this, it can be understood as an exercise in sophistical rhetoric; Gorgias tackles an argument that is seemingly impossible to refute, namely that, after considering our world, we must come to the conclusion that “things exist.” His powerful argument to the contrary proves his abilities as a master of oratory, and some believe the text was used as an advertisement of his credentials.

Gorgias begins his argument by presenting a logical contradiction, “if the nonexistent exists, it will both exist and not exist at the same time” (B3.67) (a violation of the principle of non-contradiction). He then denies that existence (to on) itself exists, for if it exists, it is either eternal or generated. If it is eternal, it has no beginning, and is therefore without limit. If it is without limit, it is “nowhere” (B3.69), and hence does not exist. And if existence is generated, it must come from something, and that something is existence, which is another contradiction. Likewise, nonexistence (to mê on) cannot produce anything (B3.71). The sophist then explains that existence can neither be “one” (hen) or “many” (polla), since if it were one, it would be divisible, and therefore not one. If it were many, it would be a “composite of separate entities” (B3.74) and no longer the thing known as existence.

Gorgias then turns his attention to what is knowable and comprehensible. He remarks, “if things considered [imagined or thought] in the mind are not existent, the existent is not considered” (B3.77), that is to say, existence is incomprehensible. This supposition is backed up by the fact that one can imagine chariots racing in the sea, but that does not make such a thing happen. The operation of the mind (intellection) is fundamentally distinct from what happens in the real world; “the existent is not an object of consideration and is not apprehended” (B3.82). It is helpful to think of apprehension here in Aristotelian terms, as simple apprehension, the first operation of reasoning (logic) in which the intellect “grasps” or “apprehends” something. Simple apprehension happens when the mind first forms a concept of something in the world, and is anterior to judgment.

Finally, Gorgias proclaims that even if existence could be apprehended, “it would be incapable of being conveyed to another” (B3.83). This is because what we reveal to another is not an external substance, but is merely logos (from the Greek verb lego, “to say”–see below). Logos is not “substances and existing things” (B3.84). External reality becomes the revealer of logos (B3.85); while we can know logos, we cannot apprehend things directly. The color white, for instance, goes from a property of a thing, to a mental representation, and the representation is different than the thing itself. In its summation, this nihilistic argument becomes a “trilemma”:

i. Nothing exists
ii. Even if existence exists, it cannot be known
iii. Even if it could be known, it cannot be communicated.

This argument has led some to label Gorgias as either an ontological skeptic or a nihilist (one who believes nothing exists, or that the world is incomprehensible, and that the concept of truth is fictitious). But it can also be interpreted as an assertion that it is logos and logos alone which is the proper object of our inquiries, since it is the only thing we can really know. On Nature is sometimes seen as a refutation of pre-Socratic essentialist philosophy (McComiskey 37).

b. Rhetorical Theory

Most of what we know concerning Gorgias’ views on rhetoric comes from the Encomium. This work can be understood as a sophistical effort to rehabilitate the reputation of Helen of Troy. In it, Gorgias attempts to take the weaker argument and make it the stronger one, by arguing for a position contrary to well-established opinion: in this case, the opinion that Helen was to blame for the Trojan War. Gorgias argues that Helen succumbed either to (a) physical force (Paris’ abduction), (b) love (eros), or (c) verbal persuasion (logos), and in any instance, she cannot be blamed for her actions. According to Gorgias, logos is a powerful force that can be used nefariously to convince people to do things against their own interests. It can take the form of poetry (metrical language), divine incantations, or oratory. Logos is described as a “powerful lord” (B11.8) and “[t]he effect of speech upon the condition of the soul is comparable to the power of drugs over the nurture of bodies” (B11.14). This should be contrasted with the view of Isocrates that logos is a “chief” or “commander” (Nicoles 5-9). The difference here is subtle, but Gorgias’ dynastic concept of logos clearly turns it into a despotic overlord, while Isocrates’ “commander” is a leader with delegated authority, an individual who fights along side his troops.

Examples of persuasive speech, according to Gorgias, are the “conflicts among the philosophers’ arguments in which the swiftness of demonstration and judgment make the belief in any opinion changeable” (B11.13). This is similar to the assertion of Sextus Empiricus that equally convincing arguments can be formed against, or in favor of, any subject. Gorgias may have believed in a relative notion of truth that was contingent upon a particular kairos (an opportune moment or “opening”), that is to say, truth can only be found within a given moment. He seems to reject the idea of truth as a philosophically universal principle, and thus comes into conflict with Plato and Aristotle. Nevertheless, the rhetor (orator) is ethically obligated to avoid deception, and it is “the duty of the same man both to declare what he should rightly and to refute what has been spoken falsely” (B11.2). Ultimately, Gorgias’ opinion concerning truth is difficult to ascertain, but from his writings, we can conclude that he was more concerned with rhetorical argument than the truth of any given proposition or assertion.

In the epideictic speech Defense of Palamedes, Gorgias uses a mythical narrator (Palamedes) to further illustrate his rhetorical technique and philosophy. In the Odyssey, Palamedes was responsible for revealing Odysseus’ “madness” as a fiction, an act for which the latter never forgave him. Ultimately, Palamedes was executed for treason, after Odysseus accused him of conspiring with the Trojans. Gorgias focuses on the invention of arguments (topoi) necessary to exonerate Palamedes within the setting of a fictional trial, all of which depend upon probability. Palamedes could not have committed treason with a foreign power since he speaks no language other than Greek (B11a.6-7), and no Greek desires social power among barbarians (B11a.13). In the second example, we see that topoi “embody the values of the community, in the sense that they comprise what the community considers important” (Cosigny 84). A fundamental difference between the topoi found within Aristotle’s Art of Rhetoric and Gorgias’ topoi is that Aristotle’s are “acontextual, while Gorgias places his in the narrative context of the Palamedes myth” (McComiskey 49). Therefore, there is a direct relationship between kairos and invention.

Gorgias rejects the use of pathos (emotional appeal) in his Defense, with the assertion that “among you, who are the foremost of the Greeks …there is no need to persuade such ones as you with the aid of friends and sorrowful prayers and lamentations” (B11a.33). He prefers to use ethos (ethical appeal, or arguments from character) and logos, as his instruments of persuasion.

3. Critics

Gorgias’ most famous critic is Plato. In the dialogue Gorgias, Plato (through his mentor Socrates) expresses his contempt for sophistical rhetoric; all rhetoric is “a phantom of a branch of statesmanship (463d) …a kind of flattery …that is contemptible,” because its aim is simply pleasure rather than the welfare of the public. Nor can rhetoric be considered an art (technê), since it is irrational (465a). The end result of rhetoric is a cosmetic alteration of language that conceals truth and falsity (465b). Furthermore, rhetoric is “designed to produce conviction, but not educate people, about matters of right or wrong (455a). The character of Gorgias in the dialogue is forced to admit that his “art” deals with opinion (doxa) rather than knowledge (epistemê); that its intention is to persuade rather than to instruct, and that rhetoric deals with language without regard to content. Gorgias is portrayed as a man with an ambivalent attitude towards truth, a relativist, who boldly asserts that it does not matter if one truly has knowledge of any given subject, only that he is perceived by others to have knowledge, and that “[r]hetoric is the only area of expertise you need to learn. You can ignore all the rest and still get the better of the professionals!” (459c).

There are a number of explanations for Plato’s antipathy towards sophistic rhetoric. The first is simply philosophical; Plato was not a relativist, nor did he believe rhetoric had a pedagogical value. But there is also a political element to be considered. Bruce McComiskey points out that Plato believed in an “oligarchic government” for Athens, while many of the sophists “favored the Athenian Democracy the way it was” (20). It is important to point out that during Gorgias’ lifetime, both Leontini and Athens were democratic city states and a loose alliance existed between the two. On a more practical level, the Greek city states also served as a market for those who would sell instruction in rhetoric.

Aristotle dismisses Gorgias as a “frigid” stylist who indulges in excessive use of compound words such as “begging-poet-flatterers” and “foresworn and well-sworn” (Art of Rhetoric 1405b34). He also faults Gorgias for overly poetic language (1406b4), and we can see examples of this in Gorgias’ description of logos as a great dynast or lord (B11.8) and as a “drug” (B11.14). The sophist compares orators to “frogs croaking in water”(B3.30), and philosophers to the “suitors of Penelope” (B3.29).

Despite efforts by G.W.F Hegel and George Grote toward rehabilitating the reputations of Gorgias and the other sophists in the 19th century, the sophists still had a foul reputation well into the 20th century (as evidenced by the pejorative term “sophistry”). In 1930, French philosopher Jacques Maritain remarked “[s]ophistry is not a system of ideas, but a vicious attitude of the mind;” the sophists “came to consider as the most desirable form of knowledge the art of refuting and disproving by skillful arguments” (32-33). In recent years, however, modernists and post-structuralists have found great value in the philosophy of Gorgias, especially his theories on truth and language.

4. References and Further Reading

Note: the citations above regarding Gorgias’ statements follow the alpha-numeric system used by Sprague (see below) in the text The Older Sophists (B3=On Non-Being, B11=Encomium on Helen, B11a=Defense of Palamedes).

  • Aristotle. The Art of Rhetoric. Trans. John Henry Freese. London: WM Heinemann, 1967.
  • Barrett, Harold. The Sophists: Rhetoric, Democracy, and Plato’s Idea of Sophistry. Novata: Chandler & Sharp, 1987.
  • Consigny, Scott. Gorgias: Sophist and Artist. Columbia: University of South Carolina, 2001.
  • Freeman, Kathleen. Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers. Cambridge: Harvard, 1948.
  • Gorgias. Encomium of Helen. Trans. Douglas MacDowell. Glasgow: Bristol Classics, 1982.
  • Isocrates. Isocrates. 3 vols. Trans. George Norlin and LaRue Van Hook. Cambridge: Harvard, 1968.
  • Jarratt, Susan. “The First Sophists and the Uses of History.” Rhetoric Review 6 (1987): 67-77.
  • Jarratt, Susan C. Rereading the Sophists: Classical Rhetoric Refigured . Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press, 1991.
  • Kennedy, George. The Art of Persuasion in Greece. Princeton N.J.: Princeton University, 1963.
  • Kerferd, G.B. “The First Greek Sophists.” Classical Review 64 (1950): 8-10.
  • Marias, Julian. History of Philosophy. New York: Dover, 1967.
  • Maritain, Jacques. Introduction to Philosophy. Westminster MD: Christian Classics, 1991.
  • McComiskey, Bruce. Gorgias and the New Sophistic Rhetoric. Carbondale: Southern Illinois, 2002.
  • Plato. Gorgias. Trans. Robin Waterford. Oxford: Oxford, 1994.
  • Poulakos, John. Sophistical Rhetoric in Classical Greece. Columbia: University Of South Carolina, 1995.
  • Schiappa, Edward. “Sophistic Rhetoric: Oasis or Mirage?” Rhetoric Review 10 (1991):5-18.
  • Sprague, Rosamund Kent, ed. The Older Sophists. Columbia: University of South Carolina, 1972.

Author Information

C. Francis Higgins
Email: colin@louisiana.edu
University of Louisiana Lafayette
U. S. A.