A close friend and editor of Montaigne, Marie Le Jars de Gournay is best known for her proto-feminist essays defending equality between the sexes. Her unusual lifestyle as a single woman attempting to earn her living through writing matched her theoretical argument on the right of equal access of women and men to education and public offices. Gournay’s extensive literary corpus touches a wide variety of philosophical issues. Her treatises on literature defend the aesthetic and epistemological value of metaphor in poetic speech. Her works in moral philosophy analyze the virtues and vices of the courtier, with particular attention to the evil of slander. Her educational writings emphasize formation in moral virtue according to the Renaissance tradition of the education of the prince. Her social criticism attacks corruption in the court, clergy, and aristocracy of the period. In her writings on gender, Gournay marshals classical, biblical, and ecclesiastical sources to demonstrate the equality between the sexes and to promote the rights of women in school and in the workplace.
Born on October 6, 1565, Marie Le Jars belonged to a minor aristocratic family. Her father Guillaume Le Jars hailed from a noble family in the region of Sancerre; her mother Jeanne de Hacqueville descended from a family of jurists. Her maternal grandfather and paternal uncle had distinguished themselves as writers. After her birth, her father purchased the estate of Gournay-sur-Aronde; the family name now included “de Gournay.”
After the death of her father in 1578, Marie Le Jars de Gournay retired with her mother and siblings to the chateau of Gournay. An avid reader, she provided herself with her own education, centered on the classics and French literature. By the end of her adolescence, she had become fluent in Latin, learned at least some Greek, and had become a devotee of Ronsard and the Pléaide poets. Philosophically, she read Plutarch and other Stoic authors. Once she discovered the Essays of Montaigne, she became his enthusiastic disciple, with special interest in the more Stoic strands of his thought.
In 1588 Gournay personally met with Montaigne; the meeting would establish a lifelong friendship. Shortly after this encounter, Gournay wrote her novella The Promenade of Monsieur de Montaigne, Concerning Love in the Work of Plutarch. As subsequent correspondence and meetings deepened their association, Montaigne referred to Gournay as his “adopted daughter” and increasingly shared his intellectual preoccupations with her.
After the death of her mother in 1591, Gournay found herself in straitened financial circumstances. In 1593, the widow of the recently deceased Montaigne asked Gournay to edit a posthumous edition of the works of Montaigne. After working for more than a year at Montaigne’s estate in the Bordeaux region, Gournay produced the new edition of the works, completed by a long preface of her own composition, in 1595. Later in life, Gournay would produce numerous new and expanded editions of the works of Montaigne.
During the next decades, Gournay led a precarious existence in the salons and courts of Paris. As a single woman attempting to make a living through writing, translation, and editing, she became the object of mockery as well as of fascination in the capital’s literary coteries. Her translations from the Latin, especially of Vergil, earned her a reputation as a classical scholar. Often modeled after Montaigne’s essays, her treatises took sides in the controversies of the day. She praised the older poetry of the Pléiade and condemned newer, more neoclassical poetry. She defended the centrality of free will against Augustinians who stressed predestination. She championed a humanistic model of education, with its emphasis on the mastery of classical languages, against more scientific models. Her work as a controversialist reached its apogee in 1610, when she defended the unpopular Jesuits, whom many French pamphleteers had blamed for the assassination of King Henri IV by a religious fanatic the same year.
Despite her controversial reputation, Gournay became influential in court circles. She undertook writing assignments for Queen Margot, Marie de Médicis, and Louis XIII. In recognition of her literary skill, Cardinal Richelieu granted her a state pension in 1634. During the same period she assisted in the organization of the nascent Académie française. A committed Catholic sympathetic to the anti-Protestant parti dévot, she still maintained close connections to more libertine members of the Parisian salons, such as Gabriel Naudé and François La Mothe Le Vayer. She maintained a correspondence with other European female scholars, notably Anna Maria van Schurman and Bathsua Reginald Makin.
Having experienced opprobrium as a career woman devoted to professional writing, Gournay used her writings to criticize the misogyny of Parisian literary society. Her treatises Equality Between Men and Women (1622) and Complaints of Ladies (1626) defended the equality between the sexes and argued for equal access of both genders to education and to public offices. In 1626, she published a collection of her previous writings. A financial and critical success, this collection of her writings was subsequently expanded and reprinted by Gournay in 1634 and 1641. She died on July 13, 1645.
The works of Marie Le Jars de Gournay cover a variety of literary genres. As a translator, she published French versions of Cicero, Ovid, Tacitus, Sallust, and Vergil. Her multi-volume translation of the Aeneid was the most celebrated of her translations of the Latin classics.
As a novelist, she wrote The Promenade of Monsieur de Montaigne, Concerning Love in the Work of Plutarch. Written in 1588, this early work already raises Gournay’s proto-feminist concerns on the difficulties experienced by women who attempt to be the intellectual peers of men. Her poetry, modeled after the outdated verse of Ronsard, was less successful.
Her successive editions of the works of Montaigne, first published in 1595, enhanced Montaigne’s reputation among the literary and philosophical elite of Europe. Her repeatedly revised preface to these editions constituted an apology for the philosophical value and erudition of Montaigne’s essays.
As a formidable essayist herself, Gournay focused on several issues: the nature of literature; education of the prince; the nature of virtue and vice; the moral defects of contemporary society. Especially controversial were her treatises defending the equality between the sexes and the right of women to pursue a humanistic education. Equality Between Men and Women, Complaints of Ladies, and Apology for the Writing Women are illustrative of this genre.
In 1634 Gournay published a collection of her extant writings, called The Shadow of the Damoiselle de Gournay. In subsequent years, she revised and expanded this edition of her works. Named The Offerings or Presents of Demoiselle de Gournay, the last collection of her works was published in 1641. This edition of her works runs to more than one thousand closely printed pages.
Gournay’s treatises study numerous philosophical issues. Her works on literary theory defend the value of figurative speech, especially metaphor, to communicate complex metaphysical truths. Her moral theory reflects the ethics of the Renaissance courtier. Personal honor is the preeminent virtue, calumny the major vice. Her pioneering work on gender insists on the equality of the sexes and on the malicious prejudice which has barred women from educational and work opportunities. Especially bold is her social criticism. Numerous essays condemn the political and religious institutions of contemporary France for their moral defects.
A prolific poet and translator, Gournay devotes numerous treatises to issues of language and literature. Against the neoclassical purism of certain literary critics of the period, Gournay defends the value of neologism and figurative speech. In particular she defends the aesthetic and epistemological value of metaphor in poetic discourse. Not only does metaphor please the senses of the reader; it communicates certain truths about God, nature, and the human soul which cannot be expressed through more concise, abstract rhetoric. Defense of Poetry provides her most extensive analysis of innovation and simile in the poetic expression of truth.
Against contemporary critics who attempt to purify the French language through increasing stress on the rules of grammar and rhetoric, Gournay argues that poetic speech is inventive by nature. The use of neologisms, elaborate analogies, and colorful synonyms constitutes the craft of the poet. “Every artisan practices his or her craft according to the judgment of his or her mind. We are artisans in our own language. In other words, we are not only bound to work according to what we have received and learned; we are even more bound to shape, enrich, and build it, in order to add riches to riches, beauties to beauties.” Vibrant innovation rather than imitation is the duty of the poet in creating his or her discourse.
The richly figured rhetoric defended by Gournay contrasts with the purified, restrained speech promoted by the influential neoclassical literary establishment. The attempt to purify language of complex metaphor only leads to a vitiated speech produced by grammarians rather than poets. “We must also laugh at what happens to these overly refined scholars when they spot some metaphorical phrase that bears excellence in its construction, brilliance, or exquisite power. Not only do they fail to notice its beauty or its value; they denounce it and preach that restraint is more preferable.” The pedantic speech encouraged by such strictures against metaphor quickly numbs the reader by its aridity and lack of variation.
Not only is speech denuded of metaphor bound to bore the reader; it fails to communicate the complex truths which poetry is destined to express. The abstract, purified language of the scholar is incapable of expressing the surging emotive and spiritual life of the human person. “[This purist approach] cannot pierce right down to the bone, as is necessary for the imagination to be properly expressed. This must be done by a lively and powerful attack…. [The purists’] principal concern is to flee not only the frequent metaphors and proverbs we formerly used, but also to abandon borrowings from foreign languages, new expressive styles of speaking, and most of the lively diction and popular expressions—all those devices which everywhere strengthen a clause by making it more striking, especially in poetry.” The new pedantic poetry tends toward the decorative; authentic poetry, rich in its figurative devices and colorful rhetoric, is alone capable of expressing the life great poetry embodies. “May others look for milk and honey, if that’s what they want. We are looking for what is called spirit and life. I call it ‘life’ with good reason, since all speech that lacks this celestial ray in its composition—this ray of powerful dexterity, suppleness, agility, capacity to soar—is dead.”
Gournay invokes the philosopher Seneca to support her thesis that authentic poetic expression of life necessarily employs vivid, figured speech. Great poetry often enjoys the mystical air of religious revelation. “Seneca, a philosopher, a grave Stoic, teaches us that the soul escapes from itself and soars outside of humanity in order to give birth to something high and ecstatic far above its peers and above humanity itself.” The rule-based strictures of the neoclassical establishment, which focuses on the surface rather than the substance of speech, threaten to destroy the religious vision which is the font of poetic inspiration. “True poetry is an Apollonian furor. Do they [neoclassical critics] want us to be their disciples after having been those of Apollo? Rather, do they want us to be their schoolboys, since they crank out laws for us in order for us to crank out others?”
For Gournay, her battle against the surging neoclassical aesthetic in France is neither a simple issue of taste nor nostalgia for the embroidered lyricism of the Pléiade; it is a combat for a poetry that can express the richness of the experience of life through the verbal armory of synonym, analogy, and simile. Only in metaphorical speech can the author express the complexity of the soul’s pilgrimage as well as touch the senses and imagination of the potential reader.
In many treatises Gournay presents her moral philosophy. Centered on questions of virtue and vice, Gournay’s moral theory defends an aristocratic code of conduct tied to the virtue of honor. With personal reputation as a supreme good, calumny emerges as a principal evil and violence practiced in defense of one’s honor as a moral duty.
Like other neo-Stoic authors of the period, Gournay admits that the nature and authenticity of virtue is elusive. But unlike many of her contemporaries, she does not simply dismiss virtue as a mask of the vice of pride. In Vicious Virtue, she argues that the elusiveness of virtue is tied to the hidden motivations behind virtuous acts. While one may observe external actions, one cannot observe the occult motives inspiring the moral agent to act in an apparently virtuous manner. “One cannot remove from humanity all the virtuous actions it practices because of coercion, self-interest, chance, or accident. Even graver are the external virtues which follow on some vicious inclination…To eliminate all such virtuous acts would place the human race closer to the rank of simple animals than I would dare to say.” Much, if not all, of human moral action is motivated by immoral or amoral factors. External virtuous conduct is caused more by personal interest or accident than by conscious virtuous intention. To eliminate all the moral actions inspired by less than virtuous motives is to eliminate practically all deliberative moral action; the only remaining activity is comparable to that manifested by non-rational animals.
Despite the fragility of virtue, Gournay identifies certain virtues and vices as central in the moral conflicts of the age. Calumny is a particularly dangerous vice because it destroys the personal honor and social reputation which Gournay considers a paramount moral good. Undoubtedly, Gournay’s personal experience of battling the criticisms launched against her and of the backbiting gossip of the court helped to focus her campaign against calumny.
Of Slander provides a detailed analysis of the malicious gossip which Gournay believed to be one of the principal evils of the age. Citing Aristotle, Gournay claims that personal honor is the most estimable external possession of the human person. “Every day we risk many goods for the sake of life and we risk our lives for the sake of a piece of honor. This is why Aristotle calls it the greatest of external goods, just as he qualifies shame as the greatest of external evils. Moreover, can we deny that the love of honor is necessary as the powerful author and tutor of virtue? At the very least, it is nine-tenths of the ten parts that make up virtue. This is because few people are capable of biting right into this fruit, which seems too bitter without this bait.” Since honor is so central for the cultivation of virtue, the loss of personal reputation paralyzes the pursuit of the good and constitutes a severe moral loss for the individual so affected.
Not only does calumny destroy the reputation and happiness of the victimized individual; it constitutes a grave evil for the entire ambient society. Invoking the patristic author Bernard of Clairvaux, Gournay argues that calumny and other forms of malicious gossip constitute a serious sin, which God has promised to punish with special force. “Both the gossip and his or her voluntary audience carry around the devil, one on the tongue, the other in the ear. This murderous thrust of the tongue transpierces three persons in one blow: the offended party, the speaker, and the listener.” By destroying truth and the respect of persons, calumny attacks the very foundations of social life. It abets other expressions of the contempt of persons, such as mockery and sarcasm. Of Slander demonstrates how easily the practice of calumny causes physical violence, such as its frequent provocation of recourse to the duel by the party whose honor has been outraged.
Gournay’s adherence to an aristocratic code of honor also appears in her treatment of violence in Is Revenge Legitimate? The treatise recognizes that Christianity would appear to ban vengeance; the believer is called to love his or her enemies and exercise forbearance in the face of evil. But Gournay argues that only minor or ineradicable evils are to be treated this way; major injustices, such as assaults on the good name of oneself or of one family, demand swift reparation. God’s greatest gift to human beings, reason itself, indicates that such moral infractions require strict retribution if the order of justice sustaining society is to be preserved. “We must not doubt that this great God has given us Reason as the touchstone and lighthouse in this life. He has based his moral laws on reason and reason on his moral laws….The Free Will which God has given us as the instrument of our salvation would be useless or would rather be a dangerous trap if it were not enlightened by this Reason, because this power did not have any light itself. We must see if Reason could tolerate the entire abolition of vengeance, if justice and utility could do without it.” For Gournay, the answer is obviously negative. The defense of the social order of justice requires the willingness of individuals and of the state to uphold the order of justice by swiftly punishing those who have violated the honor of others. The risks of abuse in the execution of this retribution should not blind individuals and the state to its necessity. The alternative is anarchy.
In her analysis of virtue and vice, Gournay attacks the corruption of prominent social institutions of the period. She does not hesitate to criticize the moral failings of three powerful institutions: the court, the clergy, and the aristocracy. Her critique of the vices typical of each institution serves the broader goal of the moral reform of France along the lines of the principles of the reforming council of the Catholic Church, the Council of Trent.
In Considerations on Some Tales of Court, Gournay criticizes the malicious gossip that dominates the court atmosphere. Flowing from false personal pride, this tendency to slander other courtiers easily leads to violence. “Slander is beloved by those who are looking for a fight. It seems to give them a certain distinction of freedom. But when I see the measures of security many of those who practice slander today take, I see the mark of servitude rather than of freedom.” The treatise recounts how such contemptuous slander has recently provoked duels and civil wars in France. Ultimately, it weakens loyalty to the throne by the ridicule it heaps upon the royal family and courtiers, thus undermining the stability of the social order itself.
Counsels to Certain Churchmen focus on a particular abuse: laxity in the practice of sacramental confession. In principle, sacramental confession is the occasion for the Catholic to express sorrow for sins, express the sincere resolution to avoid committing these sins in the future, and, if judged properly contrite, to receive absolution and an appropriate restitutionary penance from the confessor. In practice, lax confessors, who mechanically grant absolution, have turned the sacrament into a “cosmetics machine.” No moral reform or authentic repentance occurs in this conspiracy between hardened sinners and indulgent confessors. To make confession once again an instrument of moral conversion, Gournay insists that the confessor must employ the armory of spiritual arms available to him in treating obdurate sinners. “To move or strengthen a penitent toward this charity [repentant love of God], notably in what concerns abstaining from committing the offense in the future, the confessor should not spare the use of solicitude, remonstrance, threats, infliction of penalties, even on occasion the refusal of absolution. Divine, civil, and philosophical judgments tell us that if we do not prevent a crime, its evil is imputed to us. The mouth of Saint Paul says the same thing about our responsibility: in cases of necessity, he orders us to abandon the sinner to Satan through excommunication in order to bring the sinner to repentance.” The moral rigorism of Gournay is evident in this exhortation to confessors. Only a strict practice of repentance and restitution on part of the sinner and of demanding scrutiny on the part of the confessor can make the act of sacramental confession the serious means of moral conversion it was instituted to be.
The vices of the French aristocracy are the object of attack in Of the Nothingness of the Average Courage of this Time and Of the Low Price of the Quality of the Nobility. The primary vice of this social class is the absence of what should be their defining virtue: courage. Gournay understands by courage the willingness to defend the weak which originally distinguished the nobility of the sword. “Generous courage necessarily includes courtesy and benevolence, conjoined with a prudent use of courageous force. It should not appear to vanquish the strong more than it lifts up the weak. Among other reasons, this is because the vindication and protection of the weak is the very justification for the use of force and of its consequences.” Even before the chivalric code, Plato had accurately defined the virtue of fortitude as “a prudent, tolerant expression of courage in order to realize what is just and helpful.”
According to Gournay, the traditional courage of the aristocracy has deteriorated into a cult of power for its own sake. Rather than exercising its martial prerogatives on behalf of the oppressed, many nobles have become oppressors themselves by the use of violent power to advance their own interests or even whims. “The first problem is the power and arrogance which flow from the sword hanging at the side of nobles. Few of them manage to avoid becoming intoxicated by this power. The second is a certain contagious illusion they pick up by imitation of others. They start to believe that they are the important people, the eminent ones, and the leaders of a gang in court or in the provinces. They usurp power, they strike a peasant or a simple bourgeois, they insult the first and worst-armed person they meet simply to have revenge—and any remonstrance concerning their behavior has little effect. They make a scepter or rather a god out of power.” This corruption of power into violent self-importance threatens the civil order, since it inaugurates lawlessness and civil wars motivated by little more than personal jealousy.
Gournay does not spare the poorer classes in her social critique. In Of False Devotions Gournay criticizes those who believe that the performance of external devotions guarantee their salvation; it is only the cultivation of moral virtues in free cooperation with divine grace that can unite the human soul to God. Gournay places unusual emphasis on two moral virtues involving self-reflection: integrity and probity. “Among the virtues preeminent in rank are those of integrity and probity, because they give us a special attachment to the Creator and contain all the other considerations we owe the divine majesty. The other virtues ally us primarily to other human beings.” Given the self-reflective quality of these prime virtues, Gournay censures unbalanced devotionalism for its irrational, whimsical qualities. The wish to please God through external gifts displaces the hard work of moral reform that should be the touchstone of the Christian life.
The stress on the cultivation of virtue over the pursuit of external devotion is not a uniquely Christian concern; Gournay cites Aristotle in her argument that the upright moral agent must carefully attempt to eradicate every vice. “The Philosopher holds that a human being is vicious if he or she possesses just one vice and is not virtuous if he or she does not possess all the virtues.” Certain Catholic popular devotions run the risk of deceiving their practitioners of the true state of their souls if they divert the devotee from moral scrutiny and repentance. “These devourers of rosaries who called themselves devout are lying if they are covetous, envious, imposters, mockers, or slanderers, that is to say, the executioners of reputation, or if they assault some other interests of their neighbors.” As is typical in Gournay’s scale of virtue, the mendacious destruction of another’s reputation emerges as the gravest vice. When such vices are allied to the ostentatious practice of popular devotions, the vice is doubled by hypocrisy.
Closely linked to her moral philosophy is Gournay’s educational theory. In several treatises on the education of a prince, Gournay argues that the primary purpose of education is the formation of moral character. The cultivation of virtue in general and of the virtues specific to one’s state in life constitutes the principal aim of instruction. Humanistic in nature, the ideal education of the prince also entails extensive exercise in modern and classical languages.
Of the Education of the Royal Children of France outlines the primarily moral nature of authentic education. In Gournay’s perspective, the pupil must be encouraged to cultivate moral virtue by precept and example. The development of a moral personality is not guaranteed by nature or providence, since human beings possess a spacious free will. “The salvation of the human race depends on what falls under its choice and free will. Prevenient grace cannot force this choice although it does encourage the will to make the good choice and strengthens it when it consents. Because of this we know that if we try to imprint on minds such qualities as faith, virtue, and reason—which we could otherwise call God’s commandments—the minds will conserve the impression of such qualities.” Art must build on nature in developing the moral character of the pupil, because the adult’s exercise of freedom will be shaped by the moral dispositions encouraged in early age. The assistance provided by God’s grace in adhering to the good should not be exaggerated, since grace does not overwhelm the moral agent’s exercise of personal freedom. In her treatment of grace and freedom, Gournay clearly sides with her Jesuit allies against the emphasis of neo-Augustinian Catholics and Protestants on predestination.
The principal emphasis in this moral formation is the cultivation of the virtues. Successful education should emphasize the development of virtues proper to the pupil’s future state in life as well as the development of the cardinal virtues. Gournay’s plan for the education of the prince illustrates the mixture of generic and specific moral habits. “Our muses or sciences should teach Prudence, Temperance, Fortitude and Justice. Beyond that, they should teach liveliness, concentration, elegance, eloquence, good judgment, and restraint. Because we are speaking of courtiers, they should also teach chivalry, courtesy, politeness, and a charming personal grace.” The development of a moral character capable of leadership, diplomacy, and inspiration is the ultimate aim of such a royal pedagogy.
Since the cultivation of moral personality is the central aim of education, successful education depends to a great extent on the moral character of those chosen as teachers. In the case of royalty, extraordinary care must be exercised in the choice of governors, teachers, and tutors. Gournay sketches the ideal portrait of the governor chosen to supervise the education of the prince. “We seek a governor who respects the laws of heaven and earth and who loves his country; a man of the ancient faith; a man who has never damaged the goods, honor, tranquility, or liberty of another; a man who prefers to undergo an injustice than to commit one; a man who is dutiful, well-mannered, charitable, free from pride and vanity; a disinterested man, who sees clearly and who acts in his own affairs as he advises others to do; a man whom one can believe when he is speaking about a friend, an enemy, or himself; who easily accepts obligations; whose words are without artifice, whose counsel is honest, whose resolution is constant; a man who has noble courage, diligent work habits, solid morals, a sense of moderation, even temper; someone whose self-possession protects him from the lure and applause of the world.” This endless catalogue of ethical qualities for the ideal governor indicates the centrality of moral character for all educational personnel, since the moral personality of the prince develops in large part through emulation of those who instruct him.
In Institution of the Sovereign Prince, Gournay details the more humanistic side of her model of education. In addition to moral education, the prince requires a literary formation. Among the disciplines to be studied, Gournay underscores the importance of grammar, logic, philosophy, and theological doctrine. She stresses the role of languages in this humanistic curriculum. In addition to French, the pupil should learn Latin; ideally the pupil should master Latin as Montaigne did, by learning to speak it from the cradle. Tutors should guide the pupil through Latin classics. Also desirable is the study of Greek and Hebrew. Not only will this literary formation provide the sovereign with cultural polish; it will permit him to understand more deeply the issues of polity and justice treated in depth by Holy Scripture and the classics.
This classical study will also reinforce the pedagogical effort to strengthen the pupil’s commitment to moral virtue. A lifelong habit of serious study of the classics will encourage the monarch’s commitment to virtue. The governed will imitate the virtue or lack of it in the rule and the recreation of the one who governs. “It is necessary for a ruler to find his relaxation and delight in the muses; otherwise, he will surrender to life of debauchery, luxury, gambling, or gossip….If he indulges in debaucheries, luxury, and gambling, one will see soon enough that his subjects will grow morally ill through the contagion.” The humanistic initiation into the appreciation of classical literature and art complements the moral formation that might prove too austere without the allure of the muses.
The most celebrated of Gournay’s treatises defend the equality between the sexes. Equality Between Men and Women argues that the current subordination of women to men is based on prejudice; only the lack of educational opportunities explains the difference in cultural achievement between the sexes. Complaint of Ladies explores the roots of the misogyny which has reduced women to a state of servitude.
In Equality Between Men and Women, Gournay develops a cumulative argument from classical, biblical, and ecclesiastical arguments to demonstrate gender equality. This catalogue of philosophical and theological authorities, as well as the historical achievements of women themselves, indicates that prejudice alone has caused the irrational denigration of women that has become the creed of contemporary society.
Among philosophers supporting gender equality, Plato holds pride of place. “Plato, to whom no one denies the title of ‘divine,’ assigns them [women] the same rights, faculties, and functions in the Republic.” The treatise also marshals citations from Aristotle, Cicero, Plutarch, Boccaccio, Tasso, and Erasmus on behalf of gender equality. The historical achievements of Sappho, Hypatia of Alexandria, and Catherine of Sienna, among other women, indicate the intellectual capacity of women.
Scripture and church history provide just as ample a catalogue of citations supporting the equality of the sexes and examples of women who held offices comparable to those held by men. From the opening book of Genesis, Holy Scripture insists that both men and women are made in the divine image; thus, they are both capable of rational reflection and are both the subject of the same rights and duties. Several women are named as authors of biblical texts: Anne, Mary, Judith. Deborah served as a prophet, Judith as a warrior, Tecla as a coworker with Saint Paul. Of special interest to Gournay is the status of Mary Magdalene, who is the first disciple commissioned to announce the news of Christ’s resurrection and who bears the ancient title of ‘Apostle to the Apostles.’ Sacred tradition often depicts her preaching to the masses in Provence. The sacerdotal ministries of church governance and preaching thus appear to be open to women as well as men. Gournay dismisses Saint Paul’s restrictions on the teaching and preaching activities of women in church as a simple precaution against the possible temptation caused by the view of women who are “more gracious and attractive” than men.
Giving women equal access to education will quickly overcome the misogynist burdens under which they currently labor. Deprivation of education is the sole cause of the current gap between the sexes in the area of cultural achievement. “If the ladies arrive less frequently to the heights of excellence than do the gentlemen, it is because of this lack of good education. It is sometimes due to the negative attitude of the teacher and nothing more. Women should not permit this to weaken their belief that they can achieve anything.” The path to sexual equality in the future lies in the improvement of educational opportunities for women and in the discouragement of misogynistic stereotypes which discourage women from even attempting cultural achievements.
Complaint of Ladies explores the depth of the misogyny which makes sexual equality such a distant, chimerical goal. Gournay condemns the current social situation of women as one of tacit slavery. “Blessed are you, Reader, if you are not of the sex to which one forbids all goods, depriving it of freedom. One denies this sex just about everything: all the virtues and all the public offices, titles, and responsibilities. In short, this sex has its own power taken away; with this freedom gone, the possibility of developing virtues through the use of freedom disappears. This sex is left with the sovereign and unique virtues of ignorance, servitude, and the capacity to play the fool, if this game pleases it.” Despite the clear philosophical, historical, scriptural, and ecclesiastical evidence for the dignity of woman and for her fundamental equality with man, the political and literary mainstream of French society continues to treat women as chattel.
Especially disturbing is the contempt with which the era’s misogynist literature treats women. Gournay condemns the sarcastic dismissal of woman which characterizes so many of these texts. “When I read these writings by men, I suspect that they see more clearly the anatomy of their beards than they see the anatomy of their reasons. These tracts of contempt written by these doctors in moustaches are in fact quite handy to brush up the luster of their reputation in public opinion, since to gain esteem from the masses—this beast at several heads— nothing is easier than to mock so and so and [to compare them to] a poor crazy woman.” If in principle men and women are clearly equal, in fact this equality will be difficult to practice in a society poisoned by a popular misogynist art, whose irrational fantasies require no further justification.
The reception of the works of Marie Le Jars de Gournay follows three distinct periods. During her lifetime, Gournay’s writings attracted a large cultivated public. Her polemical style and combative positions in the religious, political, and literary quarrels of the period made her a prominent essayist. By the end of the seventeenth century, she had become virtually unread. New editions of Montaigne had superseded her own; the antiquated quarrels over Ronsard or grace elicited little interest. This oblivion lasted well into the twentieth century. At the end of the century, Gournay’s works underwent a revival in literary and philosophical circles. The major impetus for this new interest was the feminist effort to expand the canon of the humanities to include the texts of long-ignored female authors. Gournay’s proto-feminist essays on gender equality constituted the focus of this revival. In recent decades, they have become the object of numerous editions, translations, and commentaries.
The interpretation of the philosophy of Gournay remains largely tied to her work on the equality between the sexes and her attendant criticism of the social oppression of women. While her pioneering work in gender theory merits such scholarly attention, it has tended to obscure her other philosophical concerns. Gournay’s contributions to aesthetics, ethics, pedagogy, social criticism, and theology invite further discovery. Gournay’s works have also suffered from her close association with Montaigne. While her philosophy is clearly indebted to the mentor she reverently invokes as “the author of the Essais,” her philosophy differs from the more skeptical theories of Montaigne. Whereas Montaigne often invokes a constellation of classical authorities to show their contradictions and to argue that many controversies have no certain solution, Gournay frequently invokes a catalogue of classical and biblical authorities to demonstrate the impressive consensus that exists among philosophical and theological authorities on a disputed topic and thus to identify the correct solution. Gournay’s distinctive method of Catholic-humanism, in which a flood of classical and ecclesiastical authorities are harmonized to prove the truth of a contested philosophical thesis, requires further scholarly analysis.
The translation from French to English above are by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 27, 2010 | Originally published: