The Ancient Greek philosophers have played a pivotal role in the shaping of the western philosophical tradition. This article surveys the seminal works and ideas of key figures in the Ancient Greek philosophical tradition from the Presocratics to the Neoplatonists. It highlights their main philosophical concerns and the evolution in their thought from the sixth century BCE to the sixth century CE.
The Ancient Greek philosophical tradition broke away from a mythological approach to explaining the world, and it initiated an approach based on reason and evidence. Initially concerned with explaining the entire cosmos, the Presocratic philosophers strived to identify its single underlying principle. Their theories were diverse and none achieved a consensus, yet their legacy was the initiation of the quest to identify underlying principles.
This sparked a series of investigations into the limit and role of reason and of our sensory faculties, how knowledge is acquired and what knowledge consists of. Here we find the Greek creation of philosophy as “the love of wisdom,” and the birth of metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics. Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle were the most influential of the ancient Greek philosophers, and they focused their attention more on the role of the human being than on the explanation of the material world. The work of these key philosophers was succeeded by the Stoics and Epicureans who were also concerned with practical aspects of philosophy and the attainment of happiness. Other notable successors are Pyrrho‘s school of skepticism and the Neoplatonists such as Plotinus who tried to unify Plato’s thought with theology.
The Western philosophical tradition began in ancient Greece in the 6th century BCE. The first philosophers are called “Presocratics” which designates that they came before Socrates. The Presocratics were from either the eastern or western regions of the Greek world. Athens — home of Socrates, Plato and Aristotle — is in the central Greek region and was late in joining the philosophical game. The Presocratic’s most distinguishing feature is emphasis on questions of physics; indeed, Aristotle refers to them as “Investigators of Nature”. Their scientific interests included mathematics, astronomy, and biology. As the first philosophers, though, they emphasized the rational unity of things, and rejected mythological explanations of the world. Only fragments of the original writings of the Presocratics survive, in some cases merely a single sentence. The knowledge we have of them derives from accounts of early philosophers, such as Aristotle’s Physicsand Metaphysics, The Opinions of the Physicists by Aristotle’s pupil Theophratus, and Simplicius, a Neoplatonist who compiled existing quotes.
The first group of Presocratic philosophers were from Ionia. The Ionian philosophers sought the material principle (archê) of things, and the mode of their origin and disappearance. Thales of Miletus (about 640 BCE) is reputed the father of Greek philosophy. He declared water to be the basis of all things. Next came Anaximander of Miletus (about 611-547 BCE), the first writer on philosophy. He assumed as the first principle an undefined, unlimited substance (to apeiron)itself without qualities, out of which the primary opposites, hot and cold, moist and dry, became differentiated. His countryman and younger contemporary, Anaximenes, took for his principle air, conceiving it as modified, by thickening and thinning, into fire, wind, clouds, water, and earth. Heraclitus of Ephesus (about 535-475 BCE) assumed as the principle of substance aetherial fire. From fire all things originate, and return to it again by a never-resting process of development. All things, therefore, are in a perpetual flux. However, this perpetual flux is structured by logos– which most basically means ‘word,’ but can also designate ‘argument,’ ‘logic,’ or ‘reason’ more generally. The logos which structures the human soul mirrors the logos which structures the ever-changing processes of the universe.
Philosophy was first brought into connection with practical life by Pythagoras of Samos (about 582-504 BCE), from whom it received its name: “the love of wisdom”. Regarding the world as perfect harmony, dependent on number, he aimed at inducing humankind likewise to lead a harmonious life. His doctrine was adopted and extended by a large following of Pythagoreans, including Damon, especially in Lower Italy.
That country was also the home of the Eleatic doctrine of the One, called after the town of Elea, the headquarters of the school. It was founded by Xenophanes of Colophon (born about 570 BCE), the father of pantheism, who declared God to be the eternal unity, permeating the universe, and governing it by his thought. His great disciple, Parmenides of Elea (born about 511), affirmed the one unchanging existence to be alone true and capable of being conceived, and multitude and change to be an appearance without reality. This doctrine was defended by his younger countryman Zeno in a polemic against the common opinion, which sees in things multitude, becoming, and change. Zeno propounded a number of celebrated paradoxes, much debated by later philosophers, which try to show that supposing that there is any change or multiplicity leads to contradictions. The primary legacy of Zeno is that subsequent scholars became very aware of the difficulty of properly handling the concept of infinity.
Empedocles of Agrigentum (born 492 BCE) appears to have been partly in agreement with the Eleatic School, partly in opposition to it. On the one hand, he maintained the unchangeable nature of substance; on the other, he supposes a plurality of such substances — i. e. the four elements, earth, water, air, and fire. Of these the world is built up, by the agency of two ideal principles as motive forces — namely, love as the cause of union, strife as the cause of separation. Empedocles was also the first person to propound an evolutionary account of the development of species.
Anaxagoras of Clazomenae (born about 500 BCE) also maintained the existence of an ordering principle as well as a material substance, and while regarding the latter as an infinite multitude of imperishable primary elements, qualitatively distinguished, he conceived divine reason or Mind (nous) as ordering them. He referred all generation and disappearance to mixture and resolution respectively. To him belongs the credit of first establishing philosophy at Athens, in which city it reached its highest development, and continued to have its home for one thousand years without intermission.
The first explicitly materialistic system was formed by Leucippus (fifth century BCE) and his pupil Democritus of Abdera (born about 460 BCE). This was the doctrine of atoms — literally ‘uncuttables’ — small primary bodies infinite in number, indivisible and imperishable, qualitatively similar, but distinguished by their shapes. Moving eternally through the infinite void, they collide and unite, thus generating objects which differ in accordance with the varieties, in number, size, shape, and arrangement, of the atoms which compose them.
The efforts of all these earlier philosophers had been directed somewhat exclusively to the investigation of the ultimate basis and essential nature of the external world. Hence their conceptions of human knowledge, arising out of their theories as to the constitution of things, had been no less various. The Eleatics, for example, had been compelled to deny that senses give one any access to the truth, since to the world of sense, with its multitude and change, they allowed only a phenomenal existence. However, reason can give one knowledge of what the One is like–or, more accurately, what it is not like.
Retaining the skepticism of the Eleatics about the senses, while rejecting their doctrines about the ability of reason to reach truth apart from the senses, the Sophists held that all thought rests solely on the apprehensions of these senses and on subjective impression, and that therefore we have no other standards of action than convention for the individual. Specializing in rhetoric, the Sophists were more professional educators than philosophers. They flourished as a result of a special need for at that time for Greek education. Prominent Sophists include Protagoras, Gorgias, Hippias, and Prodicus.
A new period of philosophy opens with the Athenian Socrates (469-399 BCE). Like the Sophists, he rejected entirely the physical speculations in which his predecessors had indulged, and made the thoughts and opinions of people his starting-point; but whereas it was the thoughts of and opinions of the individual that the Sophists took for the standard, Socrates questioned people relentlessly about their beliefs. He tried to find the definitions of the virtues, such as courage and justice, by cross-examining people who professed to have knowledge of them. His method of cross-examining people, the elenchus, did not succeed in establishing what the virtues really were, but rather it exposed the ignorance of his interlocutors.
Socrates was an enormously magnetic figure, who attracted many followers, but he also made many enemies. Socrates was executed for corrupting the youth of Athens and for disbelieving in the gods of the city. This philosophical martyrdom, however, simply made Socrates an even more iconic figure than would have been otherwise, and many later philosophical schools took Socrates as their hero.
Of Socrates’ numerous disciples many either added nothing to his doctrine, or developed it in a one-sided manner, by confining themselves exclusively either to dialectic or to ethics. Thus the Athenian Xenophon contented himself, in a series of writings, with exhibiting the portrait of his master to the best of his comprehension, and added nothing original. The Megarian School, founded by Euclides of Megara, devoted themselves almost entirely to dialectic investigation of the one Good. Stilpo of Megara became the most distinguished member of the school. Ethics predominated both with the Cynics and Cyrenaics, although their positions were in direct opposition. Antisthenes of Athens, the founder of the Cynics, conceived the highest good to be the virtue which spurns every enjoyment. Cynicism continued in Greece with Menippus and on to Roman times through the efforts of Demonax and others. Aristippus of Cyrene, the founder of the Cyrenaics,considered pleasure to be the sole end in life, and regarded virtue as a good only in so far as it contributed to pleasure.
Both aspects of the genius of Socrates were first united in Plato of Athens (428-348 BCE), who also combined with them many the principles established by earlier philosophers, and developed the whole of this material into the unity of a comprehensive system. The groundwork of Plato’s scheme, though nowhere expressly stated by him, is the threefold division of philosophy into dialectic, ethics, and physics; its central point is the theory of forms. This theory is a combination of the Eleatic doctrine of the One with Heraclitus’s theory of a perpetual flux and with the Socratic method of concepts. The multitude of objects of sense, being involved in perpetual change, are thereby deprived of all genuine existence. The only true being in them is founded upon the forms, the eternal, unchangeable (independent of all that is accidental, and therefore perfect) archetypes, of which the particular objects of sense are imperfect copies. The quantity of the forms is defined by the number of universal concepts which can be derived from the particular objects of sense.
The highest form is that of the Good, which is the ultimate basis of the rest, and the first cause of being and knowledge. Apprehensions derived from the impression of sense can never give us the knowledge of true being — i.e. of the forms. It can only be obtained by the soul’s activity within itself, apart from the troubles and disturbances of sense; that is to say, by the exercise of reason. Dialectic, as the instrument in this process, leading us to knowledge of the ideas, and finally of the highest idea of the Good, is the first of sciences (scientia scientiarum). In physics, Plato adhered (though not without original modifications) to the views of the Pythagoreans, making Nature a harmonic unity in multiplicity. His ethics are founded throughout on the Socratic; with him, too, virtue is knowledge, the cognition of the supreme form of the Good. And since in this cognition the three parts of the soul — cognitive, spirited, and appetitive — all have their share, we get the three virtues: Wisdom, Courage, and Temperance or Continence. The bond which unites the other virtues is the virtue of Justice, by which each several part of the soul is confined to the performance of its proper function.
The school founded by Plato, called the Academy (from the name of the grove of the Attic hero Academus where he used to deliver his lectures) continued for long after. In regard to the main tendencies of its members, it was divided into the three periods of the Old, Middle, and New Academy. The chief personages in the first of these were Speusippus (son of Plato’s sister), who succeeded him as the head of the school (till 339 BCE), and Xenocrates of Chalcedon (till 314 BCE). Both of them sought to fuse Pythagorean speculations on number with Plato’s theory of ideas. The two other Academies were still further removed from the specific doctrines of Plato, and advocated skepticism.
The most important among Plato’s disciples is Aristotle of Stagira (384-322 BCE), who shares with his master the title of the greatest philosopher of antiquity. But whereas Plato had sought to elucidate and explain things from the supra-sensual standpoint of the forms, his pupil preferred to start from the facts given us by experience. Philosophy to him meant science, and its aim was the recognition of the purpose in all things. Hence he establishes the ultimate grounds of things inductively — that is to say, by a posteriori conclusions from a number of facts to a universal. In the series of works collected under the name of Organon, Aristotle sets forth the laws by which the human understanding effects conclusions from the particular to the knowledge of the universal.
Like Plato, he recognizes the true being of things in their concepts, but denies any separate existence of the concept apart from the particular objects of sense. They are inseparable as matter and form. In matter and form, Aristotle sees the fundamental principles of being. Matter is the basis of all that exists; it comprises the potentiality of everything, but of itself is not actually anything. A determinate thing only comes into being when the potentiality in matter is converted into actuality. This is effected by form, inherent in the unified object and the completion of the potentiality latent in the matter. Although it has no existence apart form the particulars, yet, in rank and estimation, form stands first; it is of its own nature the most knowable, the only true object of knowledge. For matter without any form cannot exist, but the essential definitions of a common form, in which are included the particular objects may be separated from matter. Form and matter are relative terms, and the lower form constitutes the matter of a higher (e.g. body, soul, reason). This series culminates in pure, immaterial form, the Deity, the origin of all motion, and therefore of the generation of actual form out of potential matter.
All motion takes place in space and time; for space is the potentiality, time the measure of the motion. Living beings are those which have in them a moving principle, or soul. In plants the function of soul is nutrition (including reproduction); in animals, nutrition and sensation; in humans, nutrition, sensation, and intellectual activity. The perfect form of the human soul is reason separated from all connection with the body, hence fulfilling its activity without the help of any corporeal organ, and so imperishable. By reason the apprehensions, which are formed in the soul by external sense-impressions, and may be true or false, are converted into knowledge. For reason alone can attain to truth either in cognition or action. Impulse towards the good is a part of human nature, and on this is founded virtue; for Aristotle does not, with Plato, regard virtue as knowledge pure and simple, but as founded on nature, habit, and reason. Of the particular virtues (of which there are as many as there are contingencies in life), each is the apprehension, by means of reason, of the proper mean between two extremes which are not virtues — e.g. courage is the mean between cowardice and foolhardiness. The end of human activity, or the highest good, is happiness, or perfect and reasonable activity in a perfect life. To this, however, external goods are more of less necessary conditions.
The followers of Aristotle, known as Peripatetics (Theophrastus of Lesbos, Eudemus of Rhodes, Strato of Lampsacus, etc.), to a great extent abandoned metaphysical speculation, some in favor of natural science, others of a more popular treatment of ethics, introducing many changes into the Aristotelian doctrine in a naturalistic direction. A return to the views of the founder first appears among the later Peripatetics, who did good service as expositors of Aristotle’s works, such as Avicenna and Averroes.
The Peripatetic School tended to make philosophy the exclusive property of the learned class, thereby depriving it of its power to benefit a wider circle. This soon produced a negative reaction, and philosophers returned to the practical standpoint of Socratic ethics. The speculations of the learned were only admitted in philosophy where serviceable for ethics. The chief consideration was how to popularize doctrines, and to provide the individual, in a time of general confusion and dissolution, with a fixed moral basis for practical life.
Such were the aims of Stoicism, founded by Athens about 310 by Zeno of Citium (in Cyprus), and brought to fuller systematic form by his successors a heads of the school, Cleanthes of Assos, and especially Chrysippus of Soli, who died about 206. Important Stoic writers of the Roman period include Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius. Their doctrines contained little that was new, seeking rather to give a practical application to the dogmas which they took ready-made from previous systems. With them philosophy is the science of the principles on which the moral life ought to be founded. The only allowable effort is towards the attainment of knowledge of human and divine things, in order to thereby regulate life. The method to lead men to true knowledge is provided by logic; physics embraces the doctrines as to the nature and organization of the universe; ethics draws from them its conclusions for practical life. Regarding Stoic logic, all knowledge originates in the real impressions of things on the senses, which the soul, being at birth a blank slate, receives in the form of presentations. These presentations, when confirmed by repeated experience, are syllogistically developed by the understanding into concepts. The test of their truth is the convincing or persuasive force with which they impress themselves upon the soul.
In physics the foundation of the Stoic doctrine was the dogma that all true being is corporeal. Within the corporeal they recognized two principles, matter and force — that is, the material, and the Deity (logos, order, fate) permeating and informing it. Ultimately, however, the two are identical. There is nothing in the world with any independent existence: all is bound together by an unalterable chain of causation. The agreement of human action with the law of nature, of the human will with the divine will, or life according to nature, is virtue, the chief good and highest end in life. It is essentially one, the particular or cardinal virtues of Plato being only different aspects of it; it is completely sufficient for happiness, and incapable of any differences of degree. All good actions are absolutely equal in merit, and so are all bad actions. All that lies between virtue and vice is neither good nor bad; at most, it is distinguished as preferable, undesirable, or absolutely indifferent. Virtue is fully possessed only by the wise person, who is no way inferior in worth to Zeus; he is lord over his own life, and may end it by his own free choice. In general, the prominent characteristic of Stoic philosophy is moral heroism, often verging on asceticism.
The same goal which was aimed at in Stoicism was also approached, from a diametrically opposite position, in the system founded about the same time by Epicurus, of the deme Gargettus in Attica (342-268), who brought it to completion himself. Epicureanism, like Stoicism, is connected with previous systems. Like Stoicism, it is also practical in its ends, proposing to find in reason and knowledge the secret of a happy life, and admitting abstruse learning only where it serves the ends of practical wisdom. Hence, logic (called by Epicurus (kanonikon), or the doctrine of canons of truth) is made entirely subservient to physics, physics to ethics. The standards of knowledge and canons of truth in theoretical matters are the impressions of the senses, which are true and indisputable, together with the presentations formed from such impressions, and opinions extending beyond those impressions, in so far as they are supported or not contradicted by the evidence of the senses. In practical questions the feelings of pleasure and pain are the tests. Epicurus’s physics, in which he follows in essentials the materialistic system of Democritus, are intended to refer all phenomena to a natural cause, in order that a knowledge of nature may set men free from the bondage of disquieting superstitions.
In ethics he followed within certain limits the Cyrenaic doctrine, conceiving the highest good to be happiness, and happiness to be found in pleasure, to which the natural impulses of every being are directed. But the aim is not with him, as it is with the Cyrenaics, the pleasure of the moment, but the enduring condition of pleasure, which, in its essence, is freedom from the greatest of evils, pain. Pleasures and pains are, however, distinguished not merely in degree, but in kind. The renunciation of a pleasure or endurance of a pain is often a means to a greater pleasure; and since pleasures of sense are subordinate to the pleasures of the mind, the undisturbed peace of the mind is a higher good than the freedom of the body from pain. Virtue is desirable not for itself, but for the sake of pleasure of mind, which it secures by freeing people from trouble and fear and moderating their passions and appetites. The cardinal virtue is prudence, which is shown by true insight in calculation the consequences of our actions as regards pleasure or pain.
The practical tendency of Stoicism and Epicureanism, seen in the search for happiness, is also apparent in the Skeptical School founded by Pyrrho of Elis (about 365-275 BCE). Pyrrho disputes the possibility of attaining truth by sensory apprehension, reason, or the two combined, and thence infers the necessity of total suspension of judgment on things. Thus can we attain release from all bondage to theories, a condition which is followed, like a shadow, by that imperturbable state of mind which is the foundation of true happiness. Pyrrho’s immediate disciple was Timon. Pyrrho’s doctrine was adopted by the Middle and New Academies (see above), represented by Arcesilaus of Pitane (316-241 BCE) and Carneades of Cyrene (214-129 BCE) respectively. Both attacked the Stoics for asserting a criterion of truth in our knowledge; although their views were indeed skeptical, they seem to have considered that what they were maintaining was a genuine tenet of Socrates and Plato.
The latest Academics, such as Antiochus of Ascalon (about 80 BCE), fused with Platonism certain Peripatetic and many Stoic dogmas, thus making way for Eclecticism, to which all later antiquity tended after Greek philosophy had spread itself over the Roman world. Roman philosophy, thus, becomes an extension of the Greek tradition. After the Christian era Pythagoreanism, in a resuscitated form, again takes its place among the more important systems. Pyrrhonian skepticism was also re-introduced by Aenesidemus, and developed further by Sextus Empiricus. But the preeminence of this period belongs to Platonism, which is notably represented in the works of Plutarch of Chaeronea and the physician Galen.
The closing period of Greek philosophy is marked in the third century CE. by the establishment of Neoplatonism in Rome. Its founder was Plotinus of Lycopolis in Egypt (205-270) and its emphasis is a scientific philosophy of religion, in which the doctrine of Plato is fused with the most important elements in the Aristotelian and Stoic systems and with Eastern speculations. At the summit of existences stands the One or the Good, as the source of all things. It emanates from itself, as if from the reflection of its own being, reason, wherein is contained the infinite store of ideas. Soul, the copy of the reason, is emanated by and contained in it, as reason is in the One, and, by informing matter in itself non-existence, constitutes bodies whose existence is contained in soul. Nature, therefore, is a whole, endowed with life and soul. Soul, being chained to matter, longs to escape from the bondage of the body and return to its original source. In virtue and philosophic thought soul had the power to elevate itself above the reason into a state of ecstasy, where it can behold, or ascend up to, that one good primary Being whom reason cannot know. To attain this union with the Good, or God, is the true function of humans, to whom the external world should be absolutely indifferent.
Plotinus’s most important disciple, the Syrian Porphyry, contented himself with popularizing his master’s doctrine. But the school if Iamblichus, a disciple of Porphyry, effected a change in the position of Neoplatonism, which now took up the cause of polytheism against Christianity, and adopted for this purpose every conceivable form of superstition, especially those of the East. Foiled in the attempt to resuscitate the old beliefs, its supporters then turned with fresh ardor to scientific work, and especially to the study of Plato and Aristotle, in the interpretation of whose works they rendered great services. The last home of philosophy was at Athens, where Proclus (411-485) sought to reduce to a kind of system the whole mass of philosophic tradition, until in 529 CE, the teaching of philosophy at Athens was forbidden by Justinian.
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Last updated: January 15, 2010 | Originally published: April 16, 2001
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