Gregory of Nyssa spent his life in Cappadocia, a region in central Asia Minor. He was the most philosophically adept of the three so-called Cappadocians, who included brother Basil the Great and friend Gregory of Nazianzus. Together, the Cappadocians are credited with defining Christian orthodoxy in the Eastern Roman Empire, as Augustine (354—430 C.E.) was to do in the West. Gregory was a highly original thinker, drawing inspiration from the pagan Greek philosophical schools, as well as from the Jewish and Eastern Christian traditions, and formulating an original synthesis that was to influence later Byzantine, and possibly even modern European, thought. A central idea in Gregory’s writing is the distinction between the transcendent nature and immanent energies of God, and much of his thought is a working out of the implications of that idea in other areas–notably, the world, humanity, history, knowledge, and virtue. This leads him to expand the nature-energies distinction into a general cosmological principle, to apply it particularly to human nature, which he conceives as having been created in God’s image, and to rear a theory of unending intellectual and moral perfectibility on the premise that the purpose of human life is literally to become like the infinite nature of God.
Gregory of Nyssa was born about 335 C.E. in Cappadocia (in present-day Turkey). He came from a large Christian family of ten children–five boys and five girls. Gregory’s family is significant, for two of the most influential people on his thought are two of his elder siblings–his sister Macrina (c.327—379) and Basil (c.330—379), the oldest boy in the family. Along with Basil and fellow-Cappadocian and friend Gregory of Nazianzus (c.329—c.391), Gregory of Nyssa forms the third of a trio of Christian thinkers, collectively known as the Cappadocians, who established the main lines of orthodoxy in the Christian East. Basil, who became the powerful bishop of Caesarea, was the most politically skilled churchman of the group. He appointed his younger brother to the see by which he is now known, and rightly predicted that Gregory would confer more distinction on the obscure town of Nyssa than he would receive from it. Gregory of Nazianzus was a brilliant orator, best known for his five “theological orations,” which succinctly summarized the Cappadocian consensus. But the deepest thinker of the three was Gregory of Nyssa. Gregory stands at a crossroads in the theological development of the Christian East: he sums up many of the ideas of his great predecessors, such as the Jewish philosopher Philo of Alexandria (c.20 B.C.E.—c.54 C.E.) and the Christian Origen (c.185—254 C.E.), and initiates the development of themes that will appear in the most prominent of the later Byzantine thinkers, notably the Pseudo-Dionysius (c.500) and Gregory Palamas (1296 – 1359).
As the eldest boy, Basil was the only one of Gregory’s siblings to receive a formal education. So Basil in all probability became the teacher of his younger brother. If so, he certainly did an excellent job, for in this case the pupil went on to outshine the teacher. Gregory is thoroughly at home with the philosophers that were in vogue in his day: Plato (427—347 B.C.E.)—especially as “updated” and systematized by Plotinus (204 – 270 CE)–Aristotle (384 – 322 BCE), and the Stoics. On reading his works, one cannot but be struck by the abundance of allusions to the Platonic dialogues. Yet it would be a mistake to say, as Cherniss famously does, that “Gregory . . . merely applied Christian names to Plato’s doctrine and called it Christian theology” (The Platonism of Gregory of Nyssa: 62). As will be seen below, there is a pronounced linear view of history in Gregory’s thought, which can only be of Hebrew provenance. Moreover, the reader will discover an originality in Gregory that anticipates not only his Byzantine successors, but also such moderns as John Locke (1632 – 1704) and Immanuel Kant (1724 – 1804).
The turning point in Gregory’s life came about 379, when both his brother Basil and his sister Macrina died. The burning issue at the time was the Arian heresy, which by then had entered its last and most logically rigorous phase. Arianism was a Christological heresy, named for its founder Arius (c. 256 – 336), that held that Christ was neither divine nor human, but a sort of demigod. The principal defender of Arianism at the time, Eunomius of Cyzicus (c. 325 – c. 394), argued that the Arian doctrine could even be derived from the very concept of God, as will be seen below. For most of this period, the brunt of the battle for orthodoxy had been led by Basil; but when he died, and shortly thereafter Gregory’s beloved sister, Gregory felt that the responsibility for defending orthodoxy against the Arian heresy had fallen on his shoulders. Thus began the most productive period of one of the most brilliant of Christian thinkers–far too little known and appreciated in the West.
That period was launched by the publication of his Against Eunomius, Gregory’s four-book refutation of that last phase of the Arian heresy. It was followed by many more works, the most significant being On the Work of the Six Days, Gregory’s account of the creation of the world; On the Making of Man, his account of the creation of humankind; The Great Catechism, the most systematic statement of Gregory’s philosophy of history; On the Soul and the Resurrection, a dialogue with Macrina detailing Gregory’s eschatology; Biblical commentaries on the life of Moses, the inscriptions of the Psalms, Ecclesiastes, the Song of Songs, the Beatitudes, and the Lord’s Prayer; theological works on Trinitarian and Christological doctrine; and shorter ascetic and moral treatises. Many of these will be discussed below.
Gregory was present at the final defeat of Arianism in the Council of Constantinople of 381. Nothing more is heard from him after about 395 CE.
Gregory’s concept of God is born out of the Arian controversy. Arianism arose out of the need to make sense of the apparently conflicting Biblical depictions of Christ. For example, how is one to understand Jesus’ claim that “I and the Father are one” (John 10:30) when it seems to be contradicted by the admission that “the Father is greater than I” (John 14:28)? This sort of problem prompted Arius to postulate that Christ was neither divine nor human, but something in between–a demigod, the oldest and most perfect created being, to be sure, but created nonetheless. By Gregory’s day, the leading spokesman for Arian theology was Eunomius of Cyzicus, who argued for Arianism on strictly philosophical grounds. The created nature of Christ could be derived by an analysis of the very concept of God, Eunomius argued; for it is God’s essential nature to be unbegotten, whereas Christ is confessed to be “begotten of the Father.” If this sort of argument were allowed to stand, what was to become the orthodox faith–the faith enunciated at Nicaea in 325 CE that Christ was literally “of the same substance” with the Father–would be radically transformed.
Gregory counters Eunomius, not by simply staking out the opposite position and defending it with Scriptural artillery, as most of his fellow Nicenes had done, but, more interestingly, by repudiating the central presupposition of Eunomian theology–that one can derive by a process of analysis concepts that are essentially predicated of God. God is incomprehensible; thus, it is presumptuous in the extreme to suppose that God can be defined by a set of human concepts. When we are speaking of God’s inner nature, all that we can say is what that nature is not (Against Eunomius II [953 - 960, 1101 - 1108], IV 11 ). In saying this, Gregory anticipates the negative theology of the Pseudo-Dionysius and much medieval thought.
Nevertheless, if that were the whole story–if we were left with God’s utter incomprehensibility and nothing more–then Gregory’s theology would be a very much stunted exposition of Christianity. After all, in the Beatitudes Christ promises, “Blessed are the pure in heart, for they shall see God.” (Matt. 5:8) If God’s inner nature is knowable only negatively, how is this possible? More generally, if God is simply some remote, unknowable entity, what possible relation to the world could God ever have? Gregory answers these questions by distinguishing between God’s nature (phusis) and God’s “energies” (energeiai)–the projection of the divine nature into the world, initially creating it and ultimately guiding it to its appointed destination (Beatitudes VI ). The idea of God’s energies in Gregory’s theology approximates to the Western concept of grace, except that it emphasizes God’s actual presence in those parts of creation which are perfected just because of that presence. By distinguishing between God’s nature (sometimes he uses the word “substance”–ousia) and God’s energies, Gregory anticipates the more famous substance-energies distinction of the fourteenth century Byzantine theologian Gregory Palamas.
Does all of this have any sort of rational basis? Though he frequently appeals to Scripture to support his claims, Gregory does in fact argue for the existence of God. And although he concedes that God’s inner nature will always remain a mystery to us, Gregory holds that we can attain some knowledge of God’s energies. This does not mean, however, that God does not have a transcendent nature. As will be seen below, for Gregory everything that exists has an inner nature that cannot be known immediately and is knowable only through its energies. God is only the most striking instance of this. If it can be shown that God exists, it follows necessarily in Gregory’s mind that God has a nature. But God’s existence is derived from our knowledge of God’s energies, and those energies are in turn known both indirectly and directly.
The indirect route relies on the order apparent in the cosmos. The fact that the universe is orderly indicates that it is governed according to some rational plan, which implies the existence of a divine Planner (Against Eunomius II [984 - 985, 1009, 1069]; Great Catechism Prologue , 12 ; Work of the Six Days ; Life of Moses II 168 [377 - 380]; Ecclesiastes I , II [644 - 645]; Song of Songs I [781 - 784], XI [1009 - 1013], XIII [1049 - 1052]; Beatitudes VI ). In noting this, Gregory is relying on an argument that had been around since the early Stoics–the argument from design (cf. Cicero, Nature of the Gods II 2.4 – 21.56). Now there are several things to notice about this argument. In the first place it is an analogical one: just as a work of art leads us to infer the existence of an artist, so the artistry displayed in the order of nature suggests the existence of a Creator. But if Gregory’s argument is nothing more than a generalized appeal to the harmony of the universe, it is not a very persuasive basis for proving the existence of God. For that there are laws of nature is nothing surprising: to have anything at all, from cosmos to quark, is to have order. If this is all that Gregory means, his argument at best reduces to the cosmological, or “first cause,” argument that any chain of creating or sustaining causes requires a first member, which “everyone would call God,” as Thomas Aquinas puts it (Summa Theologiae I q. 2 a. 3). Such an argument, however, is not very convincing. Why not an infinite chain of causes, for instance? Or even more to the point, why can’t things exist on their own? It doesn’t seem that the cosmological argument rules out either of these two possibilities.
However, what Gregory has in mind seems to be something more specific. In certain passages Gregory suggests that it is not order in general but the blending of opposites into a harmonious whole that would have never happened spontaneously, but only through the power of a Creator. The heavens accommodate contrary motions, and these motions give rise to unmoving, static laws (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [440 - 441]); heavy bodies are borne downward and light bodies upward, and simple causes bring about complex effects (Soul and Resurrection [25 - 28]). In all these situations opposites not only fail to annihilate each other, but they even contribute to an overall harmony. The emphasis here is not on order in general, but on unexpected order. Given what we know about motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and the rest, Gregory argues, we would expect to find them excluding, rather than complementing, each other. The fact that they behave in unanticipated ways can only be explained by the exercise of divine power.
Now one could object at this point that these phenomena are by no means surprising; they are surprising to Gregory only because the scientific knowledge of the fourth century is not as advanced as that of the twenty-first. However, it is not all that difficult to abstract the general point from Gregory’s particular examples and to bring his argument up-to-date by replacing motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and so forth with modern examples of phenomena that cannot be explained by any known law of physics (the “lumpiness” of the universe, for example). Yet our hypothetical objector still has a point, as is particularly obvious to us who are examining the thought of a fourth century figure seventeen centuries later. The fact that a phenomenon seems to violate what we think we know of the laws of nature does not imply that it really does violate those laws. Our knowledge may simply be too limited. So the fact that we find order in nature that we don’t expect may simply be a function of the limitation of our knowledge rather than of the intervention of God in the world.
The direct method whereby God’s energies are known is by examining our own moral purification. It was observed above that Gregory’s concept of the divine energies is very similar to the Western concept of grace, except that for Gregory, as for Eastern thinkers in general, grace is due to the actual presence of God and not some action at a distance. As Gregory puts it, “Deity is in everything, penetrating it, embracing it, and seated in it” (Great Catechism 25 ). So we directly experience the divine energies in the only thing in the universe that we can view from within–ourselves. But God’s energies are always a force for good. Thus we encounter them in the experience of virtues such as purity, passionlessness, sanctity, and simplicity in our own moral character: “if . . . these things be in you,” Gregory concludes, “God is indeed in you” (Beatitudes VI ).
Some scholars (for example, Balas, Metousia Theou, p. 128) argue that for Gregory energeiai should be translated “operations” rather than “energies,” thus bringing Gregory’s concept of God’s energeiai more into line with Aquinas’ concept of God’s power (Summa Theologiae I qq. 8, 25), or of God’s effects (cf. Summa Theologiae I q. 2, a. 2; q. 12, a. 12). But such an interpretation will not do for two reasons. First, Gregory insists that God exists in God’s energeiai just as much as in God’s nature (Against Eunomius I 17 , cf. Letter to Xenodorus). He could not say that if God’s energeiai were merely God’s operations. Second, it was shown above that Gregory uses the concept of God’s energeiai to explain how the “pure in heart” can “see God.” Once again, one cannot “see God” in God’s operations, except in a metaphorical sense; but one can literally “see God” with the spiritual sense of sight (on the spiritual senses, see below) if God is, as Gregory claims, actually “present within oneself” (Beatitudes VI ).
Gregory’s account of the creation of the world reflects the nature-energies logic developed in his polemic against Eunomius. The account unfolds via an allegorical reflection on the first chapter of Genesis, and closely follows the much earlier work of Philo of Alexandria. Like Philo (Creation of the World 3.13), Gregory does not take literally the temporal sequence depicted therein; rather, he envisions creation as having taken place all at once (Work of the Six Days [69 - 72, 76]). Within this atemporal framework, the key “event” was the creation of the firmament on the second day (Work of the Six Days [80 - 85]), for it is the firmament that divides the intelligible world, created on the first day (Work of the Six Days [68 - 85]), from the sensible world, created on days three through six (Work of the Six Days [85 - 124])–again, broadly similar to Philo (Creation of the World 7.29 – 10.36, 44.129 – 44.130). Now the intelligible world was by Gregory’s day pictured as a pleroma of Platonic forms existing as ideas in the mind of God; for ever since the advent of Middle Platonism in the first century BCE, the Platonic forms had been transmuted from self-subsistent entities (as Plato conceived them) to ideas in the divine mind. The classic problem with this view, going as far back as Plato himself, was to explain how these forms become instantiated in the material world.
Gregory recasts this problem in theological terms: how could God, who is immaterial, have created the material world? The answer lies in the Aristotelian distinction between the category of substance and the other categories–relation, quality, quantity, place, time, action, passion (Categories 1 – 9)–which Gregory designates with the Stoic term “qualities” (poiotetes). In themselves, qualities are ideas in the mind of God. But they can also be projected out from God; and when that happens, they become visible. Now Gregory observes that although we ordinarily speak of these immanent qualities as inhering in substances, all we really perceive are the qualities of things, not their substances. It is but a short step to the conclusion that a physical object is nothing more than the convergence of its qualities. Thus matter as such doesn’t really exist; bodies are really just “holograms” formed by this convergence of qualities. Consequently there is no problem of how an immaterial God could have created a material world, for the world isn’t material at all (Against Eunomius II ; Work of the Six Days ; Making of Man 24 [212 - 213]; Soul and Resurrection ).
Elsewhere, Gregory explicitly uses the term “energies” to cover those qualities that are immanent in the physical world. Energies, Gregory contends, are the “powers” and “movements” by which substances are “manifested”; the energy of each thing is its “distinguishing property” (idioma)–a technical Stoic term for a specific, as opposed to a generic, quality. Gregory goes so far as to assert that apart from its energies a nature not only cannot be known, but does not even exist. (Letter to Xenodorus).
Gregory’s position bears a curious resemblance to that of John Locke; for according to Locke we know only the nominal essences of things, not their real essences. Thus substance is a “something . . . we know not what” (Essay II xxiii 3). All we really know of substances are their attributes, which constitute their nominal essences (Essay II xxxi 6 – 10, III iii 15 – 19). In this light consider the following passage from Against Eunomius:
Even the inquiry as to that thing in the flesh itself which assumes all the corporeal qualities has not been pursued to any definite result. For if any one has made a mental analysis of that which is seen into its component parts, and, having stripped the object of its qualities, has attempted to consider it by itself, I fail to see what will have been left for investigation. For when you take from a body its color, its shape, its hardness, its weight, its quantity, its position, its forces active or passive, its relation to other objects, what remains that can still be called a body, we can neither see of ourselves nor are taught by Scripture. . . . Wherefore also, of the elements of this world we know only so much by our senses as to enable us to receive what they severally supply for our living. But we possess no knowledge of their substance . . . . (Against Eunomius II )
In Gregory’s account of creation, the nature-energies distinction, developed to counter Eunomius’ defense of the Arian heresy, becomes extended into a general cosmological principle. The most important consequence of this extension is its application to the capstone of the cosmic order–human nature.
The fundamental fact about human nature according to Gregory of Nyssa is that humans were created in the image of God. This means that because in God a transcendent nature exists which projects energies out into the world, we would expect the same structural relation to exist among human beings vis-a-vis their bodies. And in fact that is precisely what Gregory argues concerning the human nous (a word that is traditionally translated “mind” but which by the fourth century CE had submerged its intellectual connotations into the religious idea of its separateness from the physical world). In fact, so central is the nature-energies distinction to his conception of human personhood, that Gregory, again taking his inspiration from Philo (Creation of the World 46.134 – 46.135), uses it to explain the two accounts of the creation of human beings in Genesis 1 and 2 respectively. The original creation, in which God makes the human race “in our image, after our likeness” (Gen. 1:26) is of the transcendent human nature. The second creation, in which God “formed man of dust from the ground, and breathed into his nostrils the breath of life,” (Gen. 2:7) is of the energies of the soul coupled with the body in which they are present (Making of Man 16 – 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]).
The most important characteristic of the nature of the nous is that it provides for the unity of consciousness. How are my varied perceptions, deriving from various sense organs, all coordinated with each other? Aristotle himself had addressed this problem by postulating the existence of a common sense (On the Soul III 1 – 2). But Gregory moves beyond Aristotle’s psychological explanation. Using the metaphor of a city in which family members come in by various gates but all meet somewhere inside, Gregory’s answer is that this can occur only if we presuppose a transcendent self to which all of one’s experiences are referred (Making of Man 10 [152 - 153]). But this unity of consciousness is entirely mysterious and so is much like the mysterious nature of the Godhead (Making of Man 11 [153 - 156]). One is reminded of Kant’s theory of the transcendental unity of apperception (Critique of Pure Reason, Transcendental Deduction).
Yet the nous is also extended throughout the body by its energies, which constitute our ordinary psychological experiences (Making of Man 15 [176 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [41 - 44]). Furthermore, the nous may at different times be more or less present to the body. During waking life the energies of the nous are present throughout the body. But during sleep the presence of nous to body is much more tenuous, and at death is even more so (though not absolutely nonexistent) (Great Catechism 8 ; Making of Man 12 – 15 [160 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [45 - 48]).
The parallels between the divine and the human extend all the way down to the evidential basis for the existence of the human nous. For the existence of the nous rests on a “design” argument analogous to the argument for the energies of God. Indeed the body resembles a machine; and because the latter is governed by nous, it is probable that the former is also. And just as Gregory bases his indirect argument for the existence of God’s energies on the unexpected order of natural phenomena, so here he argues that because the components of a living body are observed to behave in a manner “contrary to [their] nature”–air being harnessed to produce sound, water impelled to move upward, and so forth–we may infer the existence of a nous imposing its will upon recalcitrant matter through its energies (Soul and Resurrection [33 - 40]). This should not be particularly surprising since Gregory regards the human body as a miniature, harmonious version of the cosmos as a whole (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [441 - 444]).
There are two further characteristics of the human nous according to Gregory. First, because the human nous is created in the image of God, it possesses a certain “dignity of royalty” (to tes basileias axioma) that is lacking in the rest of creation. For it means that there is an aspect of the human person that is not of this world. Of no other organism can that be said. The souls of other species are totally immanent in their bodies. They have only energies, in other words. Only the human nous has a transcendent nature in addition to its energies. But that more than anything else is what makes us like God. Now God is of supreme worth. Consequently human beings have an inherent “dignity of royalty” just by virtue of being human (Making of Man 2 – 4 [132 - 136]).
Second, the nous is free. In an early work Gregory argues strenuously against astral determinism (On Fate [145 - 173]). In his more mature reflections, Gregory derives the freedom of the nous from the freedom of God. For God, being dependent on nothing, governs the universe through the free exercise of will; and the nous is created in God’s image (Making of Man 4 ). Once again, absent the theological emphasis, on both counts there is a broad similarity with Kant (cf. Groundwork II – III); and that similarity will only become more obvious when the ways in which Gregory applies these ideas are explored within the context of his philosophy of history.
Early on, Christian theology developed a distinctive way of conceptualizing God. Rather than a simple monotheism, Christianity held that God, though unitary, could be understood as also existing as a Trinity of three Persons–a Father, the font of the Godhead; a Son, the Word (John 1:1-5) and Wisdom (Prov. 8:22-31) of God, incarnated as Jesus Christ; and a Holy Spirit, who is sent into the world by the Father. Now Gregory lived at a crossroads in the theological understanding of this doctrine. Prior to the era of the ecumenical councils, the first of which was Nicaea, discussed above, the Trinity tended to be viewed as three stages in the outflow of God into the world, with the Father as its source and the Holy Spirit as its termination. Yet beginning with the Church councils, the Trinity gradually came to be understood differently, as three distinctions to be made within God’s inner nature itself. Not surprisingly, both models of the Trinity can be found in Gregory. Yet the first is clearly more congenial to his distinctive nature-energies understanding of God than the second. Indeed, one might question whether the second makes any sense at all in light of the typical Byzantine insistence on the incomprehensibility of God’s inner nature: if God’s nature is incomprehensible, how can we say it is both three and one–unless by doing so we wish to emphasize God’s very incomprehensibility?
Not only is the earlier model of the Trinity more consistent with Gregory’s view of God as a transcendent nature whose energies are projected into the world; it also adds to it a dynamic and historical dimension that the bare nature-energies distinction fails to capture on its own. As noted above, the Father is always transcendent; and at the other extreme, the Holy Spirit is God’s glory (Song of Songs VI ): it “manifests [the Son's] energy” (Great Catechism 2 ) in the world. It is the second Person of the Trinity who is the most interesting because it provides Gregory with the conceptual apparatus to explain God’s operation in history, for the point at which the second Person enters the world becomes the point in time in which God is more intimately present to the world than before.
Gregory’s philosophy of history begins with the fall of Adam from perfection. Earlier it was noted that according to Gregory humankind was fashioned in two creations–one of the nature of the nous, the other of its energies together with the body. The reason for the second creation was that God foresaw that humans would sin and so be unable to reproduce in a disembodied, angelic way; thus, they required bodies to allow them to propagate (Making of Man 16 – 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]). But the provision of bodies brings in its wake the tragic reality of death and sin, the overcoming of which was the purpose of the incarnation of Christ (Great Catechism 8 ).
Gregory’s Christology is the story of the entry of the second Person of the Trinity into the world. In Gregory’s words,
For although this last form of God’s presence amongst us is not the same as that former presence, still his existence amongst us equally both then and now is evidenced: now he rules in us in order to hold together that nature in being; then he was transfused in our nature, in order that our nature might by this transfusion of the divine become itself divine–being rescued from death and put beyond the reach of the tyranny of the Adversary. For his return from death becomes to our mortal race the commencement of our return to immortal life. (Great Catechism 25 [65 - 68])
In saying that initially Christ entered “our nature,” Gregory is echoing the typical Eastern Christian understanding of Christ’s saving work; for according to that tradition, Christ healed the effects of the fall of humankind in the same way as he healed the sick in his earthly ministry–simply by touching. Moreover, because, as Gregory of Nazianzus put it, “what was not assumed was not healed” (Letters 101.5), Christ had to touch all aspects of human existence from birth to death (Great Catechism 27 [69 - 72], 32 [77 - 80]). Thus the former had to wait until the disease of human sinfulness had fully manifested itself (Great Catechism 29 [73 - 76]). And by submitting to the latter, Christ offered himself in bondage to Satan in exchange for the whole of humanity, whom Satan then had under his tyranny (Great Catechism 22 – 24 [60 - 65]). Precisely how, in Christ, the divine thus entered into human nature we can never know–any more than we can understand the presence of our own souls to our bodies (Great Catechism 11 ).But after the resurrection of Christ, the second Person of the Trinity is no longer just “transfused in our nature,” but now “rules in us.” In other words, the second Person is now immanent in the world in the institution of the Church; for “he who sees the Church sees Christ” (Song of Songs XIII ). Indeed, Gregory deploys, once again, his characteristic insistence on the unexpected unity of opposites, this time in the Church’s sacraments–life through death, justification through sin, blessing through curse, glory through disgrace, strength through weakness, and so forth–to argue for Christ’s continued, miraculous presence in his Church (Song of Songs VIII [948 - 949], XIII [1045 - 1052]). For this reason, Gregory subscribes to a realist theory of the sacraments. As baptism is to the soul, so the Eucharist is to the body (Great Catechism 37 ). In the former case, the presence of Christ “transforms what is born with a corruptible nature into a state of incorruption” (Great Catechism 33 , cf. 34 ). In the latter, Christ “disseminates himself in every believer through that flesh, whose substance comes from bread and wine, blending himself with the bodies of believers, to secure that, by this union with the immortal, man, too, may be a sharer in incorruption”–a process Gregory calls metastoicheiosis, “transelementation” (Great Catechism 37 ).
In the Resurrection, Christ “knitted together [the soul and body of humankind] . . . in a union never to be broken” (Great Catechism 16 , cf. 35 ) and “recalled [our] diseased nature by repentance to the grace of its original state” (Great Catechism 8 ). This is difficult to understand unless one notes that Gregory describes Christ’s saving work in the language of the Platonic forms (Great Catechism 16 , 32 [80 - 81]), which were classically construed as the originals of which the things that participate in them are mere images. Thus the resurrection and deification of Christ’s human nature are the prototypes of those to follow. The key idea here seems to be, once again, that human beings were created in God’s image. Formerly, that image was seen in the structural relation between the nature and energies of the human nous; now it is projected onto the axis of history.
Participation in Christ’s resurrection guarantees the resurrection of the body on the part of humanity. How does this happen? For one thing, as was noted earlier, Gregory holds that the nous is never completely separated from the body anyway, so in a sense there is no paradox in its revivification, But aren’t the bodily components scattered to the four winds after the decay of the corpse in the grave? How can they ever be reassembled? Gregory indeed addresses this problem and argues, strangely, that each particle of the body is stamped with one’s personal identity, and so it will be possible for the nous to eventually recognize and reassemble them all (Making of Man 26 – 27 [224 - 229], Soul and Resurrection [73 - 80]).
Similarly, the logical consequence of Christ’s deification is the apokatastasis–the restoration of humanity to its unfallen state. Because evil is a privation of the good and is therefore limited, Gregory believes that there is a limit to human degradation. At some point, everyone must turn around and strive for the good. Besides, the ultimate good, which is God, is infinitely attractive. Thus, Gregory endorses Origen’s (First Principles I 6.3, II 10.4 – 10.8, III 6.5 – 6.6) much-maligned theories of remedial punishment and universal salvation (Great Catechism 8 [36 - 37], 26 , 35 ; Making of Man 21 – 22 [201 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [97 - 105, 152, 157 - 160]). In other words, for Gregory as for his intellectual ancestor Origen, everyone–even Satan himself (Great Catechism 26 [68 - 69])–will eventually be saved. This means that there is no such thing as eternal damnation. Hell is really purgatory; punishment is temporary and remedial. As Gregory puts it in a colorful metaphor, the process of purgation is like drawing a rope encrusted with dried mud through a small aperture: it’s hard on the rope, but it does come out clean on the other side (Soul and Resurrection ).
The final component of Gregory’s eschatology is his famous theory of perfection, which is derived from his conviction, which he inherits from Plato (Theaetetus 176b1 – 2) through Origen (First Principles III 6.1), that the purpose of human life is to achieve nothing less than likeness to God (homoiosis theoi). But there would seem to be a problem here: if God’s very essence is incomprehensible, how can we know what God is really like? The answer lies in the life of Christ, whose purpose was to demonstrate what God is like–an idea Gregory also borrows from Origen (First Principles I 2.8). Consequently, it is sufficient if we use Christ’s life as a model for our own (On Perfection [264 - 265, 269]). Nevertheless, it remains that God’s nature is infinitely removed from ours. But that doesn’t mean that striving to become like God is pointless; it only means that the process of perfection is unending (Against Eunomius I 15 , 22 , II [940 - 941], III 6.5 ; Great Catechism 21 [57 - 60]; Making of Man 21 [201 - 204]; Soul and Resurrection [96 - 97, 105]; On Perfection ). This idea forms the core of Gregory’s epistemology and ethics, which will be summarized below.
Gregory’s epistemological views are nicely brought out in his reflections on the life of Moses. The central feature of Gregory’s very sensitive analysis is the sequence of three theophanies that punctuate Moses’ life (Song of Songs XII [1025 - 1028]). Moses is pictured as one who has a thirst for utter intimacy with God, and the three theophanies are stages on his journey to that intimacy. The first theophany is the burning bush (Life of Moses II 1 – 116 [297 - 360]). In a traditional vein, Gregory takes light to be a symbol of knowledge. So the first stage of Moses’ progress is the acquisition of purely intellectual knowledge of God. This procedure is clearly rational; and Gregory will be found in what follows applying that quintessentially rational criterion–consistency–to the acquisition of religious truth.
To do this, Gregory recognizes, one must resort to philosophy as a source of conceptual tools. But philosophy in his day was almost wholly associated with paganism. So Gregory’s attitude toward philosophy is somewhat ambiguous. At one time he portrays philosophy, like Moses’ stepmother, as barren (Life of Moses II 10 – 12 ), and, like the Egyptian whom Moses killed, as something to be striven against (Life of Moses 13 – 18 [329 - 332]). Later, he recites with approval the common Christian interpretation of the Israelites’ spoiling of the Egyptians as a lesson to Christians on the importance of appropriating pagan wisdom in explaining Christian doctrine (Life of Moses II 115 ). But Gregory’s true position seems to lie between these two extremes: philosophy is useful if properly “circumcised,” that is, culled of any “foreskin” alien to the spirit of Christianity (Life of Moses II 39 – 40 ).
Of the same ilk is Gregory’s hermeneutical principle of distinguishing between the literal narrative (historia) of a Biblical passage and the spiritual contemplation (theoria) of it. In the tradition of Philo (Creation of the World 1.1 – 2.12) and Origen (First Principles I Pref., IV 1.1 – 3.5), he produces several arguments in favor of the allegorization of Scripture: (1) it is practiced by Christ, (2) it is recommended by Paul, (3) it makes passages edifying that would otherwise be immoral, and (4) it makes sense of passages that would otherwise be unintelligible or impossible (Song of Songs Preface [756 - 764]). This procedure is obviously predicated on the imperative of integrating Scripture into the entire matrix of worldly knowledge. Gregory never doubts that this matrix should be internally consistent; and he unselfconsciously employs the rule that of two claims that are mutually inconsistent, the more trumps the less edifying.
Up to this point intellectual development is characterized by the rigorous application of the rational criterion of consistency. But for Gregory the next two theophanies go far beyond the veneer of wisdom that mere logical consistency provides. The second theophany occurs atop Mount Sinai (Life of Moses II 117 – 201 [360 - 392]), and here we find not light but darkness. Thus the Israelites were first led through the desert by a cloudy pillar; and finally they arrived at the mountain of divine knowledge, which was wrapped in darkness. Thus when it comes to a more profound understanding of God, the relevant visual metaphor is darkness, not light. Similarly, the relevant auditory metaphor is silence, not speech (Ecclesiastes VII ). At this stage Moses learns a much deeper fact about God–that all the language we use of God is only superficial and that a truer understanding of God will only reveal God’s utter incomprehensibility. One who becomes aware of God’s complete mysteriousness has, paradoxically, learned more about God than the most articulate theologian.
At this stage there is no longer any reliance on the physical senses; indeed, as has been seen, at this level sight and hearing shut down. Instead, the vision of God is mediated by the so-called “spiritual senses,” an idea Gregory’s inherits from his theological mentor Origen (Song of Songs I 4, II 9 – 11, III 5). God cannot be perceived with the external senses, but some sort of mystical awareness of God is achievable internally. In this vein it is significant that, when discussing the spiritual senses, Gregory most often appeals, not to the “higher” senses of sight and hearing, but to the more intimate senses of smell, taste, and touch as metaphors by which to describe them (cf. Song of Songs I [780 - 784], III [821 - 828], IV ).
The third and final theophany revolves around Moses’ vision of God’s glory from the cleft in a rock (Life of Moses II 202 – 321 [392 - 429]). Moses, as Gregory interprets him, is one of those who crave ever more intimate communion with God. Earlier he had requested to know God’s name; now he asks to behold God’s glory. So God directs Moses to the cleft of a rock and walks by, placing a hand over the cleft to obscure Moses’ sight; only after God has passed is the hand removed, but by now all Moses can see is God’s back. Thus Moses finally realizes that the longing for utter intimacy with God can never be satisfied–faith will never be transformed into understanding (cf. Against Eunomius II )–but nevertheless “what Moses yearned for is satisfied by the very things which leave his desire unsatisfied” (Life of Moses II 235 ). Because God is an infinite being, the desire to know God is an infinite process; but in Gregory’s eyes this really makes it much more satisfying than some static Beatific Vision. The process of becoming ever closer to God does not cease at physical death (which is, after all, just one among many passing events punctuating human existence), but continues forever.
When reflecting on Gregory’s theory of knowledge as developed in The Life of Moses, one is struck by his commitment to rationalism–this despite his ambivalence on the value of pagan wisdom. Scripture for him is merely the starting point of the intellectual quest; and, given his reliance on allegory as a tool of exegesis, even that is brought within the ambit of a rational worldview. However, for Gregory the quest does not end with reason; rather, because God is utterly mysterious and infinitely remote, the quest is capped by a mystical ascent that always approaches but never reaches its destination. This intellectual dynamic is paralleled by a moral one, which will be sketched in what follows.
Gregory’s ethical thought explores the implications of the theme of the “dignity of royalty” of the human person, which, as has been seen, derives from the idea that humans, and humans alone, were created in the image of God. This is perhaps the most far-reaching theme of Christian ethics. For it means that because there is a part of the human person that is literally not of this world, human beings are possessed of an intrinsic worth which is unique in creation. This idea obviously imposes certain obligations on us in relation to both ourselves and others. To others we owe mercy (Beatitudes V [1252 - 1253]) and the Christian virtue of agape (Beatitudes VII ). To ourselves we owe the effort to overcome the deficiencies in our likeness to God; for we are unable to contemplate God directly, and morally our free will has been compromised by the passions (pathe). Thus with respect to ourselves we must strive for intellectual and moral perfection (Beatitudes III [1225 - 1228], V [1253 - 1260).
Because he was committed to the idea that humans have a unique value that demands respect, Gregory was an early and vocal opponent of slavery and also of poverty. Against the former Gregory marshals three arguments (Ecclesiastes IV ): (1) Only God has the right to enslave humans, and God does not choose to do so; indeed, it was God who gave human beings their free wills. (2) How dare a person take that precious entity–the only part of the created order to have been made in God’s image–and enslave it! (3) As humans who were created in the divine image, all people are radically equal; therefore, it is hubristic for some to arrogate to themselves absolute authority over others. Against the latter, he appeals, once again, to the “dignity of royalty” theme–that poverty is inconsistent with the rulership bestowed on humankind at its creation (On Compassion for the Poor ). Both slavery and poverty sully the dignity of human beings by degrading them to a station below the purple to which they were rightfully born; and although we may congratulate ourselves on having outlawed slavery, it is important to remember that for Gregory poverty is no different.
Moral progress is defined by two phases. Initially we must pursue the Stoic ideal of apatheia (passionlessness; cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 117), but in moderation (Beatitudes II ). However, Gregory makes it clear that this moderation is due only to the exigencies of life in the flesh. At some point we must go beyond being satisfied with moderation and strive for a life which, in its breadth, is one of complete, not partial, virtue (Beatitudes IV ), and, in its depth, is a matter of continual, unceasing perfection (Beatitudes IV [1244 - 1245]). The former idea, the unity of the virtues, Gregory derives, once again, from the Stoics (cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 125); but the latter is entirely his own.
Again, Gregory distinguishes between the Old Law and the New Law, which is built on the Old but goes beyond it (Beatitudes VI [1273 - 1276]). The Old Law deals with externals–works. But the New Law deals, not with works, but with the psychological springs from which works originate. To perfect one’s outward behavior is one thing; to purify one’s own heart is quite another. Thus, for example, whereas the Old Law prohibited murder, the New Law forbids even anger; and whereas the Old Law prohibited adultery, the New Law forbids even lust. Combining this theme with the one discussed in the last paragraph, one must conclude that Gregory sees moral progress as moving from a state of finite, external virtue to one of infinite, internal progress.
Once again, the similarity to Kant is striking. Like Gregory, Kant distinguishes four kinds of duty–perfect and imperfect duties to ourselves and to others (Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction). More importantly, he distinguishes between duties of right and duties of virtue (Metaphysical Principles of Right Introduction III, Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction VII). And the differences between duties of right and of virtue are similar to the distinctions Gregory draws between moderation and infinite perfection and between the Old and the New Law. Duties of right tend to deal with externals and, as “thou shalt nots,” can be completely fulfilled. Duties of virtue, on the other hand, tend to deal with the will and, as “thou shalts,” can never be completely fulfilled. In fact, in his famous discussion of the postulate of immortality Kant argues that the process of moral perfection is limitless and that if “ought” implies “can” it must be possible for humans to engage in an unending pursuit of perfection (Critique of Practical Reason Dialectic IV; cf. Metaphysical Principles of Virtue I 22).
This paper has tried to make clear what a rich resource of ideas we have in Gregory of Nyssa. What is also of great historical interest is Gregory’s pivotal role in the development of Western consciousness. Gregory takes numerous ideas from the Judaeo-Christian, particularly Philonian-Origenist, tradition and from the pagan Middle Platonist and Neoplatonist schools, digests them into a very original synthesis and in expounding that synthesis develops ideas that anticipate later Byzantine thinkers such as the Pseudo-Dionysius and Gregory Palamas. Not only that, but several of Gregory’s most important theories bear some resemblance to modern thinkers such as John Locke and Immanuel Kant (though through what channels of transmission, if any, is unclear–perhaps John Scotus Eriugena (c. 810 – c. 877), who quotes him extensively, and the Cambridge Platonists of the seventeenth century). Given all that, and given Gregory’s relative absence from most standard treatments of Western thought, I think may be fair to say that Gregory of Nyssa is one of the most under-appreciated figures in Western intellectual history.
Donald L. Ross
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 2, 2006 | Originally published: