Guo Xiang (also known as Kuo Hsiang and Zixuan) is the author of the most important commentary on the classic Daoist text Zhuangzi (Chuang-tzu). He is responsible for the current arrangement of thirty-three chapters divided into inner, outer and miscellaneous sections. His commentary represents a substantial philosophical achievement that has been compared to the Zhuangzi itself. Ostensibly the purpose of a commentary should be to elucidate the ideas in the original text. However, Guo’s Zhuangzi commentary adds many original ideas. It is possible to delve deeper into their meaning by examining the text on which he is commenting as if it were a commentary on the work of Guo. The fact that Guo chose to present his philosophy this way—within the framework of this Daoist classic—has served as a blueprint for the manner in which Confucians, Daoists and, increasingly from Guo’s time, Buddhists have engaged in constructive dialogue, building systems of thought which include the strengths of all three systems.
Very little is known about the life of Guo Xiang. He lived in a time of great political upheaval and yet his own political career was one of consistent and significant success. He maintained a high position within one of the six rebellious factions that contributed to the rapid demise of the Western Jin Dynasty (265-316 CE). This fact is interesting because unlike such contemporary figures as Ji Kang (223-262 CE) or Ruan Ji (210-263 CE), who both retired from what they saw as a corrupt governmental system, Guo remained to play what he regarded as the proper role of an engaged public dignitary.
Like the other great figure of the xuanxue (mysterious or profound learning) movement, Wang Bi (Wang Pi, 226-249 CE), Guo sought to synthesize the accepted Confucian morality within an ontological system that would encompass the insights expressed in the Zhuangzi and the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching). But while Wang Bi put the greatest emphasis on the unitary nature of reality, particularly in the concept of wu (nothingness), Guo emphasized individuality and interdependence. Guo’s position is not as diametrically opposed to Wang’s as is often assumed, Guo does not claim there is a dualist or objective reality to the world around us and he does maintain the use of dao as the unitary, nameless and formless basis of reality. This reality is expressed as a process Guo calls “self-transformation” or “lone transformation” (zihua or duha) in which all things are responsible for their own creation and for the set of relationships that exist between themselves and the rest of the world. Our self-transformation was and is at each moment conditioned by all the self-transformations coming before us and we in turn condition all the self-transformations that come after us. By shifting the focus onto those relationships, Guo arrives at a view of the transcendent sage that is radically different and innovative. While the traditional view of a Daoist sage was someone who removed himself from the mundane world, for Guo this notion is false and misleading. The social and political environments in which people relate to each other are no less natural than a forest or mountaintop and to a person who appreciates why she exists in the particular relationship to others in which she does, the proper course of action is not to run away, but to become involved. In other words, we must become engaged with the world around us, but not because of a continuous state of existence that we share with people and things around us, rather, it is because of a continuous act of creation that at its core makes us responsible for the world and its proper maintenance.
Ji Kang and Ruan Ji pursued the ideal of “overcoming orthodox teaching and following nature” (yue mingjiao er ren ziran). “Orthodox teaching” (mingjiao) includes the proper behavior being matched to the proper role, such as for a parent, a child, a ruler or a subject. Different xuanxue figures accepted these ideals to different extents, but nearly all held them in distinction to ziran, naturalness or spontaneity. Guo’s concept of ziran contained all governmental and social spheres, so it made no sense to try to set the realms of mingjiao and ziran in opposition to each other. For Guo, the roles required by Confucian propriety are not imposed upon a natural system that would otherwise be in chaos. They are, instead, the natural result of the system of spontaneous self-transformation and chaos is merely what results when one fails to recognize one’s proper role. Guo directs much of the Zhuangzi‘s advice about equalizing apparent contradiction in this direction.
There is some controversy over the true authorship of Guo’s commentary to the Zhuangzi. The earliest source, the Jin Shu (Standard History of the Jin Dynasty), accuses Guo of plagiarizing all but two chapters of the commentary from Xiang Xiu (d. 300 CE), writing a generation earlier. Current scholarship, while acknowledging that Guo made use of Xiang Xiu’s work and other earlier commentaries, still credits Guo as the principal author. The evidence for this recognition falls into three main areas. Firstly, the most innovative philosophical features in the commentary do not correspond with those in other works by Xiang Xiu. Secondly, in the early twentieth century, a postface to the commentary was discovered which details the work Guo carried out and finally, various linguistic analyses and references in other works suggest that Guo is the principal author.
Guo calls the process by which all things come into existence “lone transformation” (duhua) or “self-transformation” (zihua). The claim that all things share equally in creating the world does not deny that differences exist, but it does deny that these differences translate into differences of value. That one person may be less talented or intelligent than another does not affect the worth of that person, but rather helps determine the proper role for him to play
Given the importance of self-transformation in Guo’s philosophical system, he wished to deny any organizing principle. Even Wang Bi’s emphasis on wu (nothingness) came too close to occupying the place of an original cause. It was necessary for Guo to draw the line clearly, even if it meant contradicting the text on which he was commenting. In a note to a section of the Zhuangzi that leaves open the question of whether there is a creator, Guo writes:
The myriad things have myriad attributes, the adopting and discarding [of their attributes] is different, as if there was a true ruler making them do so. But if we search for evidence or a trace of this ruler, in the end we will not find it. We will then understand that things arise of themselves, and are not caused by something else. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 2)
The natural, spontaneous state of affairs that results from the process of self-transformation is ziran. Ziran is a compound of two different terms zi, meaning “self” and ran, meaning “to be so,” and can be translated as “nature,” “the self-so,” or “things as they are.” While many other Daoist thinkers distinguish ziran from the mundane social world in which we live, for Guo they are identical. Even social hierarchy is the natural result of how things come to be as themselves. When we follow our natures, the result is peace and prosperity. When we oppose them, the result is chaos.
Thus, Guo seeks to provide a specific interpretation to the doctrine of nonaction (wuwei). He writes that “taking no action does not mean folding one’s arms and closing one’s mouth” (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 11). In chapter 3 of the Zhuangzi, we encounter the story of Cook Ding, who carves an ox, not by using his senses or dexterity, but by equating his idea of who he is with his situation and the task at hand. For Guo, if one has correctly perceived the way in which all things share in the creation of ziran, then correct action in the world will follow naturally.
Therefore, what Guo means by ziran is very different from what Western philosophers refer to as “the state of nature.” Ziran is the expression of a naturally peaceful and harmonious system, available to all who can recognize their place.
One key to the correct appreciation of one’s place in the world is Guo’s concept of fen, meaning “share” or “role.” Guo employs the idea of qi (ch’i), “vital energy” or “vital essence,” to explain the manner in which the dao imbues the world with life-giving force. One’s natural allotment of qi therefore determines one’s fen. The proper functioning of the world and the personal happiness of the people in it is maintained by the correct appreciation of one’s place. This is not to say Guo denies the possibility of growth and change, which are clear and necessary parts of nature, including social systems. In the same way that the body has hands, feet and head that play different roles according to their different endowments, so the world functions best when people act according to their proper fen. Thus, one’s fen is both the allotment of qi received from heaven and the role one must maintain within the system. Indeed, there is no difference between natural abilities and social obligations.
For Guo, the Sage (shengren) is someone who directs his talent and understanding for the benefit of society. The phrase neisheng waiwang describes someone who is internally like a sage and outwardly acts as a ruler. In Guo’s view, the former necessitates the latter. In chapter one of the Zhuangzi, we read the story of the sage ruler Yao, who attempts to cede his throne to the recluse Xu You, but is rebuffed. In the story, it is clear that Xu You has a greater level of understanding than does Yao, but Guo’s commentary presents the matter differently:
Are we to insist that a man fold his arms and sit in silence in the middle of some mountain forest before we say that he is practicing nonaction? This is why the words of Laozi and Zhuangzi are rejected by responsible officials. This is why responsible officials insist on remaining in the realm of action without regret … egotistical people set themselves in opposition to things, while he who is in accord with things is not opposed to them … therefore he profoundly and deeply responds to things without any deliberate mind of his own and follows whatever comes into contact with him … he who is always with the people no matter what he does is the ruler of the world wherever he may be. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 1)
It seems clear from these sentiments that in Guo’s view not only is Yao a better model for a ruler than Xu You, but also that Confucius is a better model for a sage than Zhuangzi.
The Zhuangzi has long been held in high regard as one of the main pillars of Daoist philosophy, as well as one of the most accessible, entertaining and popular philosophical works of any genre. However the important contribution of Guo to the way in which we understand the Zhuangzi is less well known, particularly in its non-Chinese translations. He deserves credit not only for the external editing and arrangement of the text, but more importantly for developing a philosophical framework that allows for the continued dominance of accepted Confucian codes of proper behavior, yet still keeps open philosophical discussion of wider insights on the nature of reality. While the earlier work of Wang Bi may have eased the entry of Buddhism into the Chinese mainstream, it is within the framework provided by Guo that the three strands of Buddhism, Daoism and Confucianism have found a strategy for coexistence that has contributed to the success and growth of them all.
J. Scot Brackenridge
Long Island University
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 9, 2007 | Originally published: