Pierre Hadot, classical philosopher and historian of philosophy, is best known for his conception of ancient philosophy as a bios or way of life (manière de vivre). His work has been widely influential in classical studies and on thinkers, including Michel Foucault. According to Hadot, twentieth- and twenty-first-century academic philosophy has largely lost sight of its ancient origin in a set of spiritual practices that range from forms of dialogue, via species of meditative reflection, to theoretical contemplation. These philosophical practices, as well as the philosophical discourses the different ancient schools developed in conjunction with them, aimed primarily to form, rather than only to inform, the philosophical student. The goal of the ancient philosophies, Hadot argued, was to cultivate a specific, constant attitude toward existence, by way of the rational comprehension of the nature of humanity and its place in the cosmos. This cultivation required, specifically, that students learn to combat their passions and the illusory evaluative beliefs instilled by their passions, habits, and upbringing. To cultivate philosophical discourse or writing without connection to such a transformed ethical comportment was, for the ancients, to be as a rhetorician or a sophist, not a philosopher. However, according to Hadot, with the advent of the Christian era and the eventual outlawing, in 529 C.E., of the ancient philosophical schools, philosophy conceived of as a bios largely disappeared from the West. Its spiritual practices were integrated into, and adapted by, forms of Christian monasticism. The philosophers’ dialectical techniques and metaphysical views were integrated into, and subordinated, first to revealed theology and then, later, to the modern natural sciences. However, Hadot maintained that the conception of philosophy as a bios has never completely disappeared from the West, resurfacing in Montaigne, Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau, Nietzsche, and Schopenhauer, and even in the works of Descartes, Spinoza, Kant, and Heidegger.
Hadot’s conception of ancient philosophy and his historical narrative of its disappearance in the West have provoked both praise and criticism. Hadot received a host of letters from students around the world telling him that his works had changed their lives, perhaps the most fitting tribute given the nature of Hadot’s meta-philosophical claims. Unlike many of his European contemporaries, Hadot’s work is characterized by lucid, restrained prose; clarity of argument; the near-complete absence of recondite jargon; and a gentle, if sometimes self-depreciating, humor. While Hadot was an admirer of Nietzsche and Heidegger, and committed to a kind of philosophical recasting of the history of Western ideas, Hadot’s work lacks any eschatological sense of the end of philosophy, humanism, or the West. Late in life, Hadot would report that this was because he was animated by the sense that philosophy, as conceived and practiced in the ancient schools, remains possible for men and women of his era: “from 1970 on, I have felt very strongly that it was Epicureanism and Stoicism which could nourish the spiritual life of men and women of our times, as well as my own” (PWL 280).
Pierre Hadot was born in Paris in 1922. Educated as a Catholic, at age 22 Hadot began training for the priesthood. However, following Pope Pius XII’s encyclical, Humani Generis, of 1950, Hadot left the priesthood, marrying for a first time in 1953. Between 1953 and 1962, Hadot studied the Latin patristics and was trained in philology. At this time, Hadot was also greatly interested in mysticism. In 1963, he published Plotinus: or The Simplicity of Vision, on the great Neoplatonic philosopher. During this period he also produced two of the first studies about Wittgenstein written in the French-language. Hadot was elected director of studies at the fifth section of the École Pratique des Hautes Études in 1964, and he married his is second wife, the historian of philosophy Ilsetraut Hadot, in 1966. From the mid-1960s, Hadot’s attention turned to wider studies in ancient thought, culminating in two key works: Exercices spirituels et philosophie antique, written in 1981 (translated into English in 1995 as Philosophy as a Way of Life [PWL] ) and Qu’est-ce que la philosophie antique?, written in 1995 (translated into English in 2002 as What is Ancient Philosophy? [WAP] ). Hadot was named professor at the Collège de France in 1982, where he held the chair for the History of Greek and Roman Thought (chaire d’histoire de la pensée hellénistique et romaine). Hadot retired from this position to become professeur honoraire at the Collège in 1991. He continued to translate, write, give interviews, and publish until shortly before his death in April 2010.
Hadot would always insist that his groundbreaking work on ancient philosophy as a way of life arose from his early academic training as a philologist. Throughout his career, Hadot was involved in compiling, editing, and translating ancient Latin and Greek texts, including Marcus Aurelius’ Meditations, Ambrose of Milan’s Apology of David, Plotinus’ works, and as well as the theological works of the Roman rhetorician Marius Victorinus. The study of philology, Hadot claimed, was beneficial for him first of all as a kind of ethical exercise, engendering interpretive humility and attention to historical and textual detail. Secondly, it led him to raise the strictly literary problem concerning the way ancient philosophy was written. His reflections on this problem led Hadot to the meta-philosophical considerations concerning philosophy as a way of life seen in his mature work. Generally speaking, Hadot observed, “the philosophical works of Greco-Roman antiquity almost always perplex . . . contemporary readers . . . even . . . specialists in the field” (PWL 61). The reason is the apparently strange, disordered, circumlocutory, even incoherent nature of ancient philosophical writings, whether we consider Plato’s dialogues with their literary settings, myths or “likely stories”; the occasional letters of an Epicurus or a Seneca; Marcus Aurelius’ apparently desultory notes, injunctions, and aphorisms; or even Aristotle’s reputedly more “systematic” works, which are nevertheless often repetitious, punctuated by digressions, and sometimes inconclusive.
According to Hadot, these literary features seem odd only insofar as readers try, erroneously, to read ancient texts with presuppositions shaped by their reading of modern authors. Philosophical authors in the twenty-first century write under very different social, political, institutional, and technological constraints than their ancient antecedents. In order to understand why the ancient philosophers wrote as they did, Hadot argued, readers need to cultivate a historical sense of “the concrete conditions in which they wrote, all the constraints that weighed upon them: the framework of the school, the very nature of philosophia, literary genres, rhetorical rules, dogmatic imperatives, and traditional modes of reasoning” (PWL 61). Readers must be prepared, in this light, to distinguish between what an author may have wanted to say, as against what he was required in his specific tradition and context to say, and what he was likewise obliged to pass over or leave unsaid” (PWL 64; PAH 64).
In different works, Hadot specified these constraints shaping the ancient philosophical texts. The ancient texts were dictated to scribes and intended to be read aloud. In general, ancient culture was one in which writing was still a relatively new phenomenon, set against the wider primacy of the spoken word—as reflected in the famous Platonic criticisms of writing. Ancient philosophy was largely carried out in the form of spoken dialogue between students and their teachers, so that—as Socrates had already insisted (4c)—students would be drawn to actively discover the truth on their own. Hadot suggests that by recognizing how these works retain and mirror the features of the spoken interchanges upon which they were modeled, modern readers can begin to understand many of the characteristic hesitations, starts and stops, repetitions, and digressions in ancient texts.
The oral bases of ancient philosophical teaching are again reflected in considerations concerning the addressees of these works. “Unlike their modern counterparts, none of these philosophical productions, even the systematic works, is addressed to everyone,” Hadot argued (PWL 64). The exceptions here are expressly exoteric texts like the Platonic dialogues, written with the “protreptic” purpose of attracting new students to philosophy, or like Aristotle’s practical writings, which are specifically addressed to potential statesmen or legislators (WAP 90). Otherwise, ancient philosophical writings were conceived within, and directed toward the members of, the philosophical schools. They reflect the philosophical subjects, techniques, and propositions developed in oral exercises, classes, and teachings, as well as the wider goals of philosophical paideia (4a).
In order to understand the form and intention of many ancient works, Hadot emphasized, the reader must understand the institutional frameworks of the ancient philosophical schools (the Platonic academy, the Aristotelian Lyceum, the Stoa, the Epicurean garden, and the later Platonist schools). Aristotle’s extant works, which were lecture notes seemingly compiled by students or a later redactor within the Lyceum, are only the most obvious case. Part of the curricula in Platonic and Stoic schools, Hadot emphasized, were formalized exercises in dialectics: discussing, through questions and answers, particular theses (such as, “virtue can be taught”) in a way which goes toward explaining the preeminence of the dialogue form in ancient philosophical writing. Even the later, more systematic forms of philosophical treatise that emerged within Platonism in particular, Hadot claimed, must be understood “from the perspective of dialectical and exegetical scholarly exercises” as attempts to synthesize and order the whole of doctrine which had emerged with the school (PWL 63-4). Again, particularly in the imperial period of late antiquity, a large amount of ancient philosophical writings and teaching began to study commentary rather than the original works of the different schools. This was a literary genre in which great weight was given to arguments from authority, in a way that anticipated the medieval scholastics. Different philosophical traditions developed particular stylistic features, such as characteristic images, turns of phrase, or highly formulaic dogmata, which later exegetes were more or less compelled to use, “independent, if one may say so, of the author’s will” (PWL 62).
Hadot’s work in philology, and his sensitivity to the institutional and traditional constraints shaping ancient works, gave rise in his thought to an acute sense of the role played in the history of thought by misappropriations, mistranslations, and creative mistakes. The high status afforded in later classical thought to formulae, images, phrases, and patterns of argument in the schools’ founding texts saw many instances of these philosophical formulae (like “know thyself” or “nature loves to hide”) being borrowed, misappropriated, and given new meaning in the texts of different philosophical traditions, and in the encounter between Hellenistic paganism and Jewish and Christian monotheisms. Later exegetes’ determination to systematize earlier texts and to render them wholly consistent in the light of accepted understandings, together with the supposition that earlier masters could neither be mistaken nor contradict themselves, led to problematic or arbitrary systematizations which nevertheless underlay important evolutions in the history of ideas. Hadot adduces in this context the four- or five-tiered Neoplatonic ontological hierarchies drawn from Plato’s dialogues and Augustine’s positing of a “heaven of heavens” on the basis of a Greek mistranslation of Psalm 113:16. Hadot devoted an early essay to showing how the entire Neoplatonic interpretation of the Parmenides, a subject of great later importance, rested on Porphyry’s erroneous introduction of a distinction between “being” (Gr. ousia) as an infinitive (Fr. être) and as a participle (Fr: étant) to explain the “pure transcendental act” (étant) of the One Beyond Being (être).
Hadot’s first book, Plotinus, or the Simplicity of Vision, was published in 1963. It shows the first fruits of his philological training over the previous decade and his distinct perspective upon ancient philosophical writings. The book was commissioned as a title in a series of works on the lives, or psychobiographies, of famous authors. Hadot begins by underlining the difficulties associated with trying to write a biography of a thinker about whose life we have little testimony (PSV 77-78), who blushed even at having his portrait made, and whose entire philosophy was devoted to the transcendence of his mundane, bodily self —as a sculptor transforms the stone upon which he works (PSV 21; Enneads I.6, 9). Hadot also urges caution, as he will later in his writings on Aurelius (5a) in trying to infer any biographical or psychological insight concerning the author from a work like Plotinus’ Enneads, whose modes of arguing, and many of whose images and figures of speech, “are not spontaneous: [but] traditional and imposed by the texts to be commented upon” in the Platonic heritage of which Plotinus was a legatee (PSV 17).
With that said, Plotinus, or the Simplicity of Vision (PSV) importantly anticipates many of Hadot’s later arguments on ancient philosophy. Hadot tells us in the autobiographical interviews of The Present Alone is Our Happiness that as a young man, he had undergone some kind of mystical experience (PAH 5-6). This was an experience that shaped Hadot’s own initial scholarly research, including several of the first French-language articles on Wittgenstein’s philosophy, and his continuing interest in “unitary experience.” It can, arguably, be seen to underlie Hadot’s repeated, central claim that the classical philosophies were rooted in certain paradigmatic experiences of existence (4b). In any case, Hadot argues in PSV that the famous Neoplatonic metaphysics of the One, the Ideas, and the world-psyche is not the abstract, purely theoretical, otherworldly construction it is often presented as being. Rather, Hadot claims, in Plotinus’ Enneads the language of metaphysics “is used to express an inner experience. All these levels of reality become levels of inner life, levels of the self” (PSV 27). For Hadot, Plotinus’ metaphysical discourse is animated by a “fundamental but inexpressible experience.” This is what gives his work a “unique, incomparable, and irreplaceable tonality” despite Plotinus’ open and avowed citation of inherited Platonic tropes and arguments (PSV 19). For Hadot, Plotinus’ system revolves around the core, existential claim that the human self is not irrevocably separated from its eternal model, the transcendent One or Good. Indeed, at the height of the philosopher’s contemplative ascent, we are called to supra-intellectual identity with this Good: “We then become this eternal self, we are moved by unutterable beauty . . . we identify ourselves with divine Thought itself” (PSV 27). The only autobiographical passage in the Enneads, Hadot notes, involves Plotinus’ testimony about this mystical union (“I become One with the divine, and I establish myself in it” (Enneads IV 8, 1 4), whose content is such that the philosopher is drawn to wonder “how is it possible that I should come down now, and how was it ever possible for my soul to come to be within my body . . .” (Enneads IV 8, 1, 8-9; PSV 25).
In Hadot’s later writings, Plotinus’ philosophical discourse cannot be separated from, but is rather rooted in, the spiritual biography of the philosopher himself. Indeed, PSV already stresses the way that in classical antiquity, certainly in the imperial era of Plotinus, philosophy involved the call to a transformation of individuals’ way of living: a “conversion of attention,” away from “vain preoccupations and exaggerated worries” (PSV 30-31). The philosophical master like Plotinus, in this setting, was less a professor or teacher in modes we would recognize, than a spiritual guide. In Hadot’s words: “he exhorted his charges to conversion, and then directed his new converts . . . . to the paths of wisdom. He was a spiritual advisor” (PSV 75-6). Nevertheless, Porphyry reports that even Plotinus himself was able to achieve mystical union with the One, or Good, only four times in the six years Porphyry was at the master’s school in Rome. The philosopher can at most prepare himself and his charges for such ultimately passive, or receptive, experiences of unity with the Good (compare PSV 55-56). The means to prepare oneself was through the practice of spiritual exercises such as dietary (and other) forms of ascesis (PSV 82) and regular contemplative practices. More than this, PSV situates Plotinus’ later preoccupation with ethical concerns, and cultivating the virtues of benevolence, gentleness, simplicity, and respect for others as part of a kind of ever-renewed effort of the philosopher, between his transitory, mystical experiences, to remain mindful of the higher Good he has contemplatively glimpsed (PSV 65, 86).
For all of Hadot’s evident enthusiasm for Plotinus’ philosophy, however, PSV concludes with an assessment of the modern world’s inescapable distance from Plotinus’ thought and experience. Hadot distances himself from Plotinus’ negative assessment of bodily existence, and he also displays a caution in his support for mysticism, citing the skeptical claims of Marxism and psychoanalysis about professed mysticism, considering it a lived mystification or obfuscation of truth (PSV 112-113). Hadot would later recall that, after writing the book in a month and returning to ordinary life, he had his own uncanny experience: “. . . seeing the ordinary folks all around me in the bakery, I . . . had the impression of having lived a month in another world, completely foreign to our world, and worse than this—totally unreal and even unlivable.” Hadot’s work after 1965 increasingly turned away from Neoplatonism, in particular, and the phenomena of mysticism, in general, and to studies of the divergent ancient philosophical schools, especially those of the Hellenistic and Roman, or imperial, eras.
Hadot often stressed that his conception of philosophy as a way of life, long before this idea became fashionable, emerged out of the scholarly attempt to understand the unusual literary forms of ancient philosophical writing (see 2). Hadot emphasized that he in no way denied or wanted to downplay “the extraordinary ability of the ancient philosophers to develop theoretical reflection on the most subtle problems of the theory of knowledge, logic, or physics.” Nevertheless, if modern readers are to understand how this theoretical reflection is conveyed in extant ancient writings, Hadot argued that readers are compelled to adopt a perspective “different from that which corresponds to the idea people usually have of philosophy” (WAP 3).
According to Hadot’s position as developed in What is Ancient Philosophy?, philosophical discourse must in particular be situated within a wider conception of philosophy that sees philosophy as necessarily involving a kind of existential choice or commitment to a specific way of living one’s entire life. According to Hadot, one became an ancient Platonist, Aristotelian, or Stoic in a manner more comparable to the twenty-first century understanding of religious conversion, rather than the way an undergraduate or graduate student chooses to accept and promote, for example, the theoretical perspectives of Nietzsche, Badiou, Davidson, or Quine. Hadot cites as a particularly striking instance the case of Polemo, later head of the Academy, who decided then and there to adopt the Platonic philosophical bios after being dared by friends to listen to a lecture of Xenocrates after a night of drunken debauchery (WAP 98).What was involved in such cases was not solely the student’s intellectual assent to an intellectual doctrine or “-ism” in more or less complete isolation from the student’s wider life. Rather, one feature of philosophical writings across different schools was a sometimes caustic criticism of men who professed some teaching or refined way of speaking “ . . . but contradict themselves in the conduct of their own lives.” As Hadot writes in WAP, “According to the Stoic Epictetus, [such people] talk about the art of living like human beings, instead of living like human beings themselves . . . as Seneca put it, they turn true love of wisdom (philosophia) into love of words (philologia).” Traditionally, people who developed an apparently philosophical discourse without trying to live their lives in accordance with their discourse, and without their discourse emanating from their life experience, were called sophists (WAP 174).
Hadot argues in this light that ancient philosophical writings must always be situated in relation to the existential choice of a certain mode of living that characterizes the different ancient philosophies (4b; WAP 3). This need can be seen clearly enough by considering the different genres, or language games, of ancient philosophical writings, and noting specifically that these included letters addressed to individual students’ concerns (Seneca, Epicurus); meditations, or hypomnemata (memory aids), addressed by the student to himself (as in the case of Marcus Aurelius) (5a); consolations against loss and hardships (Boethius, Seneca); studies devoted to mundane stations in life (Of Marriage [Cleanthes], On Leisure [Seneca]); biographies of philosophers (Xenephon, Diogenes Laertius); and works enjoining particular practical conduct (Of Just Dealings [Epicurus], How to Live Amongst Men [Diogenes]). But in WAP, Hadot specifies a series of particular ways philosophical writings relate to ancient philosophy, conceived of as some specific choice of a manière de vivre. First, philosophical discourse aims to do specific things with words, concerning those who will read them. Philosophical discourse, in Hadot’s words, “is a privileged means by which the philosopher can act upon himself and others: for if it is the expression of the existential option of the person who utters it, discourse always has, directly or indirectly, a function which is formative, educative, psychagogic, and therapeutic” (WAP 176). Hadot sometimes cites in this connection Epicurus’ justification for his pursuit of theoretical physics: to reassure mortals against fear concerning death and our imaginings of active, interventionist gods. But here also Hadot’s stress (see 2) on the spoken, dialogic foundation and model for many ancient writings applies. As when we speak directly to a particular individual, so ancient philosophical discourse “is always intended to produce an effect, a habitus within the soul, or to provoke a transformation of the self” of its addressee. (loc cit.) Secondly, in a way closer to how philosophy tends to be conceived of today, philosophical discourse involved the construction of more or less formalized systems—but this was in order to explain and justify the different schools’ different conceptions of the good life. Whichever philosophical school’s conception of the good life is chosen, Hadot explains, “it will be necessary to disengage the presuppositions, implications, and consequences of each attitude with great precision” (WAP 175). It was on this primarily practical basis that the different ancient schools each developed their own technical languages, metaphysical conceptions of humanity’s place within the cosmos, ethical teachings defining one’s relationship to others, and epistemological doctrines about the rules of correct reasoning and argument (WAP 176). Characteristically, Hadot stresses that even the later exegetical systematizations, treatises, and dense summaries of doctrine that emerged in later antiquity were related to the exigencies associated with trying to form students who lived in a certain manner. For this to be possible, students (prokopta) would need to be able at any time to call to mind the school’s key precepts, in particular when they faced temptations or difficulties in their lives. Such a timely recollection of the rules of life was facilitated by having these systematizations and summaries available as written hypomnemata (WAP 176-7).
Hadot’s founding meta-philosophical claim is that since the time of Socrates, in ancient philosophy “the choice of a way of life [was] not . . . located at the end of the process of philosophical activity, like a kind of accessory or appendix. On the contrary, its stands at the beginning, in a complex interrelationship with critical reaction to other existential attitudes . . .” (WAP 3). All the schools agreed that philosophy involves the individual’s love of and search for wisdom. All also agreed, although in different terms, that this wisdom involved “first and foremost . . . a state of perfect peace of mind,” as well as a comprehensive view of the nature of the whole and humanity’s place within it. They concurred that attaining to such Sophia, or wisdom, was the highest Good for human beings. All ancient philosophical schools agreed that, by contrast, most people live unwise lives most of the time. These lives are characterized by unnecessary forms of suffering and disorder, caused by their ignorance or unconsciousness concerning the true source of human happiness. In the view of all philosophical schools, Hadot claims that “mankind’s principal cause of suffering, disorder and unconsciousness were the passions: that is, unregulated desires and exaggerated fears. People are prevented from truly living, it was taught, because they are dominated by the passions” (PWL 83). Political society in all but the best regimes, while natural to human beings, was agreed to be a further cause of individuals’ having deeply habituated, false beliefs concerning human nature and concerning what is good for them to pursue and to avoid. Ancient philosophers thus conceived of philosophy as involving a therapy of the soul, or “remedy for human worries, anguish, and misery brought about for the Cynics, by social constraints and conventions; for the Epicureans, by the quest for false pleasures; for the Stoics, by the pursuit of pleasure and egoistic self-interest; and for the skeptics, by false opinions” (WAP 102).
The disagreements between the ancient philosophies concerned the way the happiness of wisdom was to be conceived of and pursued. For Epicureanism, wisdom involved the pursuit of a particular species of pleasure; whereas for Platonism, Aristotelianism, and Stoicism, some conception of virtue or the Good was prioritized as the one necessary element. But the Platonic conception of this Good, of course, differs markedly from the Peripatetic and Stoic ideals. Each philosophical perspective, Hadot moreover claims, responded to a different, specific experience of the world: as in Epicureanism, “the voice of the flesh: ‘not to be hungry, not to be thirsty, not to be cold’ ” (WAP 115); or in Stoicism, the sense expressed by Epictetus that people are unhappy because they passionately seek things which they cannot obtain and flee evils which are inevitable (WAP 127). Then there are the disagreements between the ancient schools concerning the place and role of intellectual contemplation, and the elaboration of theoretical dogmata, in pursuing the good life. These range from the Aristotelian approach, which seeks out what Aristotle, in the opening pages of The Parts of Animals, calls the “incredible pleasure” (645a7) of investigating and contemplating all the works of nature as an end in itself; to the skeptics’ position, which sought eudaimonia (happiness, or welfare) through suspending judgment altogether; to the Cynics, “for whom philosophical discourse was reduced to a minimum—sometimes to mere gestures” (WAP 83, 173). Nevertheless, Hadot more typically stresses the commonalities between the ancient philosophical schools and conceptions of philosophy, insofar as each involved “… a complete reversal of received ideas: one was to renounce the false values of wealth, honors, and pleasures, and turn towards the true value of virtue, contemplation, a simple life-style, and the simple happiness of existing”. This radical opposition explains the reaction of nonphilosophers, which ranged from the mockery we find expressed in the comic poets, to the outright hostility that led to the death of Socrates (PWL 104).
It was with the figure of Socrates that ancient philosophy distinguished itself from its ancient precedents: the rhetorical education of the sophists, the discourses of the pre-Socratic physikoi and historians, the sayings and lives of the seven sages, and the aristocratic concern with the paideia, or upbringing, of young men (WAP 9-21). Socrates inspired nearly all subsequent ancient philosophic schools, either directly, through students like Plato, Xenophon, Aristippus, Euclides, and Antisthenes, or indirectly, via the writings of Plato in particular, as a kind of ethical ideal in the Stoic school, and as a mythical, Silenic figure central to the entirety of subsequent Western intellectual life. In Philosophy as a Way of Life, Hadot devotes an entire chapter of WAP to “the figure of Socrates,” as well as a long, beautiful essay exploring Socrates’ atopia (enigmatic nature) and the extraordinary responses his life has inspired, focusing particularly on Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Hadot’s Socrates anticipates and sets the mold for all the ancient philosophies as ways of life. First, Socrates associated the philosophic life with a revaluation of accepted normative commitments of his society and with a studied indifference toward the things his contemporaries coveted (wealth, status, property, public office, political disputes), as attested by his appearance, dress, and absence of gainful employment (compare Apo. 36b). Second, as Plato’s Alcibiades famously attests in the Symposium, Socrates overturned accepted, inherited models of wisdom, in his discourse as much as in his person, as well as through his repeated ironic claims, that he lacked any kind of higher wisdom, saying that he was only a midwife for the ideas of others, or was like a gadfly stirring his fellows from ethical complacency. He is identified in Plato’s Symposium with the daimonic Eros, mediating between human beings and the gods, but not for that reason divine himself (PWL 158-165).Third, Hadot’s Socrates is the first, unsurpassable practitioner of philosophic dialogue conceived of as what Hadot calls a “spiritual exercise” (compare 5) designed to actively implicate the other in the Socratic process of doubting received opinions and seeking to render one’s own beliefs consistent. For Hadot, “in the Socratic dialogue, the real question is less what is being talked about than who is doing the talking,” as Nikias attests in the Laches, when the latter notes that whichever topic Socrates’ interlocutor may raise, “he will continually be carried round and round by him, until at last he finds that he has to give an account both of his present and past life” (Laches 197e; WAP 28; PWL 155). Fourth, Hadot notes that when Socrates does attest to having some kinds of knowledge, in the famous Socratic paradoxes—that no one does evil voluntarily, that it is better to suffer than to do wrong, and that the good man cannot be harmed—this knowledge is of a specifically ethical kind, concerning how to live, and what is good or bad for the psyche: “Socrates does not know the value to be attributed to death, because it is not in his power . . . Yet he does know the value of moral action and intention, for they do depend on his choice, his decision, and his engagement . . .” (WAP 83, 84). In other words, in Hadot’s Socrates, care for the self and care for others coincided with Socrates’ sense of what Hadot calls “the absolute value of moral intent: a philosophical commitment embodied in Socrates’ dialogical calling, “to try to persuade all of you to concern yourself less about what he has than about what he is . . .” (Apo. 36c). Above all, Hadot stresses that throughout antiquity Socrates was the model of the philosopher whose work was, above all, his own life, death, and example: “He was the first to show that at all times and all places, in everything that happens to us, daily life gives the opportunity to do philosophy” (Plutarch, at WAP 38).
A further, too-often neglected feature of the ancient conception on philosophy as a way of life, Hadot argues, was a set of discourses aiming to describe the figure of the Sage. The Sage was the living embodiment of wisdom, “the highest activity human beings can engage in . . . which is linked intimately to the excellence and virtue of the soul” (WAP 220). Across the schools, Socrates himself was agreed to have been perhaps the only living exemplification of such a figure (his avowed agnoia notwithstanding). Pyrrho and Epicurus were also accorded this elevated status in their respective schools, just as Sextius and Cato were deemed sages by Seneca, and Plotinus by Porphyry. Yet more important than documenting the lives of historical philosophers (although this was another ancient literary genre) was the idea of the Sage as “transcendent norm.” The aim, by picturing such figures, was to give “an idealized description of the specifics of the way of life” that was characteristic of the each of the different schools (WAP 224). The philosophical Sage, in all the ancient discourses, is characterized by a constant inner state of happiness or serenity. This has been achieved through minimizing his bodily and other needs, and thus attaining to the most complete independence (autarcheia) vis-à-vis external things. The Sage is for this reason capable of maintaining virtuous resolve and clarity of judgment in the face of the most overwhelming threats, from natural catastrophes to “the fury of citizens who ordain evil . . . [or] the face of a threatening tyrant” (Horace in WAP 223). In the different ancient schools, these characteristics differentiating the Sage from nonphilosophers mean that this figure “tends to become very close to God or the gods,” as conceived by the philosophers. The Epicurean gods, like the God of Aristotle, Hadot notes, are characterized by their perfect serenity and exemption from all troubles and dangers. Epicurus calls the Sage the friend of the gods, and the gods friends of the Sages. Aristotle equates the contemplation of the wise man with the self-contemplation of the unmoved mover. Platonic philosophy sees ascent in wisdom as progressive assimilation to the divine (WAP 226-7). Hadot goes as far as to suggest that Plotinus and other ancient philosophers “project” the figure of the God, on the basis of their conception of the figure of the Sage, as a kind of model of human and intellectual perfection” (WAP 227-8). However, Hadot stresses that the divine freedom of the Sage from the concerns of ordinary human beings does not mean the Sage lacks all concern for the things that preoccupy other human beings. Indeed, in a series of remarkable analyses, Hadot argues that this indifference towards external goods (money, fame, property, office . . . ) opens the Sage to a different, elevated state of awareness in which he “never ceases to have the whole present in his mind, never forgets the world, thinks and acts in relation to the cosmos . . . ” (Bernhard Groethuysen in WAP 229). The Stoic Sage who has realized that external things do not depend upon his will, for instance, is prompted to accept these “indifferents” with equal benevolence or equanimity (the famous amor fati, or love of fate, later adopted by Nietzsche). In “The Sage and the World,” Hadot analyzes the peculiar phenomenology of this “detached, disinterested consciousness” in Lucretius and Seneca, aligning their thoughts with modern discourse on aesthetic perception, Rousseau’s famous “sensation of existence,” and Bergson’s conception of philosophical perception (PWL 253-6). The perception of the Sage constantly views things with the wonder of seeing the world for the first time (PWL 257-8), or as others see things only when a sense of their mortality, and therefore the unique singularity of each moment and experience, is imposed upon them (PWL 260).
For Hadot, famously, the means for the philosophical student to achieve the “complete reversal of our usual ways of looking at things” epitomized by the Sage were a series of spiritual exercises. These exercises encompassed all of those practices still associated with philosophical teaching and study: reading, listening, dialogue, inquiry, and research. However, they also included practices deliberately aimed at addressing the student’s larger way of life, and demanding daily or continuous repetition: practices of attention (prosoche), meditations (meletai), memorizations of dogmata, self-mastery (enkrateia), the therapy of the passions, the remembrance of good things, the accomplishment of duties, and the cultivation of indifference towards indifferent things (PWL 84). Hadot acknowledges his use of the term “spiritual exercises” may create anxieties, by associating philosophical practices more closely with religious devotion than typically done (Nussbaum 1996, 353-4; Cooper 2010). Hadot’s use of the adjective “spiritual” (or sometimes “existential”) indeed aims to capture how these practices, like devotional practices in the religious traditions (6a), are aimed at generating and reactivating a constant way of living and perceiving in prokopta, despite the distractions, temptations, and difficulties of life. For this reason, they call upon far more than “reason alone.” They also utilize rhetoric and imagination in order “to formulate the rule of life to ourselves in the most striking and concrete way” and aim to actively re-habituate bodily passions, impulses, and desires (as for instance, in Cynic or Stoic practices, abstinence is used to accustom followers to bear cold, heat, hunger, and other privations) (PWL 85). These practices were used in the ancient schools in the context of specific forms of interpersonal relationships: for example, the relationship between the student and a master, whose role it was to guide and assist the student in the examination of conscience, in identification and rectification of erroneous judgments and bad actions, and in the conduct of dialectical exchanges on established themes.
Perhaps the most well-known philosophical spiritual exercise is the Stoic practice of the premeditation of evils. In this exercise, the students are exhorted to present to their minds, in advance, the possible evils that may befall them in the course of their upcoming endeavors, so as to limit the force of their possible fear, anger, or sadness, should these evils occur. Galen recommends that at the beginning of each day individuals try to call to mind all they have to do in the course of the day ahead, envisaging the ways things may go awry, and recalling the principles that should guide them in their actions; Marcus, similarly, enjoins himself to anticipate each day that he will encounter envious, ungrateful, overbearing, treacherous, and selfish men (Med. II.1) Plato’s Socrates, in the Phaedo, famously comforts his friends by suggesting that philosophy is learning how to die. Taking this Platonic statement as emblematic of a wider philosophical exercise, Hadot stresses that repeated meditation upon one’s mortality, and the possible immanence of one’s death, was a spiritual exercise practiced across the philosophical schools. This exercise was not an exercise in morbidity or life-denial, so much as a means to focus the philosopher’s attention on the “infinite value” of each instant and action in life (5c). In Stoic texts, we read injunctions to “hurry up and live” (Seneca, at WAP 194). Horace’s famous carpe diem from the Odes in like manner reminds us that “Life ebbs as I speak: so seize each day, and grant the next no credit” (PWL 88). As in “practical physics” (5d), meditating upon one’s mortality in such exercises is also prescribed as a way of dying to one’s individuality and passions, so the philosopher learns to look at things from the perspective of universality or objectivity.
Constant, renewed attention to the present moment, Hadot argues, “ . . . is, in a sense, the key to spiritual exercises” (PWL 84). The philosophical attempt to focus our attention on present concerns answers to the ontological observation that “we live in the present, so infinitely small. The rest either has been lived, or else it [the future] is uncertain” (Aurelius Med. VII, 54). It also reflects the observation that the pressing, immediate demands of one’s upsetting passions are all responses to concerns about the future (that some feared state will transpire, or some desired state may not) or to concerns about past actions (guilt, shame, or anxiety about how others have perceived one’s words or actions). Yet all that one can ever change or achieve is what is occurring in the present moment, which is the site of all decision, action, and freedom. It would follow that these pathe, or their immediate demands, are tangentially irrational. This is the thought that underlies both the Epicurean prayers of gratitude that nature has made necessary things easy to attain and difficult things easy to bear, and the Stoic teachings concerning the irrationality of the pathē. We must learn to calm our passions so we can clearly assess what is happening to us at any given moment, rectify our present intentions, and accept with equanimity all that is occurring which does not depend upon our volition. The larger aim is that the philosopher learns to separate the self (or in the Stoics, the ruling principle) from all unnecessary attachments to alienable, external goods, so that a sense of joy and gratitude can be experienced independent of whichever situations fate has delivered. As Hadot notes, the Epicurean and Stoic meditations concerning how death is nothing for “us” (since when it is here, “we” are not, and vice-versa) belong here: these meditations are a means to conquer worries about this inevitable future event (WAP 197-8).
We saw in 4b how Hadot situates even Aristotle’s apparently purely theoretical endeavors in the context of a choice of bios, one which aims to deliver to the inquirer the great pleasure that attends even the study of physical nature, “for there is something wonderful in all of the works of Nature” (Aristotle at WAP 83). Similarly, Hadot notes, the Epicurean elaboration of a physical philosophy of atoms, an infinite universe, and a plurality of worlds was pursued and recommended by Epicurus as a means to overcome unnecessary fear of death and interventionist gods. The Stoics not only maintained the distinction Hadot generalizes to all ancient philosophy, between philosophy as a way of life and philosophical discourse. Hadot argues that thinkers in this school also maintained that there were “lived” practices of logic, involving the constant examination of one’s practical reasoning and forms of what he terms “practical physics” (WAP 172; PWL 242). Practical physics involved the philosopher’s activity of vigilantly monitoring all his beliefs concerning what he encounters. One practice here was that of dispassionately, analytically dividing enticing or threatening appearances into their matter, form, and parts. In this way, their potentially overpowering impression upon us is combated, as in Marcus’ famous description of sex as “the rubbing together of pieces of gut, followed by the spasmodic secretion of a little bit of slime” (PWL 185). Hadot devotes an entire essay in PWL to the practice of the “view from above,” which he argues was practiced across all of the ancient schools. In this exercise, the students are encouraged to reconsider how small, or ant-like, their lives and actions appear from an enlarged, or cosmic, perspective (the famous perspective sub specie eternis), so as to combat the erroneous significance our self-interest and passions prompt us to assign to particular episodes. In Cicero, as in Boethius (Consolations II 7), for example, the philosopher’s consideration of how his fate is as a tiny speck given the magnitude of the world or of space makes him see the irrationality of the pursuit of fame. Seneca recommends the same exercise to show the folly of pursuing luxuries and of nations’ constant warring (WAP 206-7). The positive side to the exercise is to again engender in students the kind of wonder, serenity, or elevation of spirit, imputed to the perspective of the Sage. In The Veil of Isis, Hadot’s late work on the history of Western conceptions of the natural world, Hadot aligns the attitude engendered by this view from above with the “Orphic” attitude to revealing nature’s secrets through poetry, art, and discourse (VI 155-32). This attitude, pursued in modern philosophy under the rubric of aesthetic perception, is opposed to the “Promethean,” technological attempt to tame nature that is prominent in Baconian science.(VI 101-154).
Hadot’s treatment of Marcus Aurelius’ Ta Eis Eauton (or “Meditations”) in his long essay in PWL, and in the book The Inner Citadel, serves well to bring together both the methodological concerns governing Hadot’s readings of classical thought and this conception of ancient philosophy as revolving around a series of spiritual exercises. The text as we have it is divided into 473 fragments in twelve books, and for all its flashes of limpid beauty, it can seem completely disordered to the modern reader. It has provoked a host of interpretations over time, down to speculations concerning Marcus’ melancholia, stomach ulcer, or morphine addiction. The whole seems to develop no argument and often to repeat itself. The emperor-philosopher mixes genres, or language games, from aphorisms, via staged dialogues and injunctions addressed to himself, to citations from poets and other philosophers, to more extended enthymemes. For Hadot, these formal peculiarities of Marcus’ text dissolve when we situate the text itself as the exemplar of a type of spiritual exercise recommended in the Stoic heritage to which Marcus belonged: namely, as a hypomnemata the philosopher was enjoined to keep always at hand (procheiron), whose production and rereading was recommended as a means for to keep alive at all times the key Stoic principles (kephalaia), independent of whether anyone else should read them. In this perspective, as Hadot concludes The Inner Citadel, the repetitions, the multiple developments of the same theme, and the stylistic effort in the Meditations attest not to any conceptual laziness or other morbidity, rather they suggest “the efforts of a man . . . trying to do what, in the last analysis, we are all trying to do: to live in complete consciousness and lucidity, to give to each of our instants its full intensity, and to give meaning to our entire life” (IC, 312-313).
Hadot disputes the notion of a simple, radical break between Greek philosophy and Judeo-Christian monotheism. Hadot notes that, in the first centuries of the Christian era, educated Christian apologists such as Clement of Alexander, Basil of Caesarea, Origen, Justin, and the other Cappadocian fathers identified Christianity as the true, non-Greek, or “barbarian,” philosophia, much as Philo of Alexandria had presented Judaism as patrios philosophia—the traditional philosophy of the Jewish people (PWL 128-9). Here, Hadot’s attention to the creative role of exegetical errors in the history of ideas applies (see 2). For above all, the Greek word Logos was central to Greek philosophy since Heraclitus, but it was also used by Saint John in the opening verses of the fourth gospel, making possible this conception of Christianity as philosophy (WAP 218-9; PWL 128). Saint John maintained that anticipatory aspects or elements of the true Logos had been dispersed amongst the Greeks. Christians were in possession of the revealed Logos itself in the incarnate Christ. Christianity’s conception as a way of living also positioned it well to appropriate the spiritual exercises developed in the philosophical schools, integrating them into the different “style of life, spiritual attitude and tonality” of Christian life (PWL 129; 139). From the fourth century C. E., monasticism as the perfection of Christian life, in a life withdrawn from ordinary society and devoted to meditation and prayer, adopted what a Cistercian text calls “the disciplines of celestial philosophy” (PWL 129): prosoche or attention to oneself and one’s thoughts, askeseis of the passions, detachment or aprospatheia from worldly concerns, meditation upon key rules of life, the attempt to live each day as if it were one’s last, the practice of writing as hypomnema; all now refigured as the attempt to live in constant remembrance of god. (PWL 129-135) Particularly interesting from a scholarly perspective are Hadot’s observations of the efforts made by Christian authors to ground these practices in biblical exegesis, as for instance in tying philosophical prosoche to biblical text: “Give heed to yourself, lest there be a hidden word in your heart” (Deuteronomy); “Above all else, guard your heart” (Proverbs 4:23); “Examine yourself . . . and test yourselves” (Second Corinthians 13:5); and even the Song of Songs’ “If you do not know yourself, O most beautiful of women . . .” (WAP 248-9; 242; WAP 130).
As Hadot notes, another component of the apologists’ attempt to present Christianity in forms congenial to Greco-Roman culture was the attempt to reinterpret elements of Greek philosophical discourse, for instance, the theological passages of the Timaeus, as anticipating revealed doctrine. In another way, the Christian authors would interpret revealed notions in terms redolent of philosophical discourse, as when Evagrius defines “the Kingdom of heaven” as “apatheia of the soul along with true knowledge of existing things” (PWL 136), or in Origen’s recommendation to students to read the Book of Proverbs, Ecclesiastes, and the Song of Songs, as corresponding respectively to philosophical ethics, physics, and theology (WAP 239-240). With the growing cultural ascendancy of revealed Christianity, however, particularly after the closure of the philosophical schools, Hadot argues that philosophy as a way of life was largely eclipsed. Philosophical discourse, for its part, was subordinated within the Christian orbit to the higher wisdom of the Word of God as revealed in the Bible. Elements of Aristotelian logic and ontology, as they had been integrated into the Neoplatonism of the imperial era, were adapted in the Church’s attempts to stabilize the Trinitarian God. Differently, Church fathers like Origen and Clement of Alexandria adopted Philo’s earlier claim that philosophical studies must be conceived as the propaedeutic to the wisdom revealed in the Torah of Moses. By the time of Augustine, philosophy was becoming assimilated in this way with the other secular, mathematical, and dialectical knowledge necessary for the Christian exegete—but in no way sufficient unto itself. The recovery of Aristotle’s writings in the West, and the development of the medieval universities, saw his dialectics adopted as a means for theologians to respond to problems Christian dogma posed to reason, whereas commentary on his dialectical, ethical, and physical writings became the keystone of teaching in the arts faculties. As Hadot comments, “Aristotle” in this way became “Aristotelianism,” and the conception of university philosophy as entirely an exegetical or “scholastic” endeavor was born. It would survive the rise of the natural sciences and the universities’ passing from the Church’s to the secular State’s authority. According to Hadot, there remains a “radical opposition” between the modern, diploma-issuing university, which promotes specific levels of objectified, mostly written forms of knowledge or transferrable skills, and the ancient philosophical school, “which addressed individuals in order to transform their entire personality . . . to train people for their career as human beings . . .” (WAP 260).
Nevertheless, Hadot argues that since the Middle Ages, philosophers both within and outside of the universities have kept alive what he terms the “vital, existential dimension” of ancient philosophy (WAP 261). Already in the Middle Ages, scholastic commentators noted the weight of passages in Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (book X) as pointing toward the theoretical way of life as the culmination of philosophia. Petrarch and Erasmus differently contested that philosophy could be reduced to the commentary on texts, since this in no way makes the scholar better. In a way which contrasts with Michel Foucault’s claims concerning the history of philosophy as a way of life, Hadot sees elements of Stoicism in Descartes’ conception of adequate or comprehensive representation, and his choice to write Meditations; also in Kant’s contrast of the “worldly” “Idea of Philosopher” from the “scholastic” “artists of reason,” and Kant’s central critical notion of the primacy of practical reason. At different points in his oeuvre, Hadot also cites Montaigne, Shaftesbury, Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau, Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Merleau-Ponty, and Wittgenstein as legatees to the ancient conception of philosophy as a way of life that it was his own life’s work to try to re-animate.
Last updated: October 10, 2011 | Originally published: