Johann Georg Hamann was the philosophically most sophisticated thinker of the German Counter-enlightenment. Born in 1730 in Königsberg in eastern Prussia, Hamann was a contemporary and friendly acquaintance of the philosopher Immanuel Kant, and in many ways Hamann’s career can be seen in parallel to that of his great friend. Like Kant, Hamann attended the University of Königsberg, and in his early life was a devoted partisan of the Enlightenment, the philosophical and literary movement that emphasized the clearing away of outdated prejudice and the application of scientific reason to every area of human life. But during a business trip to London (on behalf of the firm of the Berens family, who also published Kant’s works), Hamann underwent a sort of conversion that involved giving up his commitment to the secular Enlightenment in favor of a more orthodox view of Protestant Christianity. As a consequence, he embarked on a career of trenchant and often scathing criticism of the Enlightenment. This change in world-views coincided with his reading of the British empiricist philosophers George Berkeley and David Hume. Hamann saw the idealism of the former and the skepticism of the latter as constituting a reductio ad absurdum of Enlightenment thought: Scientific reason leads us inevitably either to doubt or to deny the reality of the world around us. Three of Hamann’s intellectual achievements are of particular significance: His writings Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten (Socratic Memorabilia) and Aesthetica in nuce (Aesthetics in a Nutshell), in which he opposed Enlightenment thought with an indirect and ironic mode of discourse emphasizing the importance of aesthetic experience and the role of genius in intuiting nature; his views on language; and his influential criticisms of Kant’s critical thought, expressed in his “Metakritik über den Purismum der Vernunft” and in his commentary, in a letter to Johann Gottfried Herder, on Kant’s essay “What is Enlightenment?”
Hamann’s rejection of the Enlightenment was greeted with distress by his friends Kant and Berens. Although they hoped that he could be won back to the cause of reason, these hopes were dashed with the publication in 1759 of Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten, and the following year of Aesthetica in nuce. Together these two works offer a world-view that might be described as antirationalist but not irrationalist.
Hamann’s intention in the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten is to offer a defense of religious faith that renders such faith immune against rational attack while in no way accepting the rationalist’s terms of debate. In order to do this, however, he faces a seemingly insoluble problem: He must undermine the grounds of the Enlightenment view of reason and religion without committing himself to other, opposed positions that are subject to rational criticism and refutation. Several aspects of how he goes about this were very influential in German thought in the 18th century. First, the work is written under a pseudonym, or rather, not under any name at all: The title page says that the Denkwürdigkeiten were “assembled for the boredom of the public by a lover of boredom,” most likely a reference to the Enlighteners’ desire to educate the public in the name of reason. By distancing himself from the authorship of what was probably his most important work, Hamann makes clear that any arguments offered or positions taken in the book ought to be viewed as moves in a game rather than as expressions of his rational faculty. Second, Hamann makes crucial use of irony, specifically Socratic irony, in his attack on the Enlightenment. “I have,” says Hamann at the beginning of the work, “written about Socrates in a Socratic manner. Analogy was the soul of his syllogisms, and he gave them irony as their body.” Specifically, Hamann holds up Socrates, the philosophers’ secular saint, in order to draw an unfavorable contrast between him and the Enlightenment. Despite his wisdom, Socrates explicitly renounced his claim to know the answers to the questions he asked; rather than taking and defending determinate positions on the issues he was interested in, Socrates engaged his listeners in conversation so as to bring them to realize that they did not know the answers to these questions any more than Socrates did. Similarly, Hamann intends the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten to show that Berens and Kant are (at least) as far from genuine knowledge as he is. Finally, like all of Hamann’s works, the style of the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten is intentionally opaque: In contrast to the Enlightenment emphasis on universal truths that transcend the time and place in which they are expressed, Hamann fills his text with oblique allusions to a wide variety of texts in several languages; moves from one point to another with little indication of how the various passages are supposed to hang together; and shifts without warning from careful argumentative analysis to citation of texts to something like oracular declamation. As a result, it is impossible for the reader to forget that the text she is reading is the work of a particular individual writing in a particular time and place, rather than expressing timeless deliverances of reason.
How then does the text of the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten accomplish the defense of religious faith Hamann desires? The chief contention of the work is that religious faith is neither based on nor subject to reason. Here Hamann relies not so much on Socrates but rather on David Hume, whose skeptical writings had affected him so deeply a few years before. Hume would doubtless have found little to his liking in Hamann’s rejection of the Enlightenment, but Hamann found much in Hume to serve his purposes. Specifically, Hamann adapts Hume’s important claim that “belief… [etc.].” Hume intends this as a way of answering the worst sort of skepticism: If our beliefs are not based on reasoning, then reasoning cannot threaten them, either. Hamann makes use of the fact that in German there is one word, ‘Glaube,’ that corresponds both to ‘belief’ and to ‘faith’ in English. Thus in his hands Hume’s claim is extended to religious faith as well, making it immune from rational criticism. But this is not to be understood as a position taken with debates about the philosophical foundations of religion. Instead, Hamann again makes use of the figure of Socrates. He compares Socrates to someone refusing to join a game of cards: If this person didn’t know how to play, Hamann observes, we might take their refusal as an expression of incapacity, much as we would take an expression of ignorance from an ordinary person as a genuine indication that he lacks knowledge. But in the case of Socrates, who was manifestly a deep thinker and great philosopher, professions of ignorance must be read as refusals to participate in a game in which the other players “break the rules of the game and steal its joy [das Glück desselben stehlen]. Socrates’ ignorance thus became a “thorn in the eyes” of the sophists (here again Kant and Berens are clearly intended) and serve as “testimony” against the “new Athenians” of Hamann’s time, who deified Socrates “in order to be better able to mock the carpenter’s son [Jesus].”
But if Socrates was a great philosopher, as Hamann emphasizes, what can he be said to know? Hamann’s answer to this question is ‘genius.’
What in Homer makes up for the ignorance of artistic rules, that Aristotle thought up after him, and what in Shakespeare makes up for the ignorance or violation of these rules? Genius (Genie) is the unambiguous answer. Socrates could thus well have been ignorant; he had a genius (Genius) on whose knowledge he could rely, and who he feared as his God.Hamann’s use of the notion of genius in the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten serves as a bridge to his second major work, the Aesthetica in nuce. His target in the Aesthetica is Enlightenment thought as it applies specifically to art and beauty. Aesthetics in the Enlightenment alternated between attempts to reduce art to rules, more specifically rules for the accurate and morally uplifting imitation of nature, and attempts to explain art as a response to the subjective human capacity for feeling and sensation. Hamann emphatically rejects both of these tendencies, along with the devaluation of the aesthetic he seems them as implying. Far from being reducible to rational principles, in his view aesthetic experience is a fundamental and immediate experience of nature, which he encapsulates (both in the Aesthetica and in Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten) under the term ‘genius.’
The chief philosophical significance of the Aesthetica in nuce is that Hamann here deepens his conception of the connection between artistic genius, nature, and God. Nature, he says, is “a speech through creation to creation.” That is, nature is a text written by God, which, being creatures ourselves, we are able to understand through His grace. But this understanding is of course not a rational one, through concepts and scientific investigation. Rather, in aesthetic experience we grasp nature in a manner that precedes, and indeed forms the basis for, rational thought: “Poetry [Poesie] is the native tongue of the human race, just as gardening is older than agriculture, painting older than writing, chant older than declamation, similes older than conclusions, and barter than trade.” This view has radical consequences for the Enlightenment. Whereas the task of philosophical aesthetics in the early modern period was to incorporate aesthetic experience into the rational worldview, Hamann now argues that we must instead do the former, that is, view reason as one aspect of our aesthetic experience of the world. It is thus pointless to try to formulate rational standards for beauty. Second, giving art priority over reason threatens reason’s claim to be the proper form for representing nature, which is crucial to the central role given in the Enlightenment to natural science. Finally, if reason is subordinated to art rather than the reverse, then in so far as there is a tension between artistic and rational views of the world the value placed on reason in the 18th-century represents not progress but regress. Hamann’s early writings inspired thinkers such as Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, who appropriated the skeptical arguments of David Hume to argue that reason is based entirely on faith, and Johann Gottfried Herder, who offered an account of human thought that emphasized the continuous historical development of humanity from its original natural state. More immediately, Hamann’s thought had an enormous impact on the literary movement known as the Sturm und Drang- literally, “storm and stress.” Works of the Sturm und Drang emphasized nature and human passion. Indeed these two themes were closely linked, in that passion was seen as closer to nature. More distantly, Hamann’s thought was instrumental in the rise, around the turn of the century, of the Romantic movement in Germany.
From his earliest works onward, language was a central theme in all of Hamann’s writings. Here too his opposition to the Enlightenment was influential not only in his time but also in present-day philosophy and literary theory. Hamann’s account of language can best be understood by contrast with an admittedly too-simple sketch of the sort of view he opposed. Much Enlightenment thought on language was naturalistic, that is, it saw language as a useful tool invented by human beings. The original humans were thinking, rational beings who invented symbols, attaching names things in the world around them for purposes of communication and learning. Thus both reason and the world precede, and are independent of, language. Hamann rejects this view in all its particulars.
Important elements of Hamann’s account of language are already visible in the Aesthetica in nuce, in particular in the claim that the world is “a speech through creation to creation.” Here it is clear that language for Hamann is not something projected onto the world by human reason, but instead is as it were embedded in the things themselves by God the creator. At some points in his writings on language, Hamann maintains the position that language is simultaneously the work of both God and humans, while at other places he seems to lean more toward the view that God alone is the source of language. In any case, he clearly holds the view that neither thought nor reason is possible independently of language. Indeed, since God’s act of creation is in a sense inherently linguistic, he must hold that language precedes, or at least is contemporaneous with reason in particular and thought in general. As we will see, this is an idea that is very important for his critique of the philosophy of Immanuel Kant.
In 1781 Hamann’s friend but philosophical opponent Immanuel Kant published his Critique of Pure Reason. Kant’s project in the Critique has two sides. On the one hand, Kant argues that reason is incapable of attaining knowledge of the existence of, for example, God and the immortality of the soul; however, these beliefs are also incapable of being refuted through reason. This much, of course, Hamann could gladly agree with. But Kant also undertakes to defend both reason and the claim of natural science to offer a privileged description of the world. The latter task is accomplished in the Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, in which Kant argues that our experience requires us to understand the natural world as being composed of substances interacting according to necessary causal laws discoverable by natural science. The former task (which is Hamann’s chief target) is accomplished by reinterpreting reason as the ability to set goals for human cognition and moral action. This alarmed Hamann because it put reason in the place of religious faith, along with the tradition and culture he thought essential to human understanding. In response to Kant’s work, which was the most important event in German philosophy in the 18th century, Hamann penned a short essay entitled “Metakritik über den Purismum der Vernunft” (“Metacritique on the Purism of Reason”). Although the Metacritique was never published in Hamann’s lifetime, he included it in a letter to his friend Johann Gottfried Herder (who was also a student of Kant’s), and Herder passed it on to Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, thus enabling this small but interesting text to exert what one commentator has called a “subterranean influence” on German thought after Kant.
Hamann’s thesis in the Metacritique is that “language is the center of reason’s misunderstanding with itself.” More specifically, Hamann thinks that Kant’s critical philosophy, while maintaining that everything in the world must submit to rational questioning and appraisal, nevertheless overlooks the crucial fact that all use of reason, including Kant’s reason, depends on language: Kant imagines, he says, that he can simply “invent” a “universal philosophical language,” whereas here and elsewhere Hamann maintains that words have meaning only in relation to the time and place where they are appropriate. Hamann is clearly on to something important here, because the force of Kant’s conclusions in the Critique of Pure Reason requires that we accept his quite substantial body of terminology, such as the distinctions between a priori and a posteriori, and between analytic and synthetic propositions. But, one might ask, why can’t one simply invent terms of art and stipulate their meanings? This is probably, in fact, what Kant saw himself as doing. Hamann answers this question indirectly, by appealing to the empiricists Berkeley and Hume. Both Berkeley and Hume reject the existence of so-called “abstract ideas,” arguing that there is no philosophical justification for referring to anything in the world other than particular sensible things, whereas abstract ideas are things that can exist only in the privacy of human minds. Since Kant himself accepts the quasi-empiricist view that our knowledge is limited to possible experience, Hamann’s point is that Kant cannot justify his own philosophical enterprise unless he can offer a justification for the very language in which the enterprise is couched- a demand that seems impossible for Kant to fulfill.
Quite late in his life, Hamann participated in another intellectual dispute involving Kant, this one centering on the question, “What is enlightenment.” Although Kant was not the first to contribute to this debate, his was the most prominent and influential statement on the question. In his essay, also entitled “What is Enlightenment?,” Kant defines enlightenment as “the departure of human beings from their self-incurred incapacity.” Its slogan, he says, is sapere aude!– Dare to think! Ignorance on this view is a sort of moral failing in human beings who have neglected to exercise their rational faculties to the fullest extent possible. Hamann responded to Kant’s essay not in print, but rather in a letter to a former student of Kant’s, Christian Jacob Kraus. Again, his target is the Enlightenment’s belief that reason rather than culture, tradition, or religious faith, is the proper guide for human life. His response to Kant turns on an important change in Kant’s language: For Kant’s word “incapacity” [Unmündigkeit] he substitutes the word “domination” [Vormundschaft]. Failure to be fully enlightened results, Hamann suggests, not from a failure to think for oneself, but rather from the fact that people are told what to think by people-like Kant– who see themselves as more rational and thus closer to the truth than ordinary mortals. Hamann thus rejects Kant’s view that the incapacity he bemoans is “self-incurred.” Instead, the “enlightened” state replaces one dominant group (say, the aristocracy) with another (“Enlighteners” such as Kant). Here Hamann anticipates, at least in broad strokes, the late 20th-century suspicion that liberal democracy cannot live up to its own pretensions to universal tolerance, because viewing oneself as a citizen in a liberal democracy requires many of us to subordinate some of our most passionately held beliefs to the demands of citizenship.
Johann Georg Hamann died in 1788.
George Mason University
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 3, 2005 | Originally published: