Charles Hartshorne: Biography and Psychology of Sensation

HartshorneCharles Hartshorne is widely regarded as having been an important figure in twentieth century metaphysics and philosophy of religion. His contributions are wide-ranging. He championed the aspirations of metaphysics when it was unfashionable, and the metaphysic he championed helped change some of the fashions of philosophy. He counted some well-known scientists among his friends, and he embraced the deliverances of modern science (he never questioned, for example, the truth of evolution); however, he insisted that metaphysics and empirical science have different aims and methods, each ensuring in its own way a disciplined objectivity. His “neoclassical” or “process” metaphysics is in the same family of speculative philosophy that one finds in the works of Charles Sanders Peirce and the later writings of Alfred North Whitehead. Although he did not style himself a disciple of Peirce or of Whitehead, he made significant contributions to the study of these philosophers even as he developed his own views. Like them, he endeavored in his own metaphysical thinking to give full weight to the dynamic, relational, temporal, and affective dimensions of the universe. He emphasized, as few before him had, in logic and in the processes of nature, the foundational nature of asymmetrical relations.

Hartshorne was also a theist at a time when the coherence of theism was under attack from quarters as various as logical positivism and Sartre’s existentialism. Hartshorne’s name is inseparable from the revival of the ontological or modal argument for God’s existence, having devoted twenty-three articles and the better part of two books to the topic. He insisted, however, that it was unavailing to appeal to the ontological argument (or any theistic argument) as support for theism without first rethinking the concept of deity. He argued that thinking about God had been handicapped by lack of attention to the logically possible forms of theism, and in place of the unmoved mover of classical theology, he proposed “the most, and best, moved mover.” Hartshorne endorsed a “dipolar” version of theism according to which God is both necessary and contingent, but in different respects. Hartshorne sought a “panentheism” in which God includes the creatures without negating their distinctiveness. He argued that no putative inerrant revelation or infallible institution could negate the effects of the inherent fallibility of human knowledge. He occasionally worried that his “highly rationalized” form of theism would not have wide appeal; on the other hand, it was precisely a God of love and the love of God that were ever his “intuitive clue[s]” in philosophy. His ideas about deity influenced the philosophy of both religion and theology; Hartshorne had argued that it is necessary to take seriously an alternative to classical understandings of God that avoided their shortcomings while preserving their best insights.

Hartshorne did not devote all of his intellectual energies to metaphysics and philosophical theology. His first book, The Philosophy and Psychology of Sensation (1934), ventured empirical hypotheses about sensation, a subject to which he returned intermittently throughout his life. Also of note is his Born to Sing: An Interpretation and World Survey of Bird Song (1973), which established him as a serious ornithologist. What follows is an overview of Hartshorne’s life as well as a discussion of his first book and its relation to the larger themes of his philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. The Affective Continuum and the Psychology of Sensation
  3. Conclusion: Hartshorne’s Work on Sensation and the Rest of his Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Life
      2. Psychology of Sensation
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Life
      2. Psychology of Sensation
    3. Bibliography

1. Biography

Charles Hartshorne (pronounced “Harts-horne”; literally, “deer’s horn”) was born June 5, 1897 in Kittanning, Pennsylvania, the second of six children of Francis Cope Hartshorne (1868-1950), an Episcopal minister, and Marguerite Haughton Hartshorne (1868-1959). He and his brother Richard (1899-1992)—who would achieve fame as a geographer—attended Yeates Boarding School (1911-1915), where he acquired a life-long interest in ornithology. Later, he attended Haverford College (1915-1917), where he was a student of the Quaker mystic Rufus Jones. With America’s entry into the First World War imminent, Hartshorne volunteered for the medical corps and spent the war years (1917-1919) in Le Tréport, France as an orderly in a British hospital.

What Hartshorne referred to as “the second period” of his intellectual development began when he enrolled at Harvard in 1919. He majored in philosophy and minored in English literature. Among his teachers were James Haughton Woods (named after Hartshorne’s maternal grandfather), W. E. Hocking, H. M. Sheffer, Ralph Barton Perry, C. I. Lewis, and the psychologist L. T. Troland. He completed the Ph.D. in 1923, writing a 306 page dissertation titled An Outline and Defense of the Argument for the Unity of Being in the Absolute or Divine Good. The broad outlines of his later thought are evident in the dissertation, but he never published any part of it. He would later remark, in Creativity in American Philosophy (1984), that it was a form of process philosophy that was “somewhat naïve and best forgotten.” Nevertheless, he was productive throughout his career, writing twenty-one books and over five hundred articles and reviews.

After graduation, Hartshorne returned to Europe as a Sheldon Traveling Fellow (1923-1925). He spent most of his time in Germany, but he also visited England, France, and Austria. He was fluent in German and spoke French reasonably well. His travels were rich with intellectual stimulation. In Europe he encountered many philosophical luminaries, including Moritz Schlick, Heinrich Gomperz, Lucien Lévy-Bruhl, Edouard Le Roy, Lucien Laberthonnière, Samuel Alexander, R. G. Collingwood, J. S. Haldane, G. E. Moore, G. F. Stout, Harold H. Joachim, Richard Kroner, Oskar Becker, Julius Ebbinghaus, Max Scheler, Max Planck, Adolf Harnack, Jonas Cohn, Paul Natorp, and Nicolai Hartmann. The most famous philosophers he met and with whom he studied were Edmund Husserl and Martin Heidegger. On his return to the United States, Hartshorne wrote the first English language review of Heidegger’s Sein und Zeit (Being and Time); the review appeared in the Philosophical Review and was published as part of the penultimate chapter of his second book.

Hartshorne was an Instructor and Research Fellow at Harvard (1925-1928) where he was simultaneously exposed to the two thinkers with whose philosophies he felt the most affinity: Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914) and Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947). Boxes of Peirce’s unpublished manuscripts were donated to the Harvard library by Peirce’s widow, and Hartshorne was given the assignment of editing these papers. In 1927, Paul Weiss joined Hartshorne in the project. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce was published in six volumes between 1931 and 1935 and would become the standard edition of Peirce’s work throughout the century.  Although Hartshorne published enough articles on Peirce to fill a book—a total of seventeen—neither he nor Weiss thought of becoming Peirce scholars. Hartshorne’s duties at Harvard also included helping to grade papers for Whitehead, who was a recent addition to the faculty (1924). As Whitehead’s assistant, Hartshorne witnessed the Englishman develop “the philosophy of organism” that would find expression in Whitehead’s Gifford Lectures, published as Process and Reality (1929). This book, as well as others written by Whitehead during this period, formed the foundation of twentieth century process philosophy.

Hartshorne’s earliest writings, prior to his encounter with Whitehead, emphasize process and relativity as metaphysically basic; for this reason, he characterized his relation to Whitehead (also to Peirce) as one of pre-established harmony. Just as he would write much on Peirce’s philosophy, so he promoted Whitehead’s importance in thirty-nine articles and reviews; thirteen of these articles are collected in Whitehead’s Philosophy: Selected Essays 1935-1970 (1972). For a time Hartshorne considered himself a Peircean and a Whiteheadian, in each case, as he said,  “with reservations”—in later years he emphasized the reservations. It is clear, in any event, that the exposure to Peirce and Whitehead helped him to focus his thinking. Whitehead’s works, in particular, provided him with a technical vocabulary for expressing his own metaphysics that in some respects overlaps with Whitehead’s but in other respects is very different from it. In the fullness of time, these differences led some Whitehead scholars to complain of an overly Hartshornean slant to Whitehead studies, thus bearing testimony to Hartshorne’s dominance. Hartshorne referred to the years between 1925 and 1958 as his “third period” to highlight the significant influence of Peirce and Whitehead on his thinking.

When Harvard announced that they had “no job” for Hartshorne after his third year of teaching and research, he took a position in 1928 at the University of Chicago, where he was a faculty member in the Department of Philosophy until 1955. He eventually held a joint appointment as a member of the Meadville Theological School (1943-1955). Shortly after the move to Chicago, he married Dorothy Eleanore Cooper (1904-1995), his life-long companion. The Hartshorne’s only child, Emily (Schwartz), was born in 1940. In 1936, he served as secretary (that is, chairperson) of the department of philosophy, during which time Rudolf Carnap was hired. Hartshorne was a visiting faculty at Stanford University in 1937, and he spent the 1941-42 academic year at the New School in New York. From 1948 to 1949 he taught at Goethe University in Frankfurt and also lectured at the Sorbonne in Paris. He was president of the Western Division of the American Philosophical Association in 1949, and he was a Fulbright Lecturer at Melbourne, Australia during 1951-52. Hartshorne was also a member of the informal group of theologians called “the Chicago school,” which included Henry Nelson Wieman, Daniel Day Williams, Bernard Meland, and Bernard Loomer.

At Chicago, Hartshorne’s thinking matured, and he developed the outlines of his own system of speculative philosophy, which he called neoclassical metaphysics. The hiring of Carnap was especially ironic since he was the most famous of the logical positivists  while Hartshorne was one of positivism’s greatest critics. However, Hartshorne reported that, despite his and Carnap’s profound differences in philosophical outlook, their engagement was cordial and fruitful. The German helped him to formalize his objection to the classical understanding of divine foreknowledge in his book The Divine Relativity (1948). Hartshorne published six books while at Chicago (in addition to the Peirce papers), including the wide-ranging survey of philosophical theology titled Philosophers Speak of God (1953/2000), edited with his student William L. Reese. Hartshorne’s other books during this period, apart from his first one, focused on the problems of metaphysics: Beyond Humanism: Essays in the Philosophy of Nature (1937), Man’s Vision of God and the Logic of Theism (1941), and Reality as Social Process: Studies in Metaphysics and Religion (1953).

Hartshorne attracted many graduate students from Chicago’s three federated seminaries, two of whom became well-known theologians (John B. Cobb, Jr., b. 1925, and Schubert Ogden, b. 1928). He was unhappy, however, that few graduate students in philosophy studied with him. Two of the most well-known students in Hartshorne’s classes were Richard Rorty (1932-2007) and Huston Smith (b. 1919). Each became known for defending views at odds with Hartshorne’s ideas : Rorty in philosophy and Smith in religious studies. Even as he disagreed sharply with his former teacher, Rorty made clear that he never ceased to admire Hartshorne’s intellectual passion and generosity of spirit.

Hartshorne and his family left Chicago and moved to Atlanta, Georgia in 1955, where he taught at Emory University until 1962. In 1958, he taught at the University of Washington and visited Kyoto, Japan as a Fulbright Lecturer.  There he learned more about Buddhism, which he called the first process philosophy. It was also in Japan that he began a more intense focus on Anselm of Canterbury’s ontological argument for God’s existence. He would soon publish in the second chapter of The Logic of Perfection (1962), for the first time in the history of philosophy, a formalization of the argument using modal symbolism. Soon afterwards came Anselm’s Discovery (1965), which includes an overview of treatments of the ontological argument in the works of various philosophers and theologians. Hartshorne described this time in his life as the beginning of his “fourth period,” as he gained more critical distance from the philosophies of Peirce and Whitehead and began in earnest to refine his own metaphysical synthesis. Now in his sixties, he faced mandatory retirement at Emory at age 68. In 1962, John Silber, then at the University of Texas at Austin, invited Hartshorne to Texas. Hartshorne accepted the invitation and, in 1963, became Ashbel Smith Professor of Philosophy; he taught full-time until his official retirement in 1978, and part-time for a few years thereafter. During his years at Texas he taught and traveled widely, throughout the United States, including two summer sessions at Colorado College (1977 and 1979), but also to India and Japan on a third Fulbright (1966), Australia (1974), the University of Louvain, Belgium (1978), and again to Japan and Hawaii (1984).

Hartshorne’s productivity in the last three decades of his life was prodigious, beginning with four major works; these included the aforementioned book on Whitehead, the book on bird song, as well as A Natural Theology for Our Time (1967) and Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method (1970), the latter being his most comprehensive and systematic presentation of neoclassical metaphysics. In his eighties, Hartshorne published dozens of articles, reviews, and forewords, and completed numerous books. Hartshorne gave his most complete assessment of western philosophy in Insights and Oversights of Great Thinkers: An Evaluation of Western Philosophy (1983) and in Creativity in American Philosophy (1984). Omnipotence and Other Theological Mistakes (1984) is a nontechnical introduction to his philosophical theology. The posthumously published Creative Experiencing: A Philosophy of Freedom (2011), completed during the 1980s, complements Wisdom as Moderation: A Philosophy of the Middle Way (1987) and more or less rounds out the technical metaphysical work begun in Creative Synthesis.

The last of Hartshorne’s books to appear during his lifetime, The Zero Fallacy and Other Essays in Neoclassical Philosophy (1997), published in the year of his centenary, was edited by Muhammad Valady, a philosopher he met in 1985. Valady made a thorough study of Hartshorne’s works and engaged him in conversation on a regular basis over lunch. Valady compiled the essays in The Zero Fallacy to reflect the full range of Hartshorne’s thinking, including his empirical work on sensation and on bird song (approximately half the book is comprised of essays not previously published). The book opens with a “brisk dialogue” between Hartshorne and Valady that conveys both the charm of a conversation with the aging philosopher as well as the keenness of his mind in dealing with philosophy. In his twilight years, Hartshorne also contributed to four books devoted exclusively to his thought, giving detailed replies to sixty-two essays by fifty-six scholars (see secondary sources, books edited by Cobb and Gamwell, Kane and Phillips, Sia, and Hahn). His responses fill approximately one fourth of the pages in these volumes. With good reason he expressed concern that philosophers might find it difficult to stay abreast of his writing.

Hartshorne died on Yom Kippur, October 9, 2000 (incorrectly reported as October 10th by The New York Times). He was preceded in death by his wife, who passed away at the age of ninety-one on November 21, 1995.

2. The Affective Continuum and the Psychology of Sensation

Hartshorne began thinking seriously about sensation after an experience he had while serving as an orderly in France during the First World War. As he stood on a cliff looking over a scene of great natural beauty, George Santayana’s phrase “beauty is objectified pleasure” came to him. Hartshorne rejected that slogan on the basis of what he was experiencing. It seemed to him that the pleasure was not experienced in himself as a subject and only then projected onto nature; rather the pleasure was itself given as in the object. He concluded that experience, all experience, is saturated with affect, given in emotional terms. In the essay “Some Causes of My Intellectual Growth” he says, “Nature comes to us as constituted by feelings, not as constituted by mere lifeless, insentient matter.” The point is not that we never attribute more to an object than what the object contains; it is, rather, that objects are never given to us in experience as completely lacking affective tone. Hartshorne never strayed from the conviction that matter devoid of feeling is an abstraction from experience and not a datum of experience.

Hartshorne’s first published book was The Philosophy and Psychology of Sensation (1934), the result of his intense philosophical interest in aesthetic motifs proffered by Peirce and Whitehead and his longstanding interest in empirical psychological inquiries into sensation begun under Troland at Harvard. This interest in empirical inquiries continued with study of some European experimental psychologists such as Julius Pikler, whose name is sometimes paired with Hartshorne’s in the literature on sensation, as in “the Hartshorne-Pikler Hypothesis” discussed  by Lawrence E. Marks in The Unity of the Senses (New York: Academic, 1978). Hartshorne argues for a theory that, in his view, integrates themes of evolutionary biology with experimental and phenomenological data on intersensory analogies, with aesthetic and religious values, and with an overall enhancement of intelligibility or the “unity of knowledge.” The work was written when interest in sensation had dwindled under the influence of American behaviorist theory, when the odd indifference of William James to considerations of sensation was still lingering, and when psychologists were little interested in grand theoretical integrations, including integrations with evolutionary theory. The work, arguably ahead of its time, can be much better appreciated now than when it was first published.

Hartshorne’s theory is organized around the defense of five theses, to be discussed in turn below: (1) the sensory modalities exhibit quantitative continuity, exhibiting no absolute difference of kind; (2) sensory qualia are essentially affective (a theme echoed in the early Heidegger with whom Hartshorne studied); (3) all experience is analyzable as essentially social in the Whiteheadian sense of “feeling of feeling”; (4) sensation is essentially “adaptive” in the evolutionary biological sense; and, (5) sensory qualia have a common origin in evolutionary history.  The whole doctrine might be conveniently labeled as the “affective continuum hypothesis.” The third item is central to the thesis of panexperientialism, which Hartshorne defended throughout his career. In view of its importance to his metaphysics, it will require separate discussion. Here the focus will be on a brief exposition of the other mentioned theses.

First, Hartshorne rejects the “classical” doctrine of Hermann von Helmholtz that the various sensory modalities (visual, olfactory, tactile, gustatory, and auditory experiences) are tightly compartmentalized, allowing no degrees of lesser or greater similarity, and no transition from one modality to another. According to the classical doctrine, while degrees of qualitative similarity or analogy might be permissible within a given sensory modality (for example, dark magenta and royal purple are qualitatively “closer” to one another than are, say, candy red and canary yellow), no inter-modal sensory analogies are permissible such that we could intelligibly say that, for instance, certain odors are more or less similar to certain colors. Moreover, the classical theory of sensation held that sensations are not inherently emotional or affective in character; any affective properties found to be associated with sensations are culturally conditioned “additions” to the sensations; in effect, sensations are essentially pure “registrations” of cognitive data. For classical theory, emotions and sensations are entirely separate functions of consciousness. To the contrary, Hartshorne argues that the classical theory does not fit the phenomenological and empirical evidence, is out of touch with the intersensory analogies provided in all manner of ordinary language metaphors, and does not cohere with the concept of an evolutionary history of sensory systems.

While experimentation on intersensory phenomena is a complex affair and interpretation of some results is disputable, it is fair to say that a body of evidence has emerged which bodes well for the thesis of intersensory connection. Indeed, it is now a commonplace of contemporary psychology texts to discuss evidence for intersensory analogies, for instance, the establishment of connections between visual and auditory neural systems as well as evidence of visual-auditory correlations in the cognitive development of infants. It is also particularly telling that neuroscientists have developed sensory substitution systems that can allow the blind to construct images, objects, and words from tactile stimulation. Moreover, Hartshorne points to abundant metaphors of common parlance which make intersensory connections: some colors are said to be “warm” or “loud,” some sounds are said to be “sweet” or “sour,” some affective states or moods are said to be “blue” or “dark,” or some smells are said to be “delicious” or “distasteful.” The practice of employing intersensory metaphors occurs widely across cultures and is broadly communicative or publically accessible, pointing (at the very least) to the possibility of intersensory continuity and to an underlying objective affect-quality in sensation, thus grounding the communicability of the intersensory metaphors. If the sensory modes are as rigidly separated and analogical connection is as unintelligible as classical theory maintains, it is difficult to explain that language is so saturated with intersensory metaphors. Hartshorne does not deny that there are strong qualitative differences between the qualia of various sensory modes (indeed his theory posits qualitative difference in terms of a geometric notion of “distance on a continuum”), nor does he deny that cultural conditioning can play an important role in constructing affective associations with sensations. Rather, his theory rejects the rigid discontinuity of the sensory modes and the separation of sensation from affectivity.

While Hartshorne is cognizant of cultural conditioning of sensory experience, he argues that such conditioning can be shown to presuppose an underlying affect in the “conditioned” sensation. Consider a locus classicus case of culturally constructed associations of affectivity in classical theory: the preference for white dress in traditional Chinese funerals as opposed to black or dark dress in traditional Spanish or Italian funerals is said to show that there are fundamentally different emotional qualities attached to white in Chinese as opposed to European cultures. Hartshorne argues that this misconstrues the situation. The cultural difference is found in different attitudes toward death and funeral rites, not in different feelings concerning the colors white or black (the Chinese think of funerals as positive celebrations of past life). Hartshorne also applies this reasoning to variations in individual sensory-qualitative preferences. In Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method, he remarks on how the fact that some persons prefer a certain bitter quality of strong dark chocolate does not show that such individuals “fail to sense the contrast, sweet-bitter, as essentially positive-negative.” It means rather that they do not want mere sweetness or pleasantness; they want a more complex sensory experience. Hartshorne’s point is that an adequate phenomenology of sensation must include the appropriate “layered” complexity of sensory experience and thus accommodate the fact that we have meta-feelings (“feelings about our sensory feelings”) in addition to “object-feelings” (feelings about things that are not feelings, like chocolate).  It is the duality of this, so to speak, “meta-feeling/object-feeling” situation which is the source of the distinction (which Hartshorne calls a “pseudo-duality”) of affect and mere sensation posited by the classical theory of sensation.

In addition, it is not clear how the classical view can be squared with the evolutionary development of sensory modes. If the sensory modes are as separate as classical theory supposes, then how could new sensory modes which evolve have meaningful connections to older modes? Were the transitions from one mode to another simply de novo additions abruptly occurring all-at-once, contrary to standard neo-Darwinian assumptions of gradualism? If one sensory mode evolved from another, then how could it be impossible for the new sensory mode to have analogical connections with its modal parent? How could information from the different sensory modes be coordinated during early moments of evolutionary transition if there is no meaningful analogical connection between them? Would not an organism that possessed the capacity to integrate information from different sensory modes be better adapted to its environment? Hartshorne’s theory, on the other hand, supposes that sensory modes are intrinsically connected by their common evolutionary origins (with tactile capacities as the earliest), that sensation is a form of affectivity that serves the purpose of enhancing the prospects of an organism’s survival, and that this underlying physiological connection of sensation and affectivity is what is primal—it is the “object-feeling” pole of the “meta-feeling/object-feeling” duality found in our complex emotional life.

The affective properties of sensation are most immediately evident in the case of pain; indeed, intense sensations of pain are ineluctably described in strongly affective terms such as “horrific” or “torturous” or “excruciating.” While there may be cases in which, paradoxically, pain is experienced as pleasure, such cases by definition posit a hedonic property to the experience inimical to the notion of a thoroughly “disinterested” pain. The affective aversion that is part and parcel of the experience of pain also clearly coheres with the biological or adaptive value of affectivity that Hartshorne’s theory asserts. Organisms that are not warned of injury by virtue of pain, and that do not seek to avoid such injury by virtue of visceral, emotional aversion to pain, are insofar vulnerable to their environments. Other tactile qualia such as sensual touch are obviously inseparable from hedonic content. Gustatory qualia are also affective as enjoyment of delicious foods and strong aversion to extremely sour or spoiled foods attest. New born infants react with aversion to sour, bitter, or fetid substances, and so it is difficult to “argue away” gustatory affect as culturally conditioned. Here again, there are obvious biological or adaptive advantages for organisms capable of being affectively reinforced by and motivated to seek nutritious foods and avoid fetid substances or spoilage. Sounds, especially in the form of music, are readily seen to evoke emotions in immediate ways. Minor chords, for instance, have an immediate “sad” or “melancholy” tonality which explains their use in ballads evocative of such moods.

Hartshorne understood that the more difficult case for his theory is visual phenomena. For this reason, he discusses at length the affective nature of visual experience with a particular emphasis on color sensation. Careful attention to our experience of color reveals that strong primary colors exhibit affective qualities, as in the paradigm cases that “gaiety” is part and parcel of yellow and “warmth” of red. While Hartshorne admits that there seem to be dull color sensations to which we may seem affectively indifferent, that such sensations possess some slight degree of affect could be shown by imagining blindness with respect to such colors; in addition, such colors have a valuable contextual role to play in providing certain nuances of contrast. In his treatment of Hartshorne’s theory in the Library of Living Philosophers (LLP), psychologist Wayne Viney notes that some previously blind persons who are successfully re-sighted attach much significance even to the visually trivial. Importantly, Hartshorne argues that without such an affective account of color, it is extremely difficult to give a coherent account of the visual arts. If affective qualia are always merely accidently “associated” with color by virtue of idiosyncrasies of personal experience, how could artists communicate or express intelligibly? For instance, the dulled grayish-brownish tones of an Edward Hopper painting convey the depressive atmosphere of life during the Great Depression far better than would the alternative use of bright yellows or Kelly greens or Titian reds. Indeed, certain projects of modern art, such as found in the work of Kandinksy, depend on the notion that color expression can in and by itself evoke emotion without mediation through well-defined objects, whether in surreal juxtaposition or otherwise.

Adaptive values for color sensation are not difficult to conceive. The greater discriminatory information provided by color sensation at least enhances, say, human abilities to demarcate and map out their immediate environments. Moreover, at least one affective property of color can be correlated with experimental neuro-physical evidence; the inherent “aggressiveness” of red correlates with the empirically discerned increase in cortical stimulation when compared to exposure to blue. While this may be explained by cultural conditioning (for example, our learned response to red stop signs), such an explanation may also beg the question as to why red is so often selected as a color of warning. On Hartshorne’s theory, the selection of red occurs precisely because it has the stimulating or aggressive affect it does. In general, Hartshorne sides with Julius Pikler in connecting all affectivity of sensation at its most fundamental level with excitations to act or with behavioral avoidances, and these in turn have an evolutionary “cash value” or utility. Nonetheless, empirical study of the affectivity of color sensation is by no means settled, and results are unclear, for one reason because it is difficult to separate out learned from universal emotional responses to color. Hartshorne’s theory, however, points in the direction of an overall evolutionary account of sensation. Even if Hartshorne has some of the details mishandled, the general thesis of color affect brings color vision in line with other sense modalities and best explains why it was strongly “naturally selected.”

3. Conclusion: Hartshorne’s Work on Sensation and the Rest of his Philosophy

Hartshorne’s first book could be seen, in one respect, as a systematic attack against the form of materialism that finds inspiration in the theory of sense data. From the times of John Locke and David Hume, some empirically minded philosophers and psychologists analyzed experience in terms of “sensory impressions.” Emotions were conceived as annexed onto bare impressions; Hartshorne characterizes this as “the annex view of value.” As already noted, this view of emotion is at odds with evolutionary thinking since a sensation-minus-affect would be lacking in adaptive value. Equally, it is not clearly a deliverance of experience. The analysis of experience into sensory impressions is, Hartshorne held, bad phenomenology; it is an intellectualized reconstruction of experience. The mistake was, in part, due to the excessive attention paid to visual experience, which as we have noted, is where affect is least apparent. Visual experience exhibits less felt relevance of the body than one finds in the other sensory modalities. This may account for the prevalence of visual metaphors for a supposedly immaterial process of intellection. It is easier to forget that one sees with the eyes than it is to forget, for example, that one touches with the skin.

In light of Hartshorne’s conviction concerning the data of experience, it is not difficult to understand why he resonated to the expression “feeling of feeling,” an idea (if not the exact wording) that he found in Chapter X (section II) of Whitehead’s Process and Reality. The clearest instance of a feeling of feeling, for both Whitehead and Hartshorne, is memory, for it is at a minimum the record of a past experience in a present experience. The example of memory also supports Hartshorne’s contention that, while every sensation is a feeling, not every feeling is a sensation. Hartshorne would later refer to the difference between introspection and perception as the difference between personal and impersonal memory.

When Hartshorne came to the business of ontology, he could find nothing more consonant with his psychology of sensation, nothing more in keeping with evolutionary thinking, and nothing more coherent philosophically than panexperientialism, the view that the basic constituents of reality are momentary flashes of experience. Whitehead called these "actual entities" or "actual occasions"; Hartshorne sometimes called them dynamic singulars.  Panexperientialism implies that there must be non-human and non-conscious forms of experience. Leibniz had argued this case before evolutionary theory, but evolution made the case even more convincing. Humans are different from the creatures from which they evolved by matters of degree. Mind-like qualities, Hartshorne argued, are susceptible to an infinitely flexible number of forms. Hartshorne and Whitehead held that every concrete particular is an experient occasion; they did not, however, believe that every whole made of such occasions can be said, as a whole, to feel the world. Whitehead spoke of a tree as a democracy, the cells making up its members—there can be cellular feelings even if the tree as a whole does not feel. Hartshorne used the analogy of a flock of birds: there are feelings in each bird, but the flock itself does not feel.

If Hartshorne followed Whitehead on the ontology of actual occasions, he parted ways with him on how best to construe the nature of possibility. Whitehead took possibility to be grounded in an array of eternal objects, including particular sensory qualities, constituting an ideal world. As is evident in his first book, Hartshorne preferred to think of sensory qualities as existing along an affective continuum. Whitehead, it seems, was not dogmatic in rejecting this view. Hartshorne reports that he presented Whitehead with the following reasoning: if points are constructed from the extensive continuum and not vice versa, as Whitehead held, perhaps, by parity of reasoning, particular sensory qualities are extracted from an affective continuum and not vice versa. According to Hartshorne, Whitehead called the argument “subtle” requiring “further reflection.” It is also worth remarking that Hartshorne’s view is more radically processive than Whitehead’s since it implies that sensory qualities are emergent as the affective continuum is sliced in various ways through the evolutionary process within and between species.

Hartshorne’s theory of the affective continuum is very much in keeping with his aesthetics and with his theory of a monotony threshold in song birds. Hartshorne’s aesthetics locates beauty—which could also be called intense satisfactory experience—as a mean between two extremes: absolute order vs. absolute disorder and ultra complexity vs. ultra triviality. Aesthetic experience, like all sensory experience, must have, on Hartshorne’s account, both a subjective and an objective side. In a word, Hartshorne denies that the quality of beauty is “merely in the eye of the beholder,” or to generalize, “merely in the perception of the perceiver.” Hartshorne’s study of bird song convinced him that oscines have a primitive aesthetic sense. He found evidence that birds with more varied repertoires have shorter pauses between their songs than do birds with less varied repertoires. In a word, simpler repertoires invoke more boredom whereas varied repertoires are more interesting—hence, a “monotony threshold.” Hartshorne meant his theory to supplement, not to replace, standard accounts of bird song as the marking of territory. His view of the aesthetics of bird song coheres nicely with his evolutionary view of sensation and affective tone.

Hartshorne’s emphases on the primacy of feeling in perception and of aesthetic experience are also evident in his form of theism. God, he held, has the eminent form of “feeling of the feelings” of others. In the first instance, this means that God’s knowledge is suffused with affect and is not simply an intellectual awareness of the world, for example, a knowing of the truth value of propositions. According to Hartshorne, divine cognition is a form of what William James called “knowledge of acquaintance” rather than simply a “knowledge-about.” This idea yields a view of omniscience that is decidedly more intimate than one that is couched in terms of the metaphor of an “all-seeing” deity. Since, for Hartshorne, the relation of “feeling of feelings” has a temporal structure, every instance of awareness in the present must be nothing other than an awareness of the past. It stands to reason that, if God is the eminent embodiment of “feeling of feelings,” God must also have the eminent form of memory. This is indeed Hartshorne’s view, which he calls “contributionism.” Every experience of a non-divine being is felt and retained in perfect memory by God, thereby contributing to the richness of the divine immortal life. In Hartshorne’s words, God’s possession of us, not our possession of God, is our final achievement.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

i. Life

  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1970. “The Development of My Philosophy.” Contemporary American Philosophy: Second Series, ed. John E. Smith. London: Allen & Unwin, 1970: 211-28.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1970. “Charles Hartshorne’s Recollections of Editing the Peirce Papers.” Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society 6, 3-4: 149-59.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1973. “Pensées sur ma vie”: 26-32; “Thoughts on my Life”: 60-66. Bilingual Journal, Lecomte du Noüy Association, 5 (Fall)
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1984. “How I Got that Way.” Existence and Actuality: Conversations with Charles Hartshorne. John B. Jr. and Franklin L Gamwell, eds. Chicago: University of Chicago Press: ix-xvii.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1990. The Darkness and the Light: A Philosopher Reflects Upon His Fortunate Career and Those Who Made it Possible. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1991. “Some Causes of My Intellectual Growth.” The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XX. Lewis Edwin Hahn, ed. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court: 3-45.

ii. Psychology of Sensation

  • Hartshorne, Charles.1927. Review of A.N. Whitehead. Symbolism, Its Meaning and Effect (New York: Macmillan, 1927). Hound and Horn 1: 148-52.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1931. “Sense Quality and Feeling Tone.” Proceedings of the Seventh International Congress of Philosophy. Gilbert Ryle, ed. London: Oxford UP: 168-72.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1934. The Philosophy and Psychology of Sensation. University of Chicago Press. Republished in 1968 by Kennikat Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1934. “The Intelligibility of Sensations.” The Monist 44, 2: 161-85.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1961. “Professor Hall on Perception.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 21, 4: 563-71.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1963. “Sensation in Psychology and Philosophy.” Southern Journal of Philosophy 1, 2: 3-14.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1965. “The Social Theory of Feelings.” Southern Journal of Philosophy 3, 2: 87-93. Reprinted in Persons, Privacy, and Feeling: Essays in the Philosophy of Mind, ed. Dwight Van de Vate, Jr. Memphis: Memphis State UP, 1970: 39-51.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1967. “Psychology and the Unity of Knowledge.” Southern Journal of Philosophy 5, 2: 81-90.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1970. Creative Synthesis and Philosophic Method. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1973. Born to Sing: An Interpretation and World Survey of Bird Song. Bloomington, Indiana University of Indiana Press.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 1984. “Response to George Wolf.” Existence and Actuality: Conversations with Charles Hartshorne. John B. Jr. and Franklin L Gamwell, eds. Chicago: University of Chicago Press: 184-188.
  • Hartshorne, Charles. 2001. Notes on A. N. Whitehead’s Harvard Lectures 1925-26, transcribed by Roland Faber. Process Studies 30/2: 301-373.

b. Secondary Sources

i. Life

  • Peters, Eugene H. 1970. Hartshorne and Neoclassical Metaphysics. Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press: 1-14.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2003. “Charles Hartshorne.” American Philosophers Before 1950. In Dictionary of Literary Biography, volume 270, edited by Philip B. Dematteis and Leemon B. McHenry. Detroit: Thomson Gale, 2003: 129-51.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2004. “Charles Hartshorne.” Dictionary of Unitarian Universalist Biography, 1999-2004. On-line at: charleshartshorne.html
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2005. “Hartshorne, Charles (1897-2000)” The Dictionary of Modern American Philosophers, edited by John R. Shook (London: Thoemmes Press): 1056-62.
  • Viney, Donald Wayne. 2008. “Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000),” Handbook of Whiteheadian Process Thought, Volume 2, edited by Michel Weber and Will Desmond. (Frankfurt / Paris / Lancaster: Ontos Verlag): 589-596.

ii. Psychology of Sensation

  • Anon. 1985. Report on Hartshorne’s “My Enthusiastic but Partial Agreement with Whitehead,” presented at the eleventh Congreso Ineramericasno de Filosifia, Guadalajara, Mexico, Nov. 15, 1985, Center for Process Studies Newsletter, 9, 4, 7.
  • Dombrowski, Daniel. 2004. Divine Beauty: The Aesthetics of Charles Hartshorne. Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press.
  • Hospers, John. 1991. “Hartshorne’s Aesthetics.” The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XX. Lewis Edwin Hahn, ed. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court: 113-134.
  • Viney, Wayne. 1991. “Charles Hartshorne’s Philosophy and Psychology of Sensation.” The Philosophy of Charles Hartshorne, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XX. Lewis Edwin Hahn, ed. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court: 91-112.

c. Bibliography

“Primary Bibliography of Philosophical Works of Charles Hartshorne” (compiled by Dorothy Hartshorne; corrected, revised, and updated by Donald Wayne Viney and Randy Ramal) in Herbert F. Vetter, editor, Hartshorne: A New World View: Essays by Charles Hartshorne (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard Square Library, 2007): 129-160. Also published in Santiago Sia, Religion, Reason and God (Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang, 2004): 195-223.


Author Information

Donald Wayne Viney
Pittsburg State University
U. S. A.


George W. Shields
Kentucky State University
U. S. A.