German philosopher, born at Berlin Feb. 23, 1842, died at the same place June 5, 1906. He was educated at the school of artillery in Berlin (1859-1862); and held a commission (1860-65), when he was compelled to retire on account of serious knee trouble. He took his degree at Rostock in 1867, returned to Berlin, and retired to Lichterfelde (5 m. s.w. of Berlin) in 1885, doing most of his work in bed while suffering great pain. After developing the thought for twenty-two years, he began in 1864 to prepare his main philosophical work, Philosophie des Unbewussten (Berlin, 1869; llth ed., 3 vols., 1904). Next in rank was his Das sittliche Bewusstsein, appearing first as Phenomenologie des sittlichen Bewusstseins (Berlin, 1879); and next to that was the Religionsphilosophie (2 vols., Das religiose Bewusstein der Menschheit and Die Religion des Geistes, 1882).
The object of his philosophy was to unite the “idea” of Hegel with the “will” of Schopenhauer in his doctrine of the Absolute Spirit, or, as he preferred to characterize it, spiritual monism. He held that ” a will which does not will something is not.” The world was produced by will and idea, but not as conscious; for consciousness, instead of being essential, is accidental to will and idea-the two poles of ” the Unconscious.” Matter is both idea and will. In organic existences, in instinct, in the human mind, on the field of history, the unconscious will acts as though it possessed consciousness, that is, as though it were aware of the ends and of the infallible means for their realization. Consciousness arises from the active will and the will’s opposition to this condition. Because of the wisdom displayed in the action of the Unconscious, this is the best possible world; only this does not prove that the world is good, or that the world would not be better, the latter of which is true. Human life labors under three illusions: (1) that happiness is possible in this life, which came to an end with the Roman Empire; (2) that life will be crowned with happiness in another world, which science is rapidly dissipating; (3) that happy social well-being, although postponed, can at last be realized on earth, a dream which will also ultimately be dissolved. Man’s only hope lies in “final redemption from the misery of volition and existence into the painlessness of non-being and non-willing.” No mortal may quit the task of life, but each must do his part to hasten the time when in the major portion of the human race the activity of the Unconscious shall be ruled by intelligence, and this stage reached, in the simultaneous action of many persons volition will resolve upon its own non-continuance, and thus idea and will be once more reunited in the Absolute.
Last updated: April 16, 2001 | Originally published: April/16/2001
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