The term “hedonism,” from the Greek word ἡδονή (hēdonē) for pleasure, refers to several related theories about what is good for us, how we should behave, and what motivates us to behave in the way that we do. All hedonistic theories identify pleasure and pain as the only important elements of whatever phenomena they are designed to describe. If hedonistic theories identified pleasure and pain as merely two important elements, instead of the only important elements of what they are describing, then they would not be nearly as unpopular as they all are. However, the claim that pleasure and pain are the only things of ultimate importance is what makes hedonism distinctive and philosophically interesting.
Philosophical hedonists tend to focus on hedonistic theories of value, and especially of well-being (the good life for the one living it). As a theory of value, hedonism states that all and only pleasure is intrinsically valuable and all and only pain is intrinsically not valuable. Hedonists usually define pleasure and pain broadly, such that both physical and mental phenomena are included. Thus, a gentle massage and recalling a fond memory are both considered to cause pleasure and stubbing a toe and hearing about the death of a loved one are both considered to cause pain. With pleasure and pain so defined, hedonism as a theory about what is valuable for us is intuitively appealing. Indeed, its appeal is evidenced by the fact that nearly all historical and contemporary treatments of well-being allocate at least some space for discussion of hedonism. Unfortunately for hedonism, the discussions rarely endorse it and some even deplore its focus on pleasure.
This article begins by clarifying the different types of hedonistic theories and the labels they are often given. Then, hedonism’s ancient origins and its subsequent development are reviewed. The majority of this article is concerned with describing the important theoretical divisions within Prudential Hedonism and discussing the major criticisms of these approaches.
When the term “hedonism” is used in modern literature, or by non-philosophers in their everyday talk, its meaning is quite different from the meaning it takes when used in the discussions of philosophers. Non-philosophers tend to think of a hedonist as a person who seeks out pleasure for themselves without any particular regard for their own future well-being or for the well-being of others. According to non-philosophers, then, a stereotypical hedonist is someone who never misses an opportunity to indulge of the pleasures of sex, drugs, and rock ‘n’ roll, even if the indulgences are likely to lead to relationship problems, health problems, regrets, or sadness for themselves or others. Philosophers commonly refer to this everyday understanding of hedonism as “Folk Hedonism.” Folk Hedonism is a rough combination of Motivational Hedonism, Hedonistic Egoism, and a reckless lack of foresight.
When philosophers discuss hedonism, they are most likely to be referring to hedonism about value, and especially the slightly more specific theory, hedonism about well-being. Hedonism as a theory about value (best referred to as Value Hedonism) holds that all and only pleasure is intrinsically valuable and all and only pain is intrinsically disvaluable. The term “intrinsically” is an important part of the definition and is best understood in contrast to the term “instrumentally.” Something is intrinsically valuable if it is valuable for its own sake. Pleasure is thought to be intrinsically valuable because, even if it did not lead to any other benefit, it would still be good to experience. Money is an example of an instrumental good; its value for us comes from what we can do with it (what we can buy with it). The fact that a copious amount of money has no value if no one ever sells anything reveals that money lacks intrinsic value. Value Hedonism reduces everything of value to pleasure. For example, a Value Hedonist would explain the instrumental value of money by describing how the things we can buy with money, such as food, shelter, and status-signifying goods, bring us pleasure or help us to avoid pain.
Hedonism as a theory about well-being (best referred to as Prudential Hedonism) is more specific than Value Hedonism because it stipulates what the value is for. Prudential Hedonism holds that all and only pleasure intrinsically makes people’s lives go better for them and all and only pain intrinsically makes their lives go worse for them. Some philosophers replace “people” with “animals” or “sentient creatures,” so as to apply Prudential Hedonism more widely. A good example of this comes from Peter Singer’s work on animals and ethics. Singer questions why some humans can see the intrinsic disvalue in human pain, but do not also accept that it is bad for sentient non-human animals to experience pain.
When Prudential Hedonists claim that happiness is what they value most, they intend happiness to be understood as a preponderance of pleasure over pain. An important distinction between Prudential Hedonism and Folk Hedonism is that Prudential Hedonists usually understand that pursuing pleasure and avoiding pain in the very short-term is not always the best strategy for achieving the best long-term balance of pleasure over pain.
Prudential Hedonism is an integral part of several derivative types of hedonistic theory, all of which have featured prominently in philosophical debates of the past. Since Prudential Hedonism plays this important role, the majority of this article is dedicated to Prudential Hedonism. First, however, the main derivative types of hedonism are briefly discussed.
Motivational Hedonism (more commonly referred to by the less descriptive label, “Psychological Hedonism“) is the theory that the desires to encounter pleasure and to avoid pain guide all of our behavior. Most accounts of Motivational Hedonism include both conscious and unconscious desires for pleasure, but emphasize the latter. Epicurus, William James, Sigmund Freud, Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill, and (on one interpretation) even Charles Darwin have all argued for varieties of Motivational Hedonism. Bentham used the idea to support his theory of Hedonistic Utilitarianism (discussed below). Weak versions of Motivational Hedonism hold that the desires to seek pleasure and avoid pain often or always have some influence on our behavior. Weak versions are generally considered to be uncontroversially true and not especially useful for philosophy.
Philosophers have been more interested in strong accounts of Motivational Hedonism, which hold that all behavior is governed by the desires to encounter pleasure and to avoid pain (and only those desires). Strong accounts of Motivational Hedonism have been used to support some of the normative types of hedonism and to argue against non-hedonistic normative theories. One of the most notable mentions of Motivational Hedonism is Plato’s Ring of Gyges example in The Republic. Plato’s Socrates is discussing with Glaucon how men would react if they were to possess a ring that gives its wearer immense powers, including invisibility. Glaucon believes that a strong version of Motivational Hedonism is true, but Socrates does not. Glaucon asserts that, emboldened with the power provided by the Ring of Gyges, everyone would succumb to the inherent and ubiquitous desire to pursue their own ends at the expense of others. Socrates disagrees, arguing that good people would be able to overcome this desire because of their strong love of justice, fostered through philosophising.
Strong accounts of Motivational Hedonism currently garner very little support for similar reasons. Many examples of seemingly-pain-seeking acts performed out of a sense of duty are well-known – from the soldier who jumps on a grenade to save his comrades to that time you rescued a trapped dog only to be (predictably) bitten in the process. Introspective evidence also weighs against strong accounts of Motivational Hedonism; many of the decisions we make seem to be based on motives other than seeking pleasure and avoiding pain. Given these reasons, the burden of proof is considered to be squarely on the shoulders of anyone wishing to argue for a strong account of Motivational Hedonism.
Value Hedonism, occasionally with assistance from Motivational Hedonism, has been used to argue for specific theories of right action (theories that explain which actions are morally permissible or impermissible and why). The theory that happiness should be pursued (that pleasure should be pursued and pain should be avoided) is referred to as Normative Hedonism and sometimes Ethical Hedonism. There are two major types of Normative Hedonism, Hedonistic Egoism and Hedonistic Utilitarianism. Both types commonly use happiness (defined as pleasure minus pain) as the sole criterion for determining the moral rightness or wrongness of an action. Important variations within each of these two main types specify either the actual resulting happiness (after the act) or the predicted resulting happiness (before the act) as the moral criterion. Although both major types of Normative Hedonism have been accused of being repugnant, Hedonistic Egoism is considered the most offensive.
Hedonistic Egoism is a hedonistic version of egoism, the theory that we should, morally speaking, do whatever is most in our own interests. Hedonistic Egoism is the theory that we ought, morally speaking, to do whatever makes us happiest – that is whatever provides us with the most net pleasure after pain is subtracted. The most repugnant feature of this theory is that one never has to ascribe any value whatsoever to the consequences for anyone other than oneself. For example, a Hedonistic Egoist who did not feel saddened by theft would be morally required to steal, even from needy orphans (if he thought he could get away with it). Would-be defenders of Hedonistic Egoism often point out that performing acts of theft, murder, treachery and the like would not make them happier overall because of the guilt, the fear of being caught, and the chance of being caught and punished. The would-be defenders tend to surrender, however, when it is pointed out that a Hedonistic Egoist is morally obliged by their own theory to pursue an unusual kind of practical education; a brief and possibly painful training period that reduces their moral emotions of sympathy and guilt. Such an education might be achieved by desensitising over-exposure to, and performance of, torture on innocents. If Hedonistic Egoists underwent such an education, their reduced capacity for sympathy and guilt would allow them to take advantage of any opportunities to perform pleasurable, but normally-guilt-inducing, actions, such as stealing from the poor.
Hedonistic Egoism is very unpopular amongst philosophers, not just for this reason, but also because it suffers from all of the objections that apply to Prudential Hedonism.
Hedonistic Utilitarianism is the theory that the right action is the one that produces (or is most likely to produce) the greatest net happiness for all concerned. Hedonistic Utilitarianism is often considered fairer than Hedonistic Egoism because the happiness of everyone involved (everyone who is affected or likely to be affected) is taken into account and given equal weight. Hedonistic Utilitarians, then, tend to advocate not stealing from needy orphans because to do so would usually leave the orphan far less happy and the (probably better-off) thief only slightly happier (assuming he felt no guilt). Despite treating all individuals equally, Hedonistic Utilitarianism is still seen as objectionable by some because it assigns no intrinsic moral value to justice, friendship, truth, or any of the many other goods that are thought by some to be irreducibly valuable. For example, a Hedonistic Utilitarian would be morally obliged to publicly execute an innocent friend of theirs if doing so was the only way to promote the greatest happiness overall. Although unlikely, such a situation might arise if a child was murdered in a small town and the lack of suspects was causing large-scale inter-ethnic violence. Some philosophers argue that executing an innocent friend is immoral precisely because it ignores the intrinsic values of justice, friendship, and possibly truth.
Hedonistic Utilitarianism is rarely endorsed by philosophers, but mainly because of its reliance on Prudential Hedonism as opposed to its utilitarian element. Non-hedonistic versions of utilitarianism are about as popular as the other leading theories of right action, especially when it is the actions of institutions that are being considered.
Perhaps the earliest written record of hedonism comes from the Cārvāka, an Indian philosophical tradition based on the Barhaspatya sutras. The Cārvāka persisted for two thousand years (from about 600 B.C.E.). Most notably, the Cārvāka advocated scepticism and Hedonistic Egoism – that the right action is the one that brings the actor the most net pleasure. The Cārvāka acknowledged that some pain often accompanied, or was later caused by, sensual pleasure, but that pleasure was worth it.
The Cyrenaics, founded by Aristippus (c. 435-356 B.C.E.), were also sceptics and Hedonistic Egoists. Although the paucity of original texts makes it difficult to confidently state all of the justifications for the Cyrenaics’ positions, their overall stance is clear enough. The Cyrenaics believed pleasure was the ultimate good and everyone should pursue all immediate pleasures for themselves. They considered bodily pleasures better than mental pleasures, presumably because they were more vivid or trustworthy. The Cyrenaics also recommended pursuing immediate pleasures and avoiding immediate pains with scant or no regard for future consequences. Their reasoning for this is even less clear, but is most plausibly linked to their sceptical views – perhaps that what we can be most sure of in this uncertain existence is our current bodily pleasures.
Epicurus (c. 341-271 B.C.E.), founder of Epicureanism, developed a Normative Hedonism in stark contrast to that of Aristippus. The Epicureanism of Epicurus is also quite the opposite to the common usage of Epicureanism; while we might like to go on a luxurious “Epicurean” holiday packed with fine dining and moderately excessive wining, Epicurus would warn us that we are only setting ourselves up for future pain. For Epicurus, happiness was the complete absence of bodily and especially mental pains, including fear of the Gods and desires for anything other than the bare necessities of life. Even with only the limited excesses of ancient Greece on offer, Epicurus advised his followers to avoid towns, and especially marketplaces, in order to limit the resulting desires for unnecessary things. Once we experience unnecessary pleasures, such as those from sex and rich food, we will then suffer from painful and hard to satisfy desires for more and better of the same. No matter how wealthy we might be, Epicurus would argue, our desires will eventually outstrip our means and interfere with our ability to live tranquil, happy lives. Epicureanism is generally egoistic, in that it encourages everyone to pursue happiness for themselves. However, Epicureans would be unlikely to commit any of the selfish acts we might expect from other egoists because Epicureans train themselves to desire only the very basics, which gives them very little reason to do anything to interfere with the affairs of others.
With the exception of a brief period discussed below, Hedonism has been generally unpopular ever since its ancient beginnings. Although criticisms of the ancient forms of hedonism were many and varied, one in particular was heavily cited. In Philebus, Plato’s Socrates and one of his many foils, Protarchus in this instance, are discussing the role of pleasure in the good life. Socrates asks Protarchus to imagine a life without much pleasure but full of the higher cognitive processes, such as knowledge, forethought and consciousness and to compare it with a life that is the opposite. Socrates describes this opposite life as having perfect pleasure but the mental life of an oyster, pointing out that the subject of such a life would not be able to appreciate any of the pleasure within it. The harrowing thought of living the pleasurable but unthinking life of an oyster causes Protarchus to abandon his hedonistic argument. The oyster example is now easily avoided by clarifying that pleasure is best understood as being a conscious experience, so any sensation that we are not consciously aware of cannot be pleasure.
Normative and Motivational Hedonism were both at their most popular during the heyday of Empiricism in the 18th and 19th Centuries. Indeed, this is the only period during which any kind of hedonism could be considered popular at all. During this period, two Hedonistic Utilitarians, Jeremy Bentham (1748-1832) and his protégé John Stuart Mill (1806-1873), were particularly influential. Their theories are similar in many ways, but are notably distinct on the nature of pleasure.
Bentham argued for several types of hedonism, including those now referred to as Prudential Hedonism, Hedonistic Utilitarianism, and Motivational Hedonism (although his commitment to strong Motivational Hedonism eventually began to wane). Bentham argued that happiness was the ultimate good and that happiness was pleasure and the absence of pain. He acknowledged the egoistic and hedonistic nature of peoples’ motivation, but argued that the maximization of collective happiness was the correct criterion for moral behavior. Bentham’s greatest happiness principle states that actions are immoral if they are not the action that appears to maximise the happiness of all the people likely to be affected; only the action that appears to maximise the happiness of all the people likely to be affected is the morally right action.
Bentham devised the greatest happiness principle to justify the legal reforms he also argued for. He understood that he could not conclusively prove that the principle was the correct criterion for morally right action, but also thought that it should be accepted because it was fair and better than existing criteria for evaluating actions and legislation. Bentham thought that his Hedonic Calculus could be applied to situations to see what should, morally speaking, be done in a situation. The Hedonic Calculus is a method of counting the amount of pleasure and pain that would likely be caused by different actions. The Hedonic Calculus required a methodology for measuring pleasure, which in turn required an understanding of the nature of pleasure and specifically what aspects of pleasure were valuable for us.
Bentham’s Hedonic Calculus identifies several aspects of pleasure that contribute to its value, including certainty, propinquity, extent, intensity, and duration. The Hedonic Calculus also makes use of two future-pleasure-or-pain-related aspects of actions – fecundity and purity. Certainty refers to the likelihood that the pleasure or pain will occur. Propinquity refers to how long away (in terms of time) the pleasure or pain is. Fecundity refers to the likelihood of the pleasure or pain leading to more of the same sensation. Purity refers to the likelihood of the pleasure or pain leading to some of the opposite sensation. Extent refers to the number of people the pleasure or pain is likely to affect. Intensity refers to the felt strength of the pleasure or pain. Duration refers to how long the pleasure or pain are felt for. It should be noted that only intensity and duration have intrinsic value for an individual. Certainty, propinquity, fecundity, and purity are all instrumentally valuable for an individual because they affect the likelihood of an individual feeling future pleasure and pain. Extent is not directly valuable for an individual’s well-being because it refers to the likelihood of other people experiencing pleasure or pain.
Bentham’s inclusion of certainty, propinquity, fecundity, and purity in the Hedonic Calculus helps to differentiate his hedonism from Folk Hedonism. Folk Hedonists rarely consider how likely their actions are to lead to future pleasure or pain, focussing instead on the pursuit of immediate pleasure and the avoidance of immediate pain. So while Folk Hedonists would be unlikely to study for an exam, anyone using Bentham’s Hedonic Calculus would consider the future happiness benefits to themselves (and possibly others) of passing the exam and then promptly begin studying.
Most importantly for Bentham’s Hedonic Calculus, the pleasure from different sources is always measured against these criteria in the same way, that is to say that no additional value is afforded to pleasures from particularly moral, clean, or culturally-sophisticated sources. For example, Bentham held that pleasure from the parlor game push-pin was just as valuable for us as pleasure from music and poetry. Since Bentham’s theory of Prudential Hedonism focuses on the quantity of the pleasure, rather than the source-derived quality of it, it is best described as a type of Quantitative Hedonism.
Bentham’s indifferent stance on the source of pleasures led to others disparaging his hedonism as the philosophy of swine. Even his student, John Stuart Mill, questioned whether we should believe that a satisfied pig leads a better life than a dissatisfied human or that a satisfied fool leads a better life than a dissatisfied Socrates – results that Bentham’s Quantitative Hedonism seems to endorse.
Like Bentham, Mill endorsed the varieties of hedonism now referred to as Prudential Hedonism, Hedonistic Utilitarianism, and Motivational Hedonism. Mill also thought happiness, defined as pleasure and the avoidance of pain, was the highest good. Where Mill’s hedonism differs from Bentham’s is in his understanding of the nature of pleasure. Mill argued that pleasures could vary in quality, being either higher or lower pleasures. Mill employed the distinction between higher and lower pleasures in an attempt to avoid the criticism that his hedonism was just another philosophy of swine. Lower pleasures are those associated with the body, which we share with other animals, such as pleasure from quenching thirst or having sex. Higher pleasures are those associated with the mind, which were thought to be unique to humans, such as pleasure from listening to opera, acting virtuously, and philosophising. Mill justified this distinction by arguing that those who have experienced both types of pleasure realise that higher pleasures are much more valuable. He dismissed challenges to this claim by asserting that those who disagreed lacked either the experience of higher pleasures or the capacity for such experiences. For Mill, higher pleasures were not different from lower pleasures by mere degree; they were different in kind. Since Mill’s theory of Prudential Hedonism focuses on the quality of the pleasure, rather than the amount of it, it is best described as a type of Qualitative Hedonism.
George Edward Moore (1873-1958) was instrumental in bringing hedonism’s brief heyday to an end. Moore’s criticisms of hedonism in general, and Mill’s hedonism in particular, were frequently cited as good reasons to reject hedonism even decades after his death. Indeed, since G. E. Moore, hedonism has been viewed by most philosophers as being an initially intuitive and interesting family of theories, but also one that is flawed on closer inspection. Moore was a pluralist about value and argued persuasively against the Value Hedonists’ central claim – that all and only pleasure is the bearer of intrinsic value. Moore’s most damaging objection against Hedonism was his heap of filth example. Moore himself thought the heap of filth example thoroughly refuted what he saw as the only potentially viable form of Prudential Hedonism – that conscious pleasure is the only thing that positively contributes to well-being. Moore used the heap of filth example to argue that Prudential Hedonism is false because pleasure is not the only thing of value.
In the heap of filth example, Moore asks the reader to imagine two worlds, one of which is exceedingly beautiful and the other a disgusting heap of filth. Moore then instructs the reader to imagine that no one would ever experience either world and asks if it is better for the beautiful world to exist than the filthy one. As Moore expected, his contemporaries tended to agree that it would be better if the beautiful world existed. Relying on this agreement, Moore infers that the beautiful world is more valuable than the heap of filth and, therefore, that beauty must be valuable. Moore then concluded that all of the potentially viable theories of Prudential Hedonism (those that value only conscious pleasures) must be false because something, namely beauty, is valuable even when no conscious pleasure can be derived from it.
Moore’s heap of filth example has rarely been used to object to Prudential Hedonism since the 1970’s because it is not directly relevant to Prudential Hedonism (it evaluates worlds and not lives). Moore’s other objections to Prudential Hedonism also went out of favor around the same time. The demise of these arguments was partly due to mounting objections against them, but mainly because arguments more suited to the task of refuting Prudential Hedonism were developed. These arguments are discussed after the contemporary varieties of hedonism are introduced below.
Several contemporary varieties of hedonism have been defended, although usually by just a handful of philosophers or less at any one time. Other varieties of hedonism are also theoretically available but have received little or no discussion. Contemporary varieties of Prudential Hedonism can be grouped based on how they define pleasure and pain, as is done below. In addition to providing different notions of what pleasure and pain are, contemporary varieties of Prudential Hedonism also disagree about what aspect or aspects of pleasure are valuable for well-being (and the opposite for pain).
The most well-known disagreement about what aspects of pleasure are valuable occurs between Quantitative and Qualitative Hedonists. Quantitative Hedonists argue that how valuable pleasure is for well-being depends on only the amount of pleasure, and so they are only concerned with dimensions of pleasure such as duration and intensity. Quantitative Hedonism is often accused of over-valuing animalistic, simple, and debauched pleasures.
Qualitative Hedonists argue that, in addition to the dimensions related to the amount of pleasure, one or more dimensions of quality can have an impact on how pleasure affects well-being. The quality dimensions might be based on how cognitive or bodily the pleasure is (as it was for Mill), the moral status of the source of the pleasure, or some other non-amount-related dimension. Qualitative Hedonism is criticised by some for smuggling values other than pleasure into well-being by misleadingly labelling them as dimensions of pleasure. How these qualities are chosen for inclusion is also criticised for being arbitrary or ad hoc by some because inclusion of these dimensions of pleasure is often in direct response to objections that Quantitative Hedonism cannot easily deal with. That is to say, the inclusion of these dimensions is often accused of being an exercise in plastering over holes, rather than deducing corollary conclusions from existing theoretical premises. Others have argued that any dimensions of quality can be better explained in terms of dimensions of quantity. For example, they might claim that moral pleasures are no higher in quality than immoral pleasures, but that moral pleasures are instrumentally more valuable because they are likely to lead to more moments of pleasure or less moments of pain in the future.
Hedonists also have differing views about how the value of pleasure compares with the value of pain. This is not a practical disagreement about how best to measure pleasure and pain, but rather a theoretical disagreement about comparative value, such as whether pain is worse for us than an equivalent amount of pleasure is good for us. The default position is that one unit of pleasure (sometimes referred to as a Hedon) is equivalent but opposite in value to one unit of pain (sometimes referred to as a Dolor). Several Hedonistic Utilitarians have argued that reduction of pain should be seen as more important than increasing pleasure, sometimes for the Epicurean reason that pain seems worse for us than an equivalent amount of pleasure is good for us. Imagine that a magical genie offered for you to play a game with him. The game consists of you flipping a fair coin. If the coin lands on heads, then you immediately feel a burst of very intense pleasure and if it lands on tails, then you immediately feel a burst of very intense pain. Is it in your best interests to play the game?
Another area of disagreement between some Hedonists is whether pleasure is entirely internal to a person or if it includes external elements. Internalism about pleasure is the thesis that, whatever pleasure is, it is always and only inside a person. Externalism about pleasure, on the other hand, is the thesis that, pleasure is more than just a state of an individual (that is, that a necessary component of pleasure lies outside of the individual). Externalists about pleasure might, for example, describe pleasure as a function that mediates between our minds and the environment, such that every instance of pleasure has one or more integral environmental components. The vast majority of historic and contemporary versions of Prudential Hedonism consider pleasure to be an internal mental state.
Perhaps the least known disagreement about what aspects of pleasure make it valuable is the debate about whether we have to be conscious of pleasure for it to be valuable. The standard position is that pleasure is a conscious mental state, or at least that any pleasure a person is not conscious of does not intrinsically improve their well-being.
The most common definition of pleasure is that it is a sensation, something that we identify through our senses or that we feel. Psychologists claim that we have at least ten senses, including the familiar, sight, hearing, smell, taste, and touch, but also, movement, balance, and several sub-senses of touch, including heat, cold, pressure, and pain. New senses get added to the list when it is understood that some independent physical process underpins their functioning. The most widely-used examples of pleasurable sensations are the pleasures of eating, drinking, listening to music, and having sex. Use of these examples has done little to help Hedonism avoid its debauched reputation.
It is also commonly recognised that our senses are physical processes that usually involve a mental component, such as the tickling feeling when someone blows gently on the back of your neck. If a sensation is something we identify through our sense organs, however, it is not entirely clear how to account for abstract pleasures. This is because abstract pleasures, such as a feeling of accomplishment for a job well done, do not seem to be experienced through any of the senses in the standard lists. Some Hedonists have attempted to resolve this problem by arguing for the existence of an independent pleasure sense and by defining sensation as something that we feel (regardless of whether it has been mediated by sense organs).
Most Hedonists who describe pleasure as a sensation will be Quantitative Hedonists and will argue that the pleasure from the different senses is the same. Qualitative Hedonists, in comparison, can use the framework of the senses to help differentiate between qualities of pleasure. For example, a Qualitative Hedonist might argue that pleasurable sensations from touch and movement are always lower quality than the others.
Hedonists have also defined pleasure as intrinsically valuable experience, that is to say any experiences that we find intrinsically valuable either are, or include, instances of pleasure. According to this definition, the reason that listening to music and eating a fine meal are both intrinsically pleasurable is because those experiences include an element of pleasure (along with the other elements specific to each activity, such as the experience of the texture of the food and the melody of the music). By itself, this definition enables Hedonists to make an argument that is close to perfectly circular. Defining pleasure as intrinsically valuable experience and well-being as all and only experiences that are intrinsically valuable allows a Hedonist to all but stipulate that Prudential Hedonism is the correct theory of well-being. Where defining pleasure as intrinsically valuable experience is not circular is in its stipulation that only experiences matter for well-being. Some well-known objections to this idea are discussed below.
Another problem with defining pleasure as intrinsically valuable experience is that the definition does not tell us very much about what pleasure is or how it can be identified. For example, knowing that pleasure is intrinsically valuable experience would not help someone to work out if a particular experience was intrinsically or just instrumentally valuable. Hedonists have attempted to respond to this problem by explaining how to find out whether an experience is intrinsically valuable.
One method is to ask yourself if you would like the experience to continue for its own sake (rather than because of what it might lead to). Wanting an experience to continue for its own sake reveals that you find it to be intrinsically valuable. While still making a coherent theory of well-being, defining intrinsically valuable experiences as those you want to perpetuate makes the theory much less hedonistic. The fact that what a person wants is the main criterion for something having intrinsic value, makes this kind of theory more in line with preference satisfaction theories of well-being. The central claim of preference satisfaction theories of well-being is that some variant of getting what one wants, or should want, under certain conditions is the only thing that intrinsically improves one’s well-being.
Another method of fleshing out the definition of pleasure as intrinsically valuable experience is to describe how intrinsically valuable experiences feel. This method remains a hedonistic one, but seems to fall back into defining pleasure as a sensation.
It has also been argued that what makes an experience intrinsically valuable is that you like or enjoy it for its own sake. Hedonists arguing for this definition of pleasure usually take pains to position their definition in between the realms of sensation and preference satisfaction. They argue that since we can like or enjoy some experiences without concurrently wanting them or feeling any particular sensation, then liking is distinct from both sensation and preference satisfaction. Liking and enjoyment are also difficult terms to define in more detail, but they are certainly easier to recognise than the rather opaque “intrinsically valuable experience.”
Merely defining pleasure as intrinsically valuable experience and intrinsically valuable experiences as those that we like or enjoy still lacks enough detail to be very useful for contemplating well-being. A potential method for making this theory more useful would be to draw on the cognitive sciences to investigate if there is a specific neurological function for liking or enjoying. Cognitive science has not reached the point where anything definitive can be said about this, but a few neuroscientists have experimental evidence that liking and wanting (at least in regards to food) are neurologically distinct processes in rats and have argued that it should be the same for humans. The same scientists have wondered if the same processes govern all of our liking and wanting, but this question remains unresolved.
Most Hedonists who describe pleasure as intrinsically valuable experience believe that pleasure is internal and conscious. Hedonists who define pleasure in this way may be either Quantitative or Qualitative Hedonists, depending on whether they think that quality is a relevant dimension of how intrinsically valuable we find certain experiences.
One of the most recent developments in modern hedonism is the rise of defining pleasure as a pro-attitude – a positive psychological stance toward some object. Any account of Prudential Hedonism that defines pleasure as a pro-attitude is referred to as Attitudinal Hedonism because it is a person’s attitude that dictates whether anything has intrinsic value. Positive psychological stances include approving of something, thinking it is good, and being pleased about it. The object of the positive psychological stance could be a physical object, such as a painting one is observing, but it could also be a thought, such as “my country is not at war,” or even a sensation. An example of a pro-attitude towards a sensation could be being pleased about the fact that an ice cream tastes so delicious.
Fred Feldman, the leading proponent of Attitudinal Hedonism, argues that the sensation of pleasure only has instrumental value – it only brings about value if you also have a positive psychological stance toward that sensation. In addition to his basic Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism, which is a form of Quantitative Hedonism, Feldman has also developed many variants that are types of Qualitative Hedonism. For example, Desert-Adjusted Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism, which reduces the intrinsic value a pro-attitude has for our well-being based on the quality of deservedness (that is, on the extent to which the particular object deserves a pro-attitude or not). For example, Desert-Adjusted Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism might stipulate that sensations of pleasure arising from adulterous behavior do not deserve approval, and so assign them no value.
Defining pleasure as a pro-attitude, while maintaining that all sensations of pleasure have no intrinsic value, makes Attitudinal Hedonism less obviously hedonistic as the versions that define pleasure as a sensation. Indeed, defining pleasure as a pro-attitude runs the risk of creating a preference satisfaction account of well-being because being pleased about something without feeling any pleasure seems hard to distinguish from having a preference for that thing.
The most common argument against Prudential Hedonism is that pleasure is not the only thing that intrinsically contributes to well-being. Living in reality, finding meaning in life, producing noteworthy achievements, building and maintaining friendships, achieving perfection in certain domains, and living in accordance with religious or moral laws are just some of the other things thought to intrinsically add value to our lives. When presented with these apparently valuable aspects of life, Hedonists usually attempt to explain their apparent value in terms of pleasure. A Hedonist would argue, for example, that friendship is not valuable in and of itself, rather it is valuable to the extent that it brings us pleasure. Furthermore, to answer why we might help a friend even when it harms us, a Hedonist will argue that the prospect of future pleasure from receiving reciprocal favors from our friend, rather than the value of friendship itself, should motivate us to help in this way.
Those who object to Prudential Hedonism on the grounds that pleasure is not the only source of intrinsic value use two main strategies. In the first strategy, objectors make arguments that some specific value cannot be reduced to pleasure. In the second strategy, objectors cite very long lists of apparently intrinsically valuable aspects of life and then challenge hedonists with the prolonged and arduous task of trying to explain how the value of all of them can be explained solely by reference to pleasure and the avoidance of pain. This second strategy gives good reason to be a pluralist about value because the odds seem to be against any monistic theory of value, such as Prudential Hedonism. The first strategy, however, has the ability to show that Prudential Hedonism is false, rather than being just unlikely to be the best theory of well-being.
The most widely cited argument for pleasure not being the only source of intrinsic value is based on Robert Nozick’s experience machine thought-experiment. Nozick’s experience machine thought-experiment was designed to show that more than just our experiences matter to us because living in reality also matters to us. This argument has proven to be so convincing that nearly every single book on ethics that discusses hedonism rejects it using only this argument or this one and one other.
In the thought experiment, Nozick asks us to imagine that we have the choice of plugging in to a fantastic machine that flawlessly provides an amazing mix of experiences. Importantly, this machine can provide these experiences in a way that, once plugged in to the machine, no one can tell that their experiences are not real. Disregarding considerations about responsibilities to others and the problems that would arise if everyone plugged in, would you plug in to the machine for life? The vast majority of people reject the choice to live a much more pleasurable life in the machine, mostly because they agree with Nozick that living in reality seems to be important for our well-being. Opinions differ on what exactly about living in reality is so much better for us than the additional pleasure of living in the experience machine, but the most common response is that a life that is not lived in reality is pointless or meaningless.
Since this argument has been used so extensively (from the mid 1970’s onwards) to dismiss Prudential Hedonism, several attempts have been made to refute it. Most commonly, Hedonists argue that living an experience machine life would be better than living a real life and that most people are simply mistaken to not want to plug in. Some go further and try to explain why so many people choose not to plug in. Such explanations often point out that the most obvious reasons for not wanting to plug in can be explained in terms of expected pleasure and avoidance of pain. For example, it might be argued that we expect to get pleasure from spending time with our real friends and family, but we do not expect to get as much pleasure from the fake friends or family we might have in the experience machine. These kinds of attempts to refute the experience machine objection do little to persuade non-Hedonists that they have made the wrong choice.
A more promising line of defence for the Prudential Hedonists is to provide evidence that there is a particular psychological bias that affects most people’s choice in the experience machine thought experiment. A reversal of Nozick’s thought experiment has been argued to reveal just such a bias. Imagine that a credible source tells you that you are actually in an experience machine right now. You have no idea what reality would be like. Given the choice between having your memory of this conversation wiped and going to reality, what would be best for you to choose? Empirical evidence on this choice shows that most people would choose to stay in the experience machine. Comparing this result with how people respond to Nozick’s experience machine thought experiment reveals the following: In Nozick’s experience machine thought experiment people tend to choose a real and familiar life over a more pleasurable life and in the reversed experience machine thought experiment people tend to choose a familiar life over a real life. Familiarity seems to matter more than reality, undermining the strength of Nozick’s original argument. The bias thought to be responsible for this difference is the status quo bias – an irrational preference for the familiar or for things to stay as they are.
Regardless of whether Nozick’s experience machine thought experiment is as decisive a refutation of Prudential Hedonism as it is often thought to be, the wider argument (that living in reality is valuable for our well-being) is still a problem for Prudential Hedonists. That our actions have real consequences, that our friends are real, and that our experiences are genuine seem to matter for most of us regardless of considerations of pleasure. Unfortunately, we lack a trusted methodology for discerning if these things should matter to us. Perhaps the best method for identifying intrinsically valuable aspects of lives is to compare lives that are equal in pleasure and all other important ways, except that one aspect of one of the lives is increased. Using this methodology, however, seems certain to lead to an artificial pluralist conclusion about what has value. This is because any increase in a potentially valuable aspect of our lives will be viewed as a free bonus. And, most people will choose the life with the free bonus just in case it has intrinsic value, not necessarily because they think it does have intrinsic value.
The main traditional line of criticism against Prudential Hedonism is that not all pleasure is valuable for well-being, or at least that some pleasures are less valuable than others because of non-amount-related factors. Some versions of this criticism are much easier for Prudential Hedonists to deal with than others depending on where the allegedly disvaluable aspect of the pleasure resides. If the disvaluable aspect is experienced with the pleasure itself, then both Qualitative and Quantitative varieties of Prudential Hedonism have sufficient answers to these problems. If, however, the disvaluable aspect of the pleasure is never experienced, then all types of Prudential Hedonism struggle to explain why the allegedly disvaluable aspect is irrelevant.
Examples of the easier criticisms to deal with are that Prudential Hedonism values, or at least overvalues, perverse and base pleasures. These kinds of criticisms tend to have had more sway in the past and doubtless encouraged Mill to develop his Qualitative Hedonism. In response to the charge that Prudential Hedonism mistakenly values pleasure from sadistic torture, sating hunger, copulating, listening to opera, and philosophising all equally, Qualitative Hedonists can simply deny that it does. Since pleasure from sadistic torture will normally be experienced as containing the quality of sadism (just as the pleasure from listening to good opera is experienced as containing the quality of acoustic excellence), the Qualitative Hedonist can plausibly claim to be aware of the difference in quality and allocate less value to perverse or base pleasures accordingly.
Prudential Hedonists need not relinquish the Quantitative aspect of their theory in order to deal with these criticisms, however. Quantitative Hedonists, can simply point out that moral or cultural values are not necessarily relevant to well-being because the investigation of well-being aims to understand what the good life for the one living it is and what intrinsically makes their life go better for them. A Quantitative Hedonist can simply respond that a sadist that gets sadistic pleasure from torturing someone does improve their own well-being (assuming that the sadist never feels any negative emotions or gets into any other trouble as a result). Similarly, a Quantitative Hedonist can argue that if someone genuinely gets a lot of pleasure from porcine company and wallowing in the mud, but finds opera thoroughly dull, then we have good reason to think that having to live in a pig sty would be better for her well-being than forcing her to listen to opera.
Much more problematic for both Quantitative and Qualitative Hedonists, however, are the more modern versions of the criticism that not all pleasure is valuable. The modern versions of this criticism tend to use examples in which the disvaluable aspect of the pleasure is never experienced by the person whose well-being is being evaluated. The best example of these modern criticisms is a thought experiment devised by Shelly Kagan. Kagan’s deceived businessman thought experiment is widely thought to show that pleasures of a certain kind, namely false pleasures, are worth much less than true pleasures.
Kagan asks us to imagine the life of a very successful businessman who takes great pleasure in being respected by his colleagues, well-liked by his friends, and loved by his wife and children until the day he died. Then Kagan asks us to compare this life with one of equal length and the same amount of pleasure (experienced as coming from exactly the same sources), except that in each case the businessman is mistaken about how those around him really feel. This second (deceived) businessman experiences just as much pleasure from the respect of his colleagues and the love of his family as the first businessman. The only difference is that the second businessman has many false beliefs. Specifically, the deceived businessman’s colleagues actually think he is useless, his wife doesn’t really love him, and his children are only nice to him so that he will keep giving them money. Given that the deceived businessman never knew of any of these deceptions and his experiences were never negatively impacted by the deceptions indirectly, which life do you think is better?
Nearly everyone thinks that the deceived businessman has a worse life. This is a problem for Prudential Hedonists because the pleasure is quantitatively equal in each life, so they should be equally good for the one living it. Qualitative Hedonism does not seem to be able to avoid this criticism either because the falsity of the pleasures experienced by the deceived businessman is a dimension of the pleasure that he never becomes aware of. Theoretically, an externalist and qualitative version of Attitudinal Hedonism could include the falsity dimension of an instance of pleasure even if the falsity dimension never impacts the consciousness of the person. However, the resulting definition of pleasure bears little resemblance to what we commonly understand pleasure to be and also seems to be ad hoc in its inclusion of the truth dimension but not others. A dedicated Prudential Hedonist of any variety can always stubbornly stick to the claim that the lives of the two businessmen are of equal value, but that will do little to convince the vast majority to take Prudential Hedonism more seriously.
Another major line of criticism used against Prudential Hedonists is that they have yet to come up with a meaningful definition of pleasure that unifies the seemingly disparate array of pleasures while remaining recognisable as pleasure. Some definitions lack sufficient detail to be informative about what pleasure actually is, or why it is valuable, and those that do offer enough detail to be meaningful are faced with two difficult tasks.
The first obstacle for a useful definition of pleasure for hedonism is to unify all of the diverse pleasures in a reasonable way. Phenomenologically, the pleasure from reading a good book is very different to the pleasure from bungee jumping, and both of these pleasures are very different to the pleasure of having sex. This obstacle is unsurpassable for most versions of Quantitative Hedonism because it makes the value gained from different pleasures impossible to compare. Not being able to compare different types of pleasure results in being unable to say if a life is better than another in most even vaguely realistic cases. Furthermore, not being able to compare lives means that Quantitative Hedonism could not be usefully used to guide behavior since it cannot instruct us on which life to aim for.
Attempts to resolve the problem of unifying the different pleasures while remaining within a framework of Quantitative Hedonism, usually involve pointing out something that is constant in all of the disparate pleasures and defining that particular thing as pleasure. When pleasure is defined as a strict sensation, this strategy fails because introspection reveals that no such sensation exists. Pleasure defined as the experience of liking or as a pro-attitude does much better at unifying all of the diverse pleasures. However, defining pleasure in these ways makes the task of filling in the details of the theory a fine balancing act. Liking or pro-attitudes must be described in such a way that they are not solely a sensation or best described as a preference satisfaction theory. And they must perform this balancing act while still describing a scientifically plausible and conceptually coherent account of pleasure. Most attempts to define pleasure as liking or pro-attitudes seem to disagree with either the folk conception of what pleasure is or any of the plausible scientific conceptions of how pleasure functions.
Most varieties of Qualitative Hedonism do better at dealing with the problem of diverse pleasures because they can evaluate different pleasures according to their distinct qualities. Qualitative Hedonists still need a coherent method for comparing the different pleasures with each other in order to be more than just an abstract theory of well-being, however. And, it is difficult to construct such a methodology in a way that avoids counter examples, while still describing a scientifically plausible and conceptually coherent account of pleasure.
The second obstacle is creating a definition of pleasure that retains at least some of the core properties of the common understanding of the term ‘pleasure’. As mentioned, many of the potential adjustments to the main definitions of pleasure are useful for avoiding one or more of the many objections against Prudential Hedonism. The problem with this strategy is that the more adjustments that are made, the more apparent it becomes that the definition of pleasure is not recognisable as the pleasure that gave Hedonism its distinctive intuitive plausibility in the first place. When an instance of pleasure is defined simply as when someone feels good, its intrinsic value for well-being is intuitively obvious. However, when the definition of pleasure is stretched, so as to more effectively argue that all valuable experiences are pleasurable, it becomes much less recognisable as the concept of pleasure we use in day-to-day life and its intrinsic value becomes much less intuitive.
The future of hedonism seems bleak. The considerable number and strength of the arguments against Prudential Hedonism’s central principle (that pleasure and only pleasure intrinsically contributes positively to well-being and the opposite for pain) seem insurmountable. Hedonists have been creative in their definitions of pleasure so as to avoid these objections, but more often than not find themselves defending a theory that is not particularly hedonistic, realistic or both.
Perhaps the only hope that Hedonists of all types can have for the future is that advances cognitive science lead to a better understanding of how pleasure works in the brain and how biases affect our judgements about thought experiments. If our improved understanding in these areas confirms a particular theory about what pleasure is and also provides reasons to doubt some of the widespread judgements about the thought experiments that make the vast majority of philosophers reject hedonism, then hedonism might experience at least a partial revival. The good news for Hedonists is that at least some emerging theories and results from cognitive science do appear to support some aspects of hedonism.
Victoria University of Wellington
Last updated: August 10, 2011 | Originally published: